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Watsuji Tetsurô

First published Thu Nov 11, 2004; substantive revision Thu Dec 17, 2009

Watsuji Tetsurô (1889–1960) was one of a small group of philosophers in Japan during the twentieth century who brought Japanese philosophy to the world. He wrote important works on both Eastern and Western philosophy and philosophers, from ancient Greek, to Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Kierkegaard and Heidegger, and from primitive Buddhism and ancient Japanese culture, to Dôgen (whose now famous writings Watsuji single-handedly rediscovered), aesthetics, and Japanese ethics. His works on Japanese ethics are still regarded as the definitive studies.

Influenced by Heidegger, Watsuji's Climate and Culture is both an appreciation of, and a critique of Heidegger. In particular, Watsuji argues that Heidegger under-emphasizes spatiality, and over-emphasizes temporality. Watsuji contends that had Heidegger equally emphasized spatiality, it would have tied him more firmly to the human world where we interact, both fruitfully and negatively. We are inextricably social, connected in so many ways, and ethics is the study of these social connections and positive ways of interacting.

Human beings have a dual-nature, as individuals, and as member of various social groupings. We face each other in the betweenness between us, where we can either maintain a safe distance, or enter into intimate relationships of worth. Fundamental to positive, intimate relationships is trust, and trustworthiness.

1. Life and Career

Watsuji Tetsurô (1889–1960) was one of a small group of philosophers in Japan during the twentieth century who brought Japanese philosophy to the attention of the world. In terms of his influence, exemplary scholarship, and originality he ranks with Nishida Kitarô, Tanabe Hajime, and Nishitani Keiji. The latter three were all members of the so-called ‘Kyoto School,’ and while Watsuji is not usually thought of as being a member of this school, the influence and tone of his work clearly shows him to be a like-minded thinker.

The Kyoto School, of which Nishida was the pioneering founder, is so identified because of its common focus; Nishida's important work, East/West comparative philosophy, and an on-going attempt to give expression to Japanese ideas and concepts by means of the clarity afforded by Western philosophical tools and techniques. Whereas the general emphasis of the Kyoto School is on epistemology, metaphysics and logic, Watsuji's primary focus came to be ethics, although his earlier studies of Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, and Kierkegaard ranged far beyond the ethical. And while his impressive output (an original nineteen volume collected works has been expanded by Yuasa Yasuo, his former student and now one of Japan's leading contemporary philosophers, to twenty-seven volumes) includes wide-ranging studies in the history of both Eastern and Western philosophy, his focus was not on Nishida and Tanabe, but on reconstructing the origins of Japanese culture more or less from the ground up. Hence, while many of his ideas, e.g. the centrality of the concept of ‘nothingness,’ and dialectical contradiction, show the influence of the Kyoto School thinkers, his own creative approach led him to formulate them differently, and to apply them to ethical, political, and cultural issues. Nevertheless, given the overlap of concepts, it would be a mistake to exclude him from some sort of honorary membership in the Kyoto School. And given that there never was an actual ‘school’ at all, it is enough to say that Watsuji was an active force in Japanese philosophy in the twentieth century, along with Nishida, Tanabe, and later on, Nishitani.

Watsuji was born in 1889, the second son of a physician, in Himeji City, in Hyogo Prefecture. He entered the prestigious First Higher School in Tokyo (now Tokyo University), in 1906, graduating in 1909. Later that same year, he entered Tokyo Imperial University, where his specialization was philosophy, in the Faculty of Literature. He married Takase Teru in 1912, and a daughter, Kyôko was born to them in 1914.

As a student at Himeji Middle School, he displayed a passion for literature, especially Western literature, and “is said to have been fired with the ambition to become a poet like Byron” (Furukawai 1961, 217). He wrote stories and plays, and was coeditor of a literary magazine. When he entered the First Higher School in Tokyo, even though he had decided to pursue philosophy seriously, he remained “as deeply immersed in Byron as ever and attracted chiefly to things literary and dramatic” (Furukawa 1961, 218). He is said to have had several excellent teachers at this school, and his interests were considerably expanded in the arts and in literature. The Headmaster, Nitobe Inozô, was of particular importance. James Kodera writes that “Nitobe's book on Bushidô, The Soul of Japan, began to awaken Tetsurô not only to the Eastern heritage but also to the study of ethics” (Kodera 1987, 6). Still, while this early glimpse into the forgotten depths of his own culture may have planted the seeds of later inquiries and insights, Watsuji gained sustenance and insight at this time in his academic career from his reading in Western Romanticism and Individualism.

Without a doubt, the most important influence in Watsuji's early years was the brilliant novelist Natsume Sôseki, considered the outstanding interpreter of modern Japan. James Kodera writes that Watsuji found in Sôseki “a human being struggling with the human condition in the particularities of early modern Japan, suddenly exposed to the West and yet struggling to sustain his own identity” (Kodera 1987, 6). Sôseki was beginning to abandon his unqualified admiration of Western individualism, and was embarking on a critique of both individualism and the modern culture of the Western world. It was not only a move away from the values which he had come to associate with Western culture, but a move back to the values of his own Japanese cultural tradition. Watsuji never met Sôseki while at the University of Tokyo, but did meet him in 1913 and became a member of a study group that met at Sôseki's home. Sôseki died three years later, when Watsuji was 27, and upon his death, Watsuji began to compose a lengthy reminiscence of him. His reflections were published in 1918 (in his Gûzo saikô), and they marked Watsuji's own transformation from advocate of Western ways to critic of the West, turning toward a reconsideration of Japanese and Eastern cultural resources. It is perhaps telling that in a series that Sôseki wrote for a popular Tokyo newspaper during 1912–1913, “Sôseki depicted the plight of the modern individual as one of painful loneliness and helplessness” (Kodera 1987, 6). He saw egoism as the source of the plight, and has Ichirô, the hero of the serially appearing novel Wayfarer, conclude that “there is no bridge leading from one man to another; loneliness, loneliness, thou [are] mine home” (Kodera 1987, 6). A solution to the modern predicament of estrangement, loneliness and helplessness came to be found, for Watsuji, in our social interconnections. What modern Western society was losing with great rapidity, was still evident in Japanese society, where individuality was tempered with a strong social consciousness, and this more balanced sense of self could be found in the earliest of Japanese cultural documents. Sôseki's proposed solution was to “follow Heaven, forsake the self” (Kodera 1987, 6), but Watsuji's more humanistic remedy for an egoism which inevitably led to estrangement, was to reinvest in one's social interconnectedness. We are not only by nature social beings, but we inevitably come into the world already in relationship: with our language and culture, traditions and expectations, parents, caregivers, and teachers. It a myth of abstraction that we come into the world as isolated egos.

Watsuji graduated from Tokyo University in 1912, but not without a frantic effort to write a second thesis in a very short span of time, because the topic of his first thesis was deemed unacceptable. Furukawa Tetsushi notes that “at the time the atmosphere in the Faculty of Philosophy was inimical to the study of a poet-philosopher like Nietzsche. Consequently, Watsuji's ‘Nietzschean Studies’ was rejected as a suitable graduation thesis” (Furukawa 1961, 219). In its place he was obliged to substitute a second thesis on Schopenhauer, which he entitled “Schopenhauer's Pessimism and Theory of Salvation.” This thesis “was presented only just in time” for him to graduate (Furukawa 1961, 219). Both theses were eventually published.

Watsuji enrolled in the graduate school of Tokyo Imperial University in 1912, the same year that he completed his undergraduate studies. His studies of Schopenhauer and Nietzsche in 1912, and of Kierkegaard in 1915 provide ample evidence of his interest in and competence in Western philosophy. At the same time, he continued to study the Romantic poets, Byron, Shelley, Tennyson and Keats, being torn between his literary and philosophical interests. In any case, perhaps because his literary attempts were “complete failures,” he decided to give “up literary creation and devoted all his exertions to the writing of critical essays and philosophical treatises” (Furukawa 1961, 218). It was not long before he was in demand as a teacher, first as a lecturer at Tôyô University in 1920, an instructor at Hôsei University in 1922, an instructor at Keiô University in 1922–23, and at the Tsuda Eigaku-juku from 1922-24 (Dilworth et al 1998, 221). But his real break came in 1925, when Nishida Kitarô and Hatano Seiichi offered him the position of lecturer in the Philosophy Department of the Faculty of Literature at Kyoto Imperial University, where he was to take on the responsibility for the courses in ethics. This put him at the center of the developing Kyoto School philosophy. As was the custom at the time with promising young scholars, he was sent to Germany in 1927 on a three-year scholarship. His reflections on that sojourn in Europe became the substance of his highly successful book, Fûdo, which has been translated into English as Climate and Culture. In fact, Watsuji spent only fourteen months in Europe, being forced to return to Japan in the summer of 1928 because of the death of his father. In 1929, he also took on a part-time position at Ryûkoku University, and in 1931, he became a professor at Kyoto Imperial University. In 1934, he was appointed professor in the Faculty of Literature at Tokyo Imperial University, and he continued to hold this important post until his retirement in 1949. Perhaps part of the reason that he is so often viewed as someone on the periphery of the Kyoto School philosophic tradition has to do with his work in Tokyo, geographically removed from the center of discussion and dialogue in Kyoto.

One cannot help but be impressed by the extent of his published output, as well as by its remarkable diversity, spanning literature, the arts, philosophy, cultural theory, as well as Japanese, Chinese, Indian, and Western traditions. In addition to his studies of Schopenhauer (1912), Nietzsche (1913), and Kierkegaard (1915), in 1919, he published Koji junrei (A Pilgrimage to Ancient Temples), his study of the temples and artistic treasures of Nara, a work that became exceptionally popular. In 1920 came Nihon kodai bunka (Ancient Japanese Culture), a study of Japanese antiquity, including Japan's most ancient writings, the Kojiki and Nihongi. In 1925, he published the first volume of Nihon seishinshi kenkyû (A Study of the History of the Japanese Spirit), with the second volume appearing in 1935. This study contained his investigation of Dôgen's work (in Shamon Dôgen, [The Monk Dôgen ]), and it can be said that it was Watsuji who single-handedly brought Dôgen's work out of nearly total obscurity, into the forefront of philosophical discussion. Also, in 1925, he published Kirisutokyô no bunkashiteki igi (The Significance of Primitive Christianity in Cultural History , followed by Genshi Bukkyô no jissen tetsugaku (The Practical Philosophy of Primitive Buddhism) in 1927.

Returning from Europe in 1928, he continued at Kyoto Imperial University until his appointment as professor at Tokyo Imperial University in 1934. In 1929, he edited and translated Dôgen's incomparable Shôbôgenzô. Watsuji received his degree of Doctor of Letters, based on his The Practical Philosophy of Primitive Buddhism in 1932. He wrote as well A Critique of Homer at about this time, a work that was not published until 1946. Also in 1932 he wrote Porisuteki ningen no rinrigaku (The Ethics of the Man of the Greek Polis), which was not published until 1948. In 1936, he completed his Kôshi (Confucius). In 1935, he completed the important Ethics as the Study of Man (Ningen no gaku to shite no rinrigaku, to be followed by his three volume expansion of his views on ethics, Rinrigaku (Ethics) appearing successively in 1937, 1942, and 1949.

In 1938, he published Jinkaku to jinruisei (Personality and Humanity), and in 1943, he published his two volume Sonnô shisô to sono dentô (The Idea of Reverence for the Emperor and the Imperial Tradition). This latter publication is one of the works for which Watsuji was branded a right-wing, reactionary thinker. In 1944, he published a volume of two essays, Nihon no shindô (The Way of the Japanese Subject; The Character of the American People), and in 1948, The Symbol of National Unity (Kokumin tôgô no shôchô). His last publications were the best-selling Sakoku—Nihonno higeki (A Closed Country—The Tragedy of Japan) in 1950, Uzumoreta Nihon (Buried Japan) in 1951, Nihon rinri shisôshi (History of Japanese Ethical Thought) in two volumes in 1953, Katsura rikyû: seisaku katei no kôsatsu (The Katsura Imperial Villa: Reflections on the Process of Its Construction) in 1955, and Nihon geijutsu Kenkyû (A Study of Japanese Art), also published in 1955.

By any standard, this is an impressive array of major publications, several of them extremely influential both with the world of scholarship, and among the general public as well. One cannot but be impressed by the breadth of Watsuji's interests, by the depth of his scholarship, and by his ability as a remarkably clear and graceful writer. Yet his Climate and Culture, and his studies in ethics, particularly his Rinrigaku stand out as his two most influential publications.

2. The Philosophy of Watsuji

The foundations of Watsuji's thought were the extensive studies in Western philosophy that he engaged in during his earlier years, up until 1917 or 1918, followed by his extensive studies in Japanese and Far Eastern philosophy and culture. Upon his return from Europe in 1928, and as a direct result of being among the very first to read Martin Heidegger's Sein und Zeit, Watsuji began work on Fûdo (Fûdo ningen-gakuteki kôsatsu), translated into English as Climate and Culture. ‘Fûdo’ means “wind and earth…the natural environment of a given land” (Watsuji 1961, 1). We are all inescapably environed by our land, its geography and topography, its climate and weather patterns, temperature and humidity, soils and oceans, its flora and fauna, and so on, in addition to the resultant human styles of living, related artifacts, architecture, food choices, and clothing. This is but a partial list, but even this sketchy list makes clear that Watsuji is calling attention to the many ways in which our environment, taken in the broad sense, shapes who we are from birth to death. Heidegger's emphasis was on time and the individual, and too little, according to Watsuji, on space and the social dimensions of human beings. When we add to our sense of climate as including not only the natural geographic setting of a people and the regions's weather patterns, but also the social environment of family, community, society at large, lifestyle, and even the technological apparatus that supports community survival and interaction, then we begin to glimpse what Watsuji had in mind by climate, and how there exists a mutuality of influence from human to environment, and environment to human being which allows for the continued evolution of both. Climate is the entire interconnected network of influences that together create an entire people's attitudes and values. “History and nature,” remarks Yuasa Yasuo, “like man's mind and body, are in an inseparable relationship” (Yuasa 1996, 168). Culture is that mutuality of influence, recorded over eons of time past, which continues to effect the cultural present of a people. Who we are is not simply what we think, or what we choose as individuals in our aloneness, but is also the result of the climatic space into which we are born, live, love, and die.

Even before his travels in Europe (1927–28), Watsuji was convinced that one's environment was central in shaping persons and cultures. In Guzo Saiku (Revival of Idols), published in 1918, he had concluded that “all inquiries into the culture of Japan must in their final reduction go back to the study of her nature” (Furukawa 1961, 214). From about 1918 on, Watsuji's focus became the articulation of what it is that constitutes the Japanese spirit. Ancient Japanese Culture, which he wrote in 1920, is an attempt to revitalize Japan's oldest Chronicles (the Kojiki and Nihongi) using modern literary techniques as well as newly available archaeological evidence. He treated these collections of ancient stories, legends, poems, songs, and myths as literature, rather than as sacred scripture. Quoting from the Kojiki the imaginative story of creation, he then glosses this rich account: “‘When the land was still young and as a piece of floating grease, drifting about as does a jellyfish, there came into existence a god, issuing from what grew up like a reed-bud…’ [is] a superb…image of a piece of grease floating about without definite form like a thin, muddy substance far thicker than water, yet not solid, and of the image of a soft jellyfish with a formless form drifting on the water, and of the image of exuberant life of a reed-bud sprouting powerfully out of the muddy water of a swampy marsh. There is no other description that I know of that so graphically depicts the state of the world before creation” (Furukawa 1961, 221–22). It is a concrete and graphic depiction of the formlessness out of which all things arose, and is perhaps an early attempt at talk of nothingness, a central idea of the Kyoto School, and later on for Watsuji as well.

Not only can one discern his early interest in the importance of nothingness in his thinking, but there is also indication that he was sensitive to the non-dual immediacy of experience, which Nishida described as ‘pure experience’. As though discovering the roots of Nishida's ‘pure experience,’ he writes that “the ancient poets, whose feelings still retain a virgin simplicity as a single undivided experience, are not yet troubled by this division of the subjective and the objective” (as found in Japan's oldest collection of poems, the Manyoshu) (Furukawa 1961, 224). Natural beauty, for the poet, is as yet an undivided experience, a pure experience which is prior to the subject/object dichotomy, a total immersion in the moment without thought or reflection, in an ecstasy of feeling. In his Preface to Revival of Idols he warns that he intends not “a mere ‘revival of the old,’” but rather what he wished to achieve “is nothing more or nothing less than to advance such life as lives in the everlasting New” (Furukawa 1961, 227). To revive the old, then, is to cause it to shine anew, but in the light of contemporary issues and concerns. It is to revive its meaning for us, here and now, and not merely to show that it had meaning in the past. As part of one's cultural climate, the past inevitably operates still in the present of every Japanese. It was this still active element that Watsuji sought to uncover, and to express in such a way as to allow others to share in the present infused with the past in the consciousness of their own lives, rather than in some unconscious and only partially developed way. Similarly, he attempted to reveal the relevance of primitive Christianity, primitive Buddhism, and Confucianism as cultural inheritances which continue to shape people in various ‘climates’ around the world. He made explicit what was implicit, and he sought to revitalize the active ingredients of cultural traditions for right ‘now’.

In the Preface to Climate and Culture, Watsuji states that when we come to consider both the natural and the human cultural climate in which we find ourselves, we render both nature and culture as “already objectified, with the result that we find ourselves examining the relation between object and object, and there is no link with subjective human existence” (Watsuji 1961, v). The phenomena of climate must be seen “as expressions of subjective human existence and not of natural environment” (Watsuji 1961, v). He explains this using the example of the phenomenon of cold, a single climatic feature. Ordinarily, we think of ‘us’ and ‘coldness’ as objectively distinct and separate from us. Phenomenologically, however, we only come to know that it is cold after we actually feel it as cold. Coldness does not press upon us from the outside; rather, we are already out in the cold. As Heidegger emphasized, we ‘ex-istere’ outside of ourselves, and in this case, in the cold. It is not the cold which is outside of us, but we who are already out in the cold. And we feel this cold in common with other people. We all talk about the weather. To existere, then, means that we experience the cold with other ‘I's.’ We experience coldness within ourselves, with others, and “in relation to the soil, the topographic and scenic features and so on of a given land” (Watsuji 1961, 5). In a telling, and poetically adept passage, he writes that a cold wind may be experienced as a sharp mountain blast, or a dry wind sweeping through a city at the end of winter, or “the spring breeze may be one which blows off cherry blossoms or which caresses the waves” (Watsuji 1961, 5). All weather is as much ‘subjective’ as it is ‘objective.’

Because of the cold, we must decide upon sources of heat for our houses, design and create appropriate clothing (for each of the seasons and conditions), seek proper ventilation, defend ourselves and our houses against special conditions (floods, monsoon rains, typhoons, tornadoes, earthquakes, volcanic eruptions, tsunamis, etc.), counteract excessive humidity in some way, and we must learn how to grow our food and eat in ways compatible with the climatic conditions, and our capabilities of farming and gathering. We apprehend ourselves in climate, revealing ourselves to ourselves as both social and historical beings. Here is the crux of Watsuji's insight, and of his criticism of Heidegger's Zein und Zeit: to emphasize our being in time is “to discover human existence on the level only of individual consciousness” (Watsuji 1961, 9). As temporal beings, we can exist alone, in isolative reflection. On the other hand, if we recognize the ‘dual character’ of human beings as existing in both time and space, as both individuals and social beings, “then it is immediately clear that space must be regarded as linked with time” (Watsuji 1961, 9). Space is inextricably linked with time, and the individual and social aspects of ourselves are inextricably linked as well, and our history and culture are linked to our climate. And while change is constant, and hence all structures are continuously evolving, this evolution is inextricably linked to our history, traditions, and cultural forms of expression. We discover ourselves in climate, and it is because of climate that we have come to express ourselves as we have: “climate…is the agent by which human life is objectivised” (Watsuji 1961, 14).

Climate serves as the always present background to what becomes the foreground focus for Watsuji, the study of Japanese ethics in practice and in theory. Ethics is the study of the ways in which men and women, adults and children, the rulers and those ruled, have come to deal with each other in their specific climatic conditions. Ethics is the pattern of proper and effective social interaction.

3. Ethics

Watsuji's objection to individualistic ethics, which he associated with virtually all Western thinkers to some degree, is that it loses touch with the vast network of interconnections that serves to make us human. We are individuals inescapably immersed in the space/time world, together with others. Individual persons, if conceived of in isolation from their various social contexts, do not and cannot exist except as abstractions. Our way of being in the world is an expression of countless people and countless actions performed in a particular ‘climate,’ which together have shaped us as we are. Indeed a human being is a unified structure of past, present, and future; each of us is an intersection of past and future, in the present ‘now.’ There is no possibility of the isolation of the ego, and yet many write as though there were. They are able to make a case of it, in part because they ignore the spatiality of ningen (human being), focussing on ningen's temporality. Watsuji believed that it was far more difficult to consider a human being as strictly an individual, when thought of as a being in space. Spatially, we move in a common field, and that field is cultural in that it is criss-crossed by roads and paths, and even by forms of communication such as messenger services, postal routes, newspapers, flyers, broadcasts over great distances, all in addition to everyday polite conversation. Watsuji makes a point of the legend of the isolated and hopelessly marooned Robinson Crusoe, for even Robinson Crusoe continued to be culturally connected, continuing to speak an inherited language, and improvising housing, food, and clothing based on past social experiences, and continuing to hope for rescue at the hands of unknown others. Watsuji rejects all such ‘desert island’ constructions as mere abstractions. Thomas Hobbes imagined a state of nature in which we are radically discrete individuals, at a time before significant social interconnections have been established. Watsuji counters that we are inescapably born into social relationships, beginning with one's mother, and one's caregivers. Our very beginnings are etched by the relational interconnections which keep us alive, educate us, and initiate us into the proper ways of social interaction.

At the center of Watsuji's study of Japanese ethics is his analysis of the human person, in Japanese, ningen. In his Rinrigaku, he affirms that ethics is, in the final analysis, the study of human persons. Offering an etymological analysis, as he does so often, he displays the important complexity in the meaning of ningen. Ningen is composed of two characters, nin, meaning ‘person’ or ‘human being,’ and gen, meaning ‘space’ or ‘between.’ He cautions that it is imperative to recognize that a human being is not just an individual, but is also a member of many social groupings. We are individuals, and yet we are not just individuals, for we are also social beings; and we are social beings, but we are not just social beings, for we are also individuals. Many who interpret Watsuji forget the importance which he gave to this balanced and dual-nature of a human being. They read the words, but then go on to argue that he really gives priority to the collectivistic or social aspect of what it means to be a human being. That such an imbalance often occurs in Japanese society may be the reason for this conclusion. Yet it does not fit Watsuji's theoretical position, which is that we are, at one and the same time, both individual and social. In A Study of the History of the Japanese Spirit (1935) Watsuji cautions that “…the communion between man and man does not mean their becoming merely one. It is only through the fact that men are unique individuals that a cooperation between ‘man and man’ can be realized” (Watsuji 1935, 112). The tension between one's individual and one's social nature must not be slackened, or else the one is likely to overwhelm the other. He makes this point even clearer in discussing the creation of renga poetry, in the same volume. Renga poems are not created by a single individual but by a group of poets, with each individual verse linked to the next, and each verse the creation of a single individual, and yet each must cohere with the ‘poetic sphere’ as a whole. Watsuji concludes, “if there are self-centered persons in the company, a certain ‘distortion’ will be felt and group spirit itself will not be produced. When there are people, who, lacking individuality, are influenced only by others' suggestions, a certain ‘lack of power’ will be felt, and a creative enthusiasm will not appear. It is by means of attaining to Nothingness while each remains individual to the last, or in other words, by means of movements based on the great Void by persons each of whom has attained his own fulfilment, that the company will be complete and interest for creativity will be roused” (Watsuji 1935, 113). Individuality is not, and must not be lost, else the balance is destroyed, and creativity will not effectively arise. What is required is that we become selfless, no longer self-centered, and open to the communal sense of the whole group or society. It is a sense of individuality that is aware of social, public interconnections.

One expresses one's individuality by negating the social group or by rebelling against various social expectations or requirements. To be an individual demands that one negate the supremacy of the group. On the other hand, to envision oneself as a member of a group is to negate one's individuality. But is this an instance of poor logic? One can remain an individual and as such join as many groups as one wishes. Or one can think of oneself as an individual and yet as a parent, a worker, an artist, a theatre goer, and so forth. Watsuji understood this, but his argument is that it is possible to think in such ways only if one has already granted logical priority to the individual qua individual. Whatever group one belongs to, one belongs to it as an individual, and this individuality is not quenchable, except through death, or inauthenticity. Nevertheless, Watsuji's conception of what he calls the ‘negation of negation’ has a quite different, and perhaps deeper emphasis. To extricate ourselves from one or another socio-cultural inheritance, perhaps the acceptance of the Shinto faith, one has to rebel against this socio-cultural form by affirming one's individuality in such a way as to negate its overt influence on oneself. This is to negate an aspect of one's history by affirming one's individuality. But the second negation occurs when one become a truly ethical human being, and one negates one's individual separateness by abandoning one's individual independence from others. What we have now is a forgetting of the self, as Dôgen urged (“to study the way is to study the self, to study the self is to forget the self, to forget the self is to become enlightened by all things”), which yields a ‘selfless’ morality. To be truly human is not the asserting of one's individuality, but an annihilation of self-centeredness such that one is now identified with others in a nondualistic merging of self and others. Benevolence or compassion results from this selfless identification. This is our authentic ‘home ground,’ and it rekindles our awareness of our true and original nature. This home ground he calls ‘nothingness,’ about which more will be said below.

Watsuji's analysis of gen is of equal interest. He makes much of the notion of ‘betweenness,’ or ‘relatedness.’ He traces gen (ken) back to its earlier form, aida or aidagara, which refers to the space or place in which people are located, and in which the various crossroads of relational interconnection are established. Watsuji's now famous former student, Yuasa Yasuo, observes that “this betweenness consists of the various human relationships of our life-world. To put it simply, it is the network which provides humanity with a social meaning, for example, one's being an inhabitant of this or that town or a member of a certain business firm. To live as a person means…to exist in such betweenness” (Yuasa 1987, 37). As individuals, we are private beings, but as social beings we are public beings. We enter the world already within a network of relationships and obligations. Each of us is a nexus of pathways and roads, and our betweenness is already etched by the natural and cultural climate that we inherit and live our lives within. The Japanese live their lives within this relational network. It is imperative, therefore, that one know how to navigate these relational waters successfully, appropriately, and with relative ease and assurance. The study of these relational navigational patterns—between the individual and the family, self and society, as well as one's relationship to the environment—is the study of ethics.

Watsuji usually writes of ningen sonzai, and sonzai (existence) is composed of two characters, son (which means to preserve, to sustain over time), and zai (to stay in place, and in this case, to persevere in one's relationships). Ningen sonzai, then, refers to human nature as individual yet social, private as well as public, with our coming together in relationship occurring in the betweenness between us, which relationships we preserve and nourish to the fullest. Ethics has to do with the ways in which we, as human beings, respect, preserve, and persevere in the vast complexity of interconnections which etch themselves upon us as individuals, thereby forming our natures as social selves, and providing the necessary foundation for the creation of cooperative and workable societies.

The Japanese word for ethics is rinri, which is composed of two characters, rin and ri. Rin means ‘fellows,’ ‘company,’ and specifically refers to a system of relations guiding human association. Ri means ‘reason,’ or ‘principle,’ the rational ordering of human relationships. These principles are what make it possible for human beings to live in a cooperative community. Watsuji refers to the ancient Confucian patterns of human interaction as between parent and child, lord and vassal, husband and wife, young and old, and friend and friend. Presumably, one also acquires a sense of the appropriate and ethical in all other relationships as one grows to maturity in society. If enacted properly these relationships, which occur in the betweenness between us, serve as the oil which lubricates interaction with others in such a way as to minimize abrasive occurrences, and to maximize smooth and positive relationships. One can think of the betweenness between each of us as a basho, an empty space, in which we can either reach out to the other in order to create a relationship of positive value, or to shrink back, or to lash out, making a bad situation worse. The space is pure potential, and what we do with it depends on the degree to which we can encounter the other in a fruitful and appropriate manner in that betweenness. Nevertheless, every encounter is already etched with the cultural traditions of genuine encounter; ideally positive expectation, good will, open-heartedness, cheerfulness, sincerity, fellow-feeling, and availability. Ethics “consists of the laws of social existence” writes Watsuji (Watsuji 1996, 11).

4. Nothingness

The annihilation of the self, as the negation of negation “constitutes the basis of every selfless morality since ancient times,” asserts Watsuji (Watsuji 1996, 225). The negating of the group or society, and the emptying of the individual in Watsuji's sense of the negation of each by the other pole of ningen, makes evident that both are ultimately ‘empty,’ causing one to reflect upon that which is ultimate, and at the base of both one's individuality and the groups with which one associates. The losing of self is a returning to one's authenticity, to one's home ground as that source from which all things derive, and by which they are sustained. It is the abandonment of the self as independent which paves the way for the nondual relation between the self and others that terminates in the activity of benevolence and compassion through a unification of minds. The ethics of benevolence is the development of the capacity to embrace others as oneself or, more precisely, to forget one's self such that the distinction between the self and other does not arise in this nondualistic awareness. One has now abandoned one's self, one's individuality, and become the authentic ground of the self and the other as the realization of absolute totality. Ethics is now a matter of spontaneous compassion, spontaneous caring, and concern for the whole. This is the birth of selfless morality, for which the only counterparts in the West are the mystical traditions and perhaps some forms of religiosity in which it is God who moves in us, and not we ourselves. The double negation referred to earlier whereby the individual is negated by the group aspect of self, and the group aspect is in turn negated by the individual aspect, is not to be taken as a complete negation that obliterates that which is negated. The negated are preserved, else there would be no true self-contradiction. This robust sense of the importance of self-contradiction shares much with the more developed sense of the identity of self-contradiction about which Nishida said so much. What is stressed by both thinkers is that some judgments of logical contradiction are at best penultimate judgments, which may point us in the direction of a more comprehensive and accurate understanding of our own experience. Watsuji refers to ‘wakaru ’ (to understand), which is derived from ‘wakeru ’ (to divide); and in order to understand, one must already have presupposed something whole, that is to say, a system or unity. For example, in self-reflection, we make our own self, other. Yet the distinction reveals the original unity, for the self is other as objectified and of course is divided from the originally unified self. To think of a thing is to distinguish it from something else, and yet in order to make such a distinction, the two must already have had something in common. Thus, to emphasize the contradiction is to plunge into the world as many; to emphasize the context, or background, or matrix is to plunge into the world as one. Readers will be familiar with the logical formulation, often encountered in Zen but ubiquitous in Buddhism generally, that A is A; and A is not-A; therefore, A is A. There is a double negation in evidence here: an individual is an individual, and yet an individual is not individual unless one stands opposed to other individuals. That an individual stands opposed to others means that one is related to others as a member of a group or groups. Because an individual is a member of a group, one is both a member as an individual, and an otherwise isolated individual as a member of a group. We are both, in mutual interactive negation, and as such we are determined by the group or community, and yet we ourselves determine and shape the group or community. As such we are living self-contradictions, and, therefore, living identities of self-contradiction.

Morality, for Watsuji, is a coming back to authentic unity through an initial opposition between the self and other, and then a re-establishing of betweenness between self and other, ideally culminating in a nondualistic connection between the self and others that actually negates any trace of difference or opposition in the emptiness of the home ground. This is the negation of negation, and it occurs in both time and space. It is not simply a matter of enlightenment as a private, individual experience, calling one to awareness of the interconnectedness of all things. Rather, it is a spatio-temporal series of interconnected actions, occurring in the betweenness between us, which leads us to an awareness of betweenness that ultimately eliminates the self and other, but of course, only from within a nondualist perspective. Dualistically comprehended, both the self and other are preserved. What is left is betweenness itself in which human actions occur. In this sense, betweenness is nothingness, and nothingness is betweenness. Betweenness is the place where compassion arises and is acted out selflessly in the spatio-temporal theatre of the world. It is that which makes possible the variety of relationships of which human beings are capable.

5. The State

Watsuji's theory of the state, and his vocal support of the Emperor system, garnered considerable criticism after the Second World War. La Fleur maintains that Watsuji's detractors were “dominant in Japanese intellectual life from 1945 to approximately 1975,” while his admirers became “newly articulate since the decade of the 1980's” (LaFleur 1994, 453). The former group considered his position to be a dangerous one. He argued that the culmination of the double negation, which he conceived of as a single movement, was the restoration of the absolute totality. In other words, while the individual negates the group in order to be an authentic and independent individual, the second negation is to abandon one's independence as an individual in the full realization of totality. It is a ‘surrender’ to totality, moving one beyond the myriad specific groups to the one total and absolute whole. It would seem natural that this ultimate wholeness would be the home ground of nothingness, and in a way it is. But Watsuji argues that it is the state that takes on the authority of totality. It is the highest and best social structure thus far. The political implications of this position could easily result in a totalitarian state ethics. Indeed, Watsuji extolled the superiority of traditional Japanese culture because of its emphasis on self-negation, including the making of the ultimate sacrifice if required by the Emperor. In America's National Character (1944), he contrasted this willingness to an assumed selfishness or egocentrism found in the West, together with a utilitarian ethic of expediency, which he felt was rarely able to commit to self-surrender in aid of the state. What he saw as most exemplary in the Japanese way of life was the Bushido ideal of “the absolute negativity of the subject” (Odin 1996, 67), through which the totality of the whole is able to be achieved. There is no doubt that Watsuji's position could easily be interpreted as a totalitarian state ethics. Yet, insofar as Watsuji's analysis of Japanese ethics is an account of how the Japanese do actually act in the world, then it is little surprise that the Japanese errors of excess which culminated in the fascism of the Second World War period should be found somehow implicit and possible in Watsuji's acute presentation of Japanese cultural history. Perhaps the fault to be found lies not in his analysis per se, but rather in his all too sanguine collapsing of the descriptive and the prescriptive. That the Japanese way-in-the-world might include a totalitarian seed is something which demands a normative warning. Surely this is not what should be applauded as an aspect of the alleged superiority of Japanese culture, nor should Bushido in and of itself be taken as a blameless path to the highest of ethical achievements. The willingness to be loyal, whatever the rights and wrongs of the situation might be, in order to remain loyal to one's Lord, however evil or foolhardy he might be, is not an adequate or rational position, and it is surely not laudable ethically. It is, perhaps, the way the samurai saw themselves, as martial servants loyal to death. But the ‘is’ here is clearly not a moral ‘ought’.

What Watsuji adds to this picture which makes it extremely difficult to condemn him too harshly, and possibly to condemn him at all, is his adament insistence in the third volume of Rinrigaku that no one nation has charted the correct political and cultural path, and that the diversity of each is to be both encouraged and respected. He writes of unity in diversity, and rejects the idea that any nation has the right to culturally assimilate another. Each nation is shaped by its particular geography, climate, culture and history, and the resultant diversity is both to be protected and appreciated, and the notion of a universal state is, therefore, but an unwanted and dangerous delusion. We must know our own traditions, and to cherish those, but we must not extol them as superior out of our ignorance of other ways and cultural traditions. In fact, such ignorance, resulting from Japan's unwise self-imposed isolationism, Watsuji saw as the most tragic flaw in Japan's own history, and a cause of the Second World War. Japan knew so little of the outside world in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, that it exaggerated its own worth and power, and vastly underestimated the importance of political and diplomatic involvement in the happenings of the rest of the world. Nationalism must not express itself at the expense of internationalism, and internationalism must not establish itself at the expense of nationalism. Here is another pair of seeming contradictions to be held together by the unity of mutual interaction; the one modifies the other, and that tension is not to be resolved. Internationalism must be a unity of independent and distinctive nations.

Five months before the end of the Second World War, Watsuji organized a study group to re-think the Tokugawa Period (1600-1868), which resulted in his popular work, Closed Nation: Japan's Tragedy (Sakoku), published in 1950. Some critics reacted by dubbing this work “Watsuji's Tragedy” (LaFleur 2001, 1), yet La Fleur insists that Sakoku, together with a collection of other contemporaneous writings, provides a serious and important insight into Watsuji's later philosophical position. His focal thesis was that the tragedy of the Japanese involvement in the Second World War was a direct result of Japan's policy of national seclusion. Isolationism took Japan out of the events of the world's activities for two centuries, allowing the West to outstrip Japan in terms of science and technology. But even more important is Watsuji's insistence that the nationalists and militarists should have seen that Japan was in no position to win the war since both “men and materiel were in increasingly short supply” (LaFleur 2001, 3). Not that Watsuji opposed the war, but the point he was making was that the tragedy came to be because the earlier isolationist attitude had been revived from 1940 on. Japan was out of touch with the strengths and determination of its adversaries, and seemingly convinced that the character of the Japanese people would ensure success. Furthermore, coupled with this short-term return to a head-in-the-sand isolationism of the 1940's, was Watsuji's insistence that throughout most of Japan's history, the Japanese people had demonstrated an intense curiosity and a robust desire to learn, and in particular to learn from cultures quite different from their own: “No matter how far we go back in Japanese culture we will not find an age in which evidence of admiration of foreign cultures is not to be found” (Dilworth et al, 250). Japan was withdrawing inwards at precisely the time when the West's expansionism and imperialism was gathering steam. LaFleur goes so far as to suggest that in a 1943 lecture to Navy officials, Watsuji attempted to warn those in charge of the dangerous course they continued to pursue. LaFleur speculates that this is why Watsuji felt no need to recant after the War had ended. The salient point of all of this is that the instances of isolationism in Japanese history are exceptions which run counter to what Watsuji saw as the dominant tendency of the Japanese to both welcome and encourage outside influence. Japan's national character throughout the bulk of its history displays a remarkable openness to and interest in other cultures, and a steadfast desire to learn from those cultures. He was advocating a return to this more ‘normal’ attitude towards the outside world, and not a return to Japanese nationalism or chauvinism. Watsuji presents us with a complex perspective.

6. Religion

Watsuji's interest in religion was as a social phenomenon, that is, in religion as an aspect of the cultural environment, nevertheless, as LaFleur remarks, Watsuji “embraces a religious solution…philosophically and methodologically” (LaFleur 1978, 238). Watsuji writes of nothingness as that final place or context in which all distinctions disappear, or empty, and yet from which they emerge. LaFleur argues that “it was in the Buddhist notion of emptiness that Watsuji found the principle that gives his system…coherence” (LaFleur 1978, 239). The Buddhist notion of pratîtya-samutpâda, or ‘dependent co-origination’ (or ‘relationality,’ ‘conditioned co-production,’ ‘dependent co-arising,’ ‘co-dependent origination’) implies that everything is ‘empty’ that is to say, “that everything is deprived of its substantiality, nothing exists independently, everything is related to everything else, nothing ranks as a first cause, and even the self is but a delusory construction” (Abe 1985, 153). The delusion of independent individuality can be overcome by recognizing our radical relational interconnectedness. At the same time, even this negation must be emptied or negated, hence our radical relational interconnectedness is possible only because true individuals have created a network in the betweenness between them. The result is a selfless awareness of that totality beyond all limited, social totalities, namely the emptiness or nothingness at the bottom of all things, whether individual or group. LaFleur summarises Watsuji's position: “the social side of human existence ‘empties’ the individuated side of any possible priority or autonomy and the individuated side does something exactly the same and exactly proportionate to and for the social side. There can be no doubt, I think, that for Watsuji, emptiness is the key to it all” (LaFleur 1978, 250). Watsuji's emptiness is more a recognition of underlying relatedness, and manifests as a place, a basho, that is the dynamic and creative origination of all relationships and all networks of interactions. Even when Watsuji uses religious language (as in “it is a religious ecstasy of the great emptiness” (LaFleur 1978, 249), that ecstasy is not a mystical-like insight into one's union with God or the Absolute or a recognition of floating in ‘other-power,’ but a relational union of those persons involved in some communal forms, eventually culminating in the state. It is an ethical, or political, or communal ecstasy and not a religious identification with a transcendent Other. Watsuji gives no evidence of deep religiosity but expresses a profound and sometimes ecstatic ethical humanism, one which is, nonetheless, heavily Buddhist in conception.

In denying the reality of the subject/object distinction, and affirming the emptiness of all things, Watsuji was able to argue that as the individual negates or rebels against society, thereby emptying society of an unchanging objective status, and as the second negation establishes the totality of society by emptying the individual, it reduces the individual ego to emptiness as well. Neither of the dual characteristics of ningen are either unchanging or ultimately real. What is ultimate is the emptiness which is revealed as their basis, for all things are empty, and yet, once this truth is realized, it is as individuals and societies that nothingness is expressed and revealed. Emptiness negates itself, or empties itself as the beings of this world. And it does this in the emptiness of betweenness, the empty space within which relations between individuals and societies form and continue to re-form. The state, as the culminating social organization thus far achieved, is the form of forms, “transcending all the other levels of social organization…giving to each of those protected forms a proper place” (LaFleur 1994, 457). The state is, ultimately, “the moral systematiser of all those organizations” (LaFleur, french, 457). However, the problem of the proper relation of the individual to society emerges, for Watsuji goes on to argue that “the state subsumes within itself all these forms of private life and continually turns them into the form of the public domain” (LaFleur 1994, 457). In attempting to move away from the selfishness of egoistic action, Watsuji has given primacy to the state over individual and group rights. As LaFleur states, “by valorizing the state as that entity that has the moral authority—in fact the moral obligation—to ‘turn private things into the public domain, Watsuji provides a smooth rationale for a totalizing state” (LaFleur 1994, 458). Nevertheless, it must be kept in mind that his intent was not to advocate tyranny or fascism, but to seek out an ethical and social theory whereby human beings as human beings could interact easily and fruitfully in the space between them, creating as a result a society, and a world-wide association of societies which selflessly recognized the value of the individual and the crucial importance of the well-being of the whole. His solution may have been inadequate, and open to unwelcome misuse. His analysis of ‘betweenness’ shows it to be communality, and communality as a mutuality wherein each individual may affect every other individual and thereby affect the community or communities; and the community, as an historical expression of the whole may affect each individual. Ideally, what would result would be an enlightened sense of our interconnectedness with all human beings, regardless of race, color, religion, or creed, and a selfless, compassionate capacity to identify with others as though they were oneself. By reintroducing a vivial sense of our communitarian interconnectedness, and our spatial and bodily place in the betweenness between us, where we meet, love, and strive to live ethical lives together, Watsuji provides an ethical and political theory which might well prove to be helpful both to non-Japanese societies, and to a modern Japan itself which is torn between what it was, and what it is becoming.


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Heidegger, Martin | Japanese Philosophy | Japanese Philosophy: Kyoto School | Nishida Kitarô | nothingness | religion: philosophy of