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Thought Experiments

First published Sat Dec 28, 1996; substantive revision Sun Mar 25, 2007

Thought experiments are devices of the imagination used to investigate the nature of things. We need only list a few of the well-known thought experiments to be reminded of their enormous influence and importance in the sciences: Newton's bucket, Maxwell's demon, Einstein's elevator, Heisenberg's gamma-ray microscope, Schrödinger's cat. The same can be said for their importance in philosophy. Much of ethics, philosophy of language, and philosophy of mind is based firmly on the results of thought experiments. Again, a short list makes this evident: Thompson's violinist, Searle's Chinese room, Putnam's twin earth, Parfit's people who split like an amoeba. The 17th century saw some of its most brilliant practitioners in Galileo, Descartes, Newton, and Leibniz. And in our own time, the creation of quantum mechanics and relativity are almost unthinkable without the crucial role played by thought experiments. Contemporary philosophy, even more than the sciences, would be severely impoverished without them.

1. Examples of Thought Experiments

Among scientists, Galileo and Einstein were, arguably, the most impressive thought experimenters, but they were by no means the first. Thought experiments existed throughout the middle ages, and can be found in antiquity, too. One of the most beautiful early examples (in Lucretius, De Rerum Natura) attempts to show that space is infinite: If there is a purported boundary to the universe, we can toss a spear at it. If the spear flies through, it isn't a boundary after all; if the spear bounces back, then there must be something beyond the supposed edge of space, a cosmic wall that stopped the spear, a wall that is itself in space. Either way, there is no edge of the universe; space is infinite.

This example nicely illustrates many of the common features of thought experiments: We visualize some situation; we carry out an operation; we see what happens. It also illustrates their fallibility. In this case we've learned how to conceptualize space so that it is both finite and unbounded. Consider a circle, which is a one dimensional space: As we move around, there is no edge, but it is nevertheless finite. The universe might be a many-dimensional version.

Figure 1
Figure 1. “Welcome to the edge of the Universe”

Often a real experiment that is the analogue of a thought experiment is impossible for physical, technological, or financial reasons; but this needn't be a defining condition of thought experiments. The main point is that we seem able to get a grip on nature just by thinking, and therein lies the great interest for philosophy. How is it possible to learn apparently new things about nature without new empirical data?

Ernst Mach did a great deal to popularize the idea of a Gedankenexperiment. He also popularized the term, but he was not the first to use it. That honour seems to go to Georg Lichtenberg, writing about a century earlier (Schildknecht 1990). Mach developed an interesting empiricist view in his classic, The Science of Mechanics. We possess, he says, a great store of "instinctive knowledge" picked up from experience. Some of this is from actual experience and some we have inherited through the evolutionary process, thanks to the experience of our ancestors. This knowledge needn't be articulated at all, but comes to the fore when we encounter certain situations. One of his favourite examples is due to Simon Stevin. When a chain is draped over a double frictionless plane, as in Fig. 2a, how will it move? Add some links as in Fig. 2b. Now it is obvious. The initial setup must have been in static equilibrium. Otherwise, we would have a perpetual motion machine; and according to our experience-based "instinctive knowledge", says Mach, this is impossible.

Figure 2a Figure 2b
Figure 2(a) and 2(b) “How will it move?”

Judith Thompson provided one of the most striking and effective thought experiments in the moral realm. Her example is aimed at a popular anti-abortion argument that goes something like this: The fetus is an innocent person with a right to life. Abortion results in the death of a fetus. Therefore, abortion is morally wrong. In her thought experiment we are asked to imagine a famous violinist falling into a coma. The society of music lovers determines from medical records that you and you alone can save the violinist's life by being hooked up to him for nine months. The music lovers break into your home while you are asleep and hook the unconscious (and unknowing, hence innocent) violinist to you. You may want to unhook him, but you are then faced with this argument put forward by the music lovers: The violinist is an innocent person with a right to life. Unhooking him will result in his death. Therefore, unhooking him is morally wrong.

However, the argument does not seem convincing in this case. You would be very generous to remain attached and in bed for nine months, but you are not morally obliged to do so. The parallel with the abortion case is evident. The thought experiment is effective in distinguishing two concepts that had previously been run together: “right to life” and “right to what is needed to sustain life.” The fetus and the violinist may each have the former, but it is not evident that either has the latter. The upshot is that even if the fetus has a right to life (which Thompson does not believe but allows for the sake of the argument), it may still be morally permissible to abort. Theorizing about thought experiments usually turns on the details or the patterns of specific cases. Familiarity with a wide range of examples is crucial for commentators. Most discussions of thought experiments include several illustrations (e.g., Brown 1991, Horowitz and Massey 1991, and Sorenson 1992). There are also two recent books devoted mainly to the presentation of brief, non-technical examples, Cohen 2005 and Tittle 2005. Some special examples with very nice animations can be found at John Norton's website (see below).

2. Objections to Thought Experiments

Of course, particular thought experiments have been contested. But for the most part, thought experimenting in the sciences has been cheerfully accepted. The great historian of physics, Pierre Duhem, is almost alone in his condemnation. A thought experiment is no substitute for a real experiment, he claimed, and should be forbidden in science. However, in view of the important role of actual thought experiments in the history of physics — from Galileo's falling bodies, to Newton's bucket, to Einstein's elevator — it is unlikely that anyone will feel or should feel much sympathy for Duhem's strictures.

Philosophers are more critical. They worry, with some justice, about how reliable our intuitions really are. Can we trust them in bizarre situations? Kathleen Wilkes, for instance, was very distrustful of Parfit's people splitting like an amoeba. She declared that we simply don't know what to say when thinking about this sort of thing. She declared that a thought experiment should not violate what we take to be the laws of nature. This would rule out Parfit's examples. But such a proposal seems much too strong. We learn a great deal about the world and our theories when we wonder, for instance, what would have happened after the big bang, if the law of gravity had been an inverse cube law instead of an inverse square. Would stars have failed to form? Reasoning about such a scenario is perfectly coherent and very instructive, even though it violates a law of nature.

There are other objections, too. Jonathan Dancy thinks thought experiments in ethics are circular. Daniel Dennett thinks they use folk concepts, so they are inevitably conservative. These objections can likely be met, but they illustrate an ongoing debate.

3. Types of Thought Experiments

There are many ways of classifying thought experiments: science vs philosophy, or normative (moral or epistemic) vs factual, and so on. I will outline a taxonomy here based on how they function as evidence. The main division is constructive vs destructive, that is, a thought experiment might be used positively to establish a theory or it might be used negatively to undermine a theory. Each of these is subject to further divisions.

Thought experiments are used negatively in a number of different ways. The simplest of these is to draw out a contradiction in a theory, thereby refuting it. A second way is to show that the theory in question is in conflict with other beliefs that we hold. Schrödinger's cat, for instance, does not show that quantum theory (as interpreted by Bohr) is internally inconsistent. Rather it shows that it is conflict with some very powerful common sense beliefs we have about macro-sized objects such as cats. The bizarreness of superpositions in the atomic world is worrisome enough, says Schrödinger, but when it implies that same bizarreness at an everyday level, it is intolerable.

There is a third type that, in effect, undermines a central assuption or premiss of a thought experiment. Thompson showed that "right to life" and "right to what is needed to sustain life" had been run together. When distinguished, the argument against abortion is undermined. A fourth type of negative thought experiment is quite a bit more complex. I will call these counter thought experiments. Mach produced one against Newton and Dennett produced another against Jackson. Newton offered a pair of thought experiments as evidence for absolute space. One was the bucket with water climbing the wall, the other was a pair of spheres joined by a cord that maintained its tension in otherwise empty space. The explanation for these phenomena, said Newton, is absolute space: the bucket and the joined spheres are rotating with respect to space itself. In response, Mach said that, contra Newton, the two spheres would move toward one another thanks to the tension in the cord, and if we rotated a very thick, massive ring around a stationary bucket, we would see the water climb the bucket wall. Mach's counter thought experiment undermines our confidence in Newton's. Absolute space explained the phenomena in Newton's thought experiments, but now we're not so sure of the phenomena itself (at least, this is Mach's intent).

Figure 3
Figure 3. Stages in the bucket experiment

Figure 4
Figure 4. Two spheres held by a cord in otherwise empty space

Frank Jackson created a much discussed thought experiment that aimed to show that physicalism is false. This is the doctrine that all facts are physical facts. In the thought experiment, Mary is a brilliant scientist who, from birth, is confined to a laboratory with only black and white experiences. She learns all the physical facts about perception there. One day, she leaves the laboratory and experiences colours for the first time; she learns what it's like to experience red. Clearly, says Jackson, she learns something new. Since she already knew all the physical facts, she must have learned something non-physical when she experienced colour. Thus, physicalism must be wrong.

Dennett replied to this thought experiment with one of his own. It begins like Jackson's, but when Mary leaves the lab, she says “Ah, colour perception is just as I thought it would be.” Like Mach, Dennett denies the phenomenon of the original thought experiment. And like Mach, his counter thought experiment is effective in undermining Jackson's in so far as it seems similarly plausible.

To be effective, counter thought experiments needn't be very plausible at all. In a court of law, the jury will convict provided guilt is established "beyond a reasonable doubt." A common defence strategy is to provide an alternative account of the evidence that has just enough plausibility to put the prosecution's case into some measure of doubt. That is sufficient to undermine it. A good counter thought experiment need only do that much to be effective.

Thought experiments can also be constructive. There are many ways a thought experiment could provide positive support for a theory. One of these is to provide a kind of illustration that makes a theory's claims clear and evident. In such cases thought experiments serve as a kind of heuristic aid. A result may already be well established, but the thought experiment can lead to a very satisfying sense of understanding. Newton provided a wonderful example showing how the moon is kept in its orbit in the just same way as an object falls to the earth. He illustrated this by means of a cannon shooting a cannon ball further and further. In the limit, the earth curves away as fast as the ball falls, with the eventual result being that the cannon ball will return to the spot where it was fired, and, if not impeded, will go around again and again. This is what the moon is doing. We could arrive at the same conclusion through calculation. But Newton's thought experiment provides that illusive understanding. It's a wonderful example of the “aha effect.”

Figure 5
Figure 5. “The shot heard around the world”

Einstein's elevator showed that light will bend in a gravitational field; Maxwell's demon showed that entropy could be decreased; Thompson's violinist showed that abortion could be morally permissible even when the fetus has a right to life; Newton's bucket showed that space is a thing in its own right; Parfit's splitting persons showed that survival is a more important notion than identity when considering personhood. I say they “showed” such and such, but, “purport to show” might be better, since some of these thought experiments are quite contentious. The thing they have in common is that they aim to establish something positive. Unlike destructive thought experiments, they are not trying to demolish an existing theory, though they may do that in passing.

4. Some Recent Views on Thought Experiments

Thomas Kuhn's "A Function for Thought Experiments" employs many of the concepts (but not the terminology) of his well-known Structure of Scientific Revolutions. On his view a well-conceived thought experiment can bring on a crisis or at least create an anomaly in the reigning theory and so contribute to paradigm change. Thought experiments can teach us something new about the world, even though we have no new empirical data, by helping us to re-conceptualize the world in a better way. Tamar Gendler has recently developed this view in a number of important respects.

Recent years have seen a sudden growth of interest in thought experiments. The views of Brown (1991) and Norton (1991, 1996) represent the extremes of platonic rationalism and classic empiricism, respectively. Norton claims that any thought experiment is really a (possibly disguised) argument; it starts with premisses grounded in experience and follows deductive or inductive rules of inference in arriving at its conclusion. The picturesque features of any thought experiment which give it an experimental flavour might be psychologically helpful, but are strictly redundant. Thus, says Norton, we never go beyond the empirical premisses in a way to which any empiricist would object. (For criticisms see Bishop 1999; Brown 1991, 2004a, 2004b; Haggqvist 1996; Gendler 1998, 2004; Nersessian 1993; and Sorenson 1992; and for a defense see Norton 1991, 1996, 2004a, and 2004b.)

By contrast, Brown holds that in a few special cases we do go well beyond the old data to acquire a priori knowledge of nature. (See also Koyré 1968.) Galileo showed that all bodies fall at the same speed with a brilliant thought experiment that started by destroying the then reigning Aristotelian account. The latter holds that heavy bodies fall faster than light ones (H > L). But consider (Fig. 6), in which a heavy cannon ball (H) and light musket ball (L) are attached together to form a compound object (H+L); the latter must fall faster than the cannon ball alone. Yet the compound object must also fall slower, since the light part will act as a drag on the heavy part. Now we have a contradiction. (H+L > H and H > H+L) That's the end of Aristotle's theory. But there is a bonus, since the right account is now obvious: they all fall at the same speed (H = L = H+L).

Figure 6
Figure 6. Galileo: “I don't even have to look”

This could be said to be a priori (though still fallible) knowledge of nature, since there are no new data involved, nor is the conclusion derived from old data, nor is it some sort of logical truth. This account of thought experiments can be further developed by linking the a priori epistemology to recent accounts of laws of nature that hold that laws are relations among objectively existing abstract entities. It is thus a rather Platonistic view, not unlike Platonistic accounts of mathematics such as that urged by Gödel. (For details see Brown 1991.)

The two views just sketched might occupy the opposite ends of a spectrum of positions on thought experiments, at least within the philosophy of science. Some of the promising alternative views include those of Sorensen (somewhat in the spirit of Mach) who holds that thought experiments are a "limiting case" of ordinary experiments; they can achieve their aim, he says, without being executed. (Sorensen's book is also valuable for its extensive discussion of thought experiments in a wide range of fields.) Other promising views include those of Gooding (who stresses the similar procedural nature of thought experiments and real experiments), Miscevic and Nersessian (each of whom tie thought experiments to "mental models"), and several of the accounts in Horowitz and Massey 1991. Besides these, a sample of recent excellent discussions includes: Arthur 1999; Gendler 1998, 2000, 2002a, 2004; Haggqvist 1996; Humphreys 1994; McAllister 1996, 2004; and many others. German readers will find the very recent book by Kühne (2005) a very thorough history as well as an interesting discussion of contemporary topics. The literature on thought experiments in the sciences continues to grow rapidly.

Outside of the philosophy of science, philosophers continue to debate the merits of particular thought experiments such as Searle's, Thompson's, Jackson's, and so on. At a more general level there is debate over the usefulness of highly contrived examples. Just how reliable are our intuitions in these cases anyway? The subject of intuition has itself been the topic of recent debate. A small but significant group of philosophers uphold their use while others downplay their reliability and significance. (See DePaul and Ramsey 1998 for a sample of articles on this topic.) The relationship between conceivability and possibility is another topic that has been aired recently and has much to do with thought experiments. (See Gendler and Hawthorne 2002.) The relation between thought experiments and literary fiction is starting to be explored. (See Swirski 2007.)


Thanks are due to Tamar Gendler, from whom I borrowed heavily in constructing the bibliography below. Much more can be found in the bibliographies in Sorenson 1992, Gendler 2000, and Kühne 2005.

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