Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Aug 28, 2003; substantive revision Thu Jan 8, 2009

Since metaphysics is the study of what exists, one might expect metaphysicians to have little to say about the limit case in which nothing exists. But ever since Parmenides in the fifth century BCE, there has been rich commentary on whether an empty world is possible, whether there are vacuums, and about the nature of privations and negation.

This survey starts with nothingness at a global scale and then explores local pockets of nothingness. Let's begin with a question that Martin Heidegger famously characterized as the most fundamental issue of philosophy.

1. Why is there something rather than nothing?

Well, why not? Why expect nothing rather than something? No experiment could support the hypothesis ‘There is nothing’ because any observation obviously implies the existence of an observer.

Is there any a priori support for ‘There is nothing’? One might respond with a methodological principle that propels the empty world to the top of the agenda. For instance, many feel that whoever asserts the existence of something has the burden of proof. If an astronomer says there is water at the south pole of the Moon, then it is up to him to provide data in support of the lunar water. If we were not required to have evidence to back our existential claims, then a theorist who fully explained the phenomena with one set of things could gratuitously add an extra entity, say, a pebble outside our light cone. We recoil from such add-ons. To prevent the intrusion of superfluous entities, one might demand that metaphysicians start with the empty world and admit only those entities that have credentials. This is the entry requirement imposed by Rene Descartes. He clears everything out and then only lets back in what can be proved to exist.

St. Augustine had more conservative counsel: we should not start at the beginning, nor at the end, but where we are, in the middle. We reach a verdict about the existence of controversial things by assessing how well these entities would harmonize with the existence of better established things. If we start from nothing, we lack the bearings needed to navigate forward. Conservatives, coherentists and scientific gradualists all cast a suspicious eye on ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’.

Most contemporary philosophers feel entitled to postulate whatever entities are indispensable to their best explanations of well accepted phenomena. They feel the presumption of non-existence is only plausible for particular existence claims. Since the presumption only applies on a case by case basis, there is no grand methodological preference for an empty world. Furthermore, there is no burden of proof when everybody concedes the proposition under discussion. Even a solipsist agrees there is at least one thing!

A more popular way to build a presumption in favor of nothingness is to associate nothingness with simplicity and simplicity with likelihood. The first part of this justification is plausible. ‘Nothing exists’ is simple in the sense of being an easy to remember generalization. Consider a test whose questions have the form ‘Does x exist?’. The rule ‘Always answer no!’ is unsurpassably short and comprehensive.

In Les Misérables, Victor Hugo contrasts universal negation with universal affirmation:

All roads are blocked to a philosophy which reduces everything to the word ‘no.’ To ‘no’ there is only one answer and that is ‘yes.’ Nihilism has no substance. There is no such thing as nothingness, and zero does not exist. Everything is something. Nothing is nothing. Man lives more by affirmation than by bread. (1862, pt. 2, bk. 7, ch. 6).

As far as simplicity is concerned, there is a tie between the nihilistic rule ‘Always answer no!’ and the inflationary rule ‘Always answer yes!’. Neither rule makes for serious metaphysics.

Even if ‘Nothing exists’ were the uniquely simplest possibility (as measured by memorability), why should we expect that possibility to be actual? In a fair lottery, we assign the same probability of winning to the ticket unmemorably designated 321,169,681 as to the ticket memorably labeled 111,111,111.

Indeed, the analogy with a lottery seems to dramatically reverse the presumption of non-existence. If there is only one empty world and many populated worlds, then a random selection would lead us to expect a populated world.

Peter van Inwagen (1996) has nurtured this statistical argument. In an infinite lottery, the chance that a given ticket is the winner is 0. So van Inwagen reasons that since there are infinitely many populated worlds, the probability of a populated world is equal to 1. Although the empty world is not impossible, it is as improbable as anything can be!

For the sake of balanced reporting, van Inwagen should acknowledge that, by his reasoning, the actual world is also as improbable as anything can be. What really counts here is the probability of ‘There is something’ as opposed to ‘There is nothing’.

Is this statistical explanation scientific? Scientists stereotypically offer causal explanations—which are obviously useless for ‘Why is there is something rather than nothing?’. However, Elliot Sober (1983) argues that scientists also accept “equilibrium explanations”. These explain the actual situation as the outcome of most or all of the possible initial states. There is no attempt to trace the path by which the actual initial state developed into the present situation. It suffices that the result is invariant. Why do I have enough oxygen to breathe even though all the oxygen molecules could have congregated in one corner my room? The physicist explains that while this specific arrangement is just as likely as any other, the overwhelming majority of arrangements do not segregate oxygen.

2. Is there at most one empty world?

Most philosophers would grant Peter van Inwagen's premise that there is no more than one empty world. They have been trained to model the empty world on the empty set. Since a set is defined in terms of its members, there can be at most one empty set.

But several commentators on the nature of laws are pluralists about empty worlds (Carroll 1994, 64). They think empty worlds can be sorted in terms of the generalizations that govern them. Newton's first law of motion says an undisturbed object will continue in motion in a straight line. Aristotle's physics suggests that such an object will slow down and tend to travel in a circle. The Aristotelian empty world differs from the Newtonian empty world because different counterfactual statements are true of it.

If variation in empty worlds can be sustained by differences in the laws that apply to them, there will be infinitely many empty worlds. The gravitational constant of an empty world can equal any real number between 0 and 1, so there are more than countably many empty worlds. Indeed, any order of infinity achieved by the set of populated possible worlds will be matched by the set of empty worlds.

This is true even if we restrict attention to laws that preclude all objects and therefore only govern empty worlds. Consider a law that requires any matter to adjoin an equal quantity of anti-matter. The principles of matter and anti-matter ensure that they cannot co-exist so the result would be an empty world.

Advocates of the fine tuning argument (a descendent of the design argument) claim that the conditions under which life can develop are so delicate that the existence of observers indicates divine intervention. A similar argument might be fashioned that stresses what a narrow range of laws permit the formation of concrete entities. From the perspective of these fine tuners, the existence of a universe with rocks is an inspiring surprise.

Some existentialists picture nothingness as a kind of force that impedes each object's existence. Since there is something rather than nothing, any such nihilating force cannot have actually gone unchecked. What could have blocked it? Robert Nozick (1981, 123) toys with an interpretation of Heidegger in which this nihilating force is self-destructive. This kind of double-negation is depicted in the Beatles's movie The Yellow Submarine. There is a creature that zooms around like a vacuum cleaner, emptying everything in its path. When this menace finally turns on itself, a richly populated world pops into existence.

Some cultures have creation myths reminiscent of The Yellow Submarine. Heidegger would dismiss them as inappropriately historical. ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is not about the origin of the world. Increasing the scientific respectability of the creation story (as with the Big Bang hypothesis) would still leave Heidegger objecting that the wrong question is being addressed.

3. Can there be an explanatory framework for the question?

Some would disagree with van Inwagen's assumption that each possible world is as likely as any other. There have been metaphysical systems that favor less populated worlds.

Gottfried Leibniz pictured possible things as competing to become actual. The more a thing competes with other things, the more likely that there will be something that stops it from becoming real. The winners in Leibniz's struggle for existence are cooperative. They uniquely fit the niche formed by other things. Thus this key hole into existence implicitly conveys information about everything. The little bit that is not, tells us about all that there is.

On the one hand, this metaphysical bias in favor of simplicity is heartening because it suggests that the actual world is not too complex for human understanding. Scientists have penetrated deeply into the physical world with principles that emphasize simplicity and uniformity: Ockham's razor, the least effort principle, the anthropic principle, etc.

On the other hand, Leibniz worried that the metaphysical bias for simplicity, when driven to its logical conclusion, yields the embarrassing prediction that there is nothing. After all, an empty world would be free of objects trying to elbow each other out. It is the easiest universe to produce. (Just do nothing!) So why is there is something rather than nothing?

Leibniz's worry requires a limbo between being and non-being. If the things in this limbo state do not really exist, how could they prevent anything else from existing?

Leibniz's limbo illustrates an explanatory trap. To explain why something exists, we standardly appeal to the existence of something else. There are mountain ranges on Earth because there are plates on its surface that slowly collide and crumple up against each other. There are rings around Saturn because there is an immense quantity of rubble orbiting that planet. This pattern of explanation is not possible for ‘Why is there something rather than nothing’. For instance, if we answer ‘There is something because the Universal Designer wanted there to be something’, then our explanation takes for granted the existence of the Universal Designer. Someone who poses the question in a comprehensive way will not grant the existence of the Universal Designer as a starting point.

If the explanation cannot begin with some entity, then it is hard to see how any explanation is feasible. Some philosophers conclude ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is unanswerable. They think the question stumps us by imposing an impossible explanatory demand, namely, Deduce the existence of something without using any existential premises. Logicians should feel no more ashamed of their inability to perform this deduction than geometers should feel ashamed at being unable to square the circle.

David Hume offers a consolation prize: we might still be able explain the existence of each event even if it is impossible to explain everything all together. Suppose that the universe is populated with an infinite row of dominoes. The fall of each domino can be explained by the fall of its predecessor.

Hume denied that the existence of anything could be proved by reason alone. But rationalists have been more optimistic. Many have offered a priori proofs of God's existence. Such a proof would double as an explanation of why there is something. If God exists, then something exists. After all, God is something.

But would God be the right sort of something? If we are only seeking an a priori proof of something (anything at all!), then why not rest content with a mathematical demonstration that there exists an even prime number?

4. The restriction to concrete entities

Van Inwagen's answer is that we are actually interested in concrete things. A concrete entity has a position in space or time. For instance, a grain of sand, a camel, and an oasis are all concrete entities. Since they have locations, they have boundaries with their environment. (The only exception would be an entity that took up all space and time.)

Admittedly, points in space and time have locations. But concrete entities are only accidentally where and when they are. All concrete entities have intrinsic properties. Their natures are not exhausted by their relationships with other things. Consider Max Black's universe containing nothing but twin iron spheres. The spheres are distinct yet have the same relationships and the same intrinsic properties.

All material things are concrete but some concrete things might be immaterial. Shadows and holes have locations and durations but they are not made of anything material. There is extraneous light in shadows and extraneous matter in holes; but these are contaminants rather than constituents. If there are souls or Cartesian minds, then they will also qualify as immaterial, concrete entities. Although they do not take up space, they take up time. An idealist such as George Berkeley could still ask ‘Why is there is something rather than nothing?’ even though he was convinced that material things are not possible.

Although all concrete things are in space or time, neither space nor time are concrete things. Where would space be? When would time occur? These questions can only be answered if space were contained in another higher space. Time would be dated within another time. Since the same questions can be posed for higher order space and higher order time, we would face an infinite regress.

There is no tradition of wondering ‘Why is there space and time?’. One reason is that space and time seem like a framework for there being any contingent things.

Absolutists think of the framework as existing independently of what it frames. For instance, Newton characterized space as an eternal, homogenous, three dimensional container of infinite extent. He believed that the world was empty of objects for an infinite period prior to creation (setting aside an omnipresent God). An empty world would merely be a continuation of what creation interrupted.

Others think the framework depends on what it frames. Like Leibniz, Albert Einstein pictured (or “pictured”) space as an abstraction from relations between objects. Consequently, space can be described with the same metaphors we use for family trees. Maybe space grows bigger. Maybe space is curved or warped or has holes. There is much room to wonder why space has properties that it has. But since space is an abstraction from objects, answers to any riddles about space reduce to facts about objects. One can wonder why there is space. But this is only to wonder why there are objects.

5. The contingency dilemma

All concrete things appear to be contingent beings. For instance, the Earth would not have existed had the matter which now constitutes our solar system formed, as usual, two stars instead of one. If no concrete thing is a necessary being, then none of them can explain the existence of concrete things.

Even if God is not concrete, proof of His existence would raise hope of explaining the existence of concrete things. For instance, the Genesis creation story suggests that God made the Earth and that He had a reason to do so. If this account could be corroborated we would have an explanation of why the Earth exists and why we exist.

This divine explanation threatens to over-explain the data. Given that God is a necessary being and that the existence of God necessitates the existence of the Earth, then the Earth would be a necessary being rather than a contingent being.

The dilemma was generalized by William Rowe (1975). Consider all the contingent truths. The conjunction of all these truths is itself a contingent truth. On the one hand, this conjunction cannot be explained by any contingent truth because the conjunction already contains all contingent truths; the explanation would be circular. On the other hand, this conjunction cannot be explained by a necessary truth because a necessary truth can only imply other necessary truths. This dilemma suggests that ‘Why are there any contingent beings?’ is impossible to answer.

Rowe is presupposing that an answer would have to be a deductive explanation. If there are ‘inferences to the best explanation’ or inductive explanations, then there might be a way through the horns of Rowe's dilemma.

There also remains hope that Rowe's dilemma can be bypassed by showing that the empty world is not a genuine possibility. Then the retort to ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is ‘There is no alternative to there being something’.

‘There might be nothing’ is false when read epistemically. (Roughly, a proposition is epistemically possible if it is consistent with everything that is known.) For we know that something actually exists and knowledge of actuality precludes epistemic possibility. But when read metaphysically, ‘There might be nothing’ seems true. So ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ is, so far, a live question.

The question is not undermined by the a priori status of knowledge that something exist. (I know a priori that something exists because I know a priori that I exist and know this entails ‘Something exists’.) Knowledge, even a priori knowledge, that something is actually true is compatible with ignorance as to how it could be true.

Residual curiosity is possible even when the the proposition is known to be a necessary truth. A reductio ad absurdum proof that 1 − 1/3 + 1/5 − 1/7 + … converges to π/4 might persuade me that there is no alternative without illuminating how it could be true. For this coarse style of proof does not explain how π wandered into the solution. (Reductio ad absurdum just shows a contradiction would follow if the conclusion were not true.) This raises the possibility that even a logical demonstration of the metaphysical necessity of ‘Something exists’ might still leave us asking why there is something rather than nothing (though there would no longer be the wonder about the accidentality of there being something).

6. The intuitive primacy of positive truths

Henri Bergson maintained that nothingness is precluded by the positive nature of reality. The absence of a female pope is not a brute fact. ‘There is not a female pope’ is made true by a positive fact such as the Catholic Church's regulation that all priests be men and the practice of drawing popes from the priesthood. Once we have the positive facts and the notion of negation, we can derive all the negative facts. ‘There is nothing’ would be a contingent, negative fact. But then it would have to be grounded on some positive reality. That positive reality would ensure that there is something rather than nothing.

Human beings have a strong intuition that positive truths, such as ‘Elephants are huge’ are more fundamental than negative truths such as ‘Elephants do not jump’. The robustness of this tendency makes negative things objects of amusement. Consider the Professor's remark during his chilly banquet in Lewis Carroll's Sylvie and Bruno Concluded.

“I hope you'll enjoy the dinner—such as it is; and that you won't mind the heat—such as it isn't.”

The sentence sounded well, but somehow I couldn't quite understand it … (chapter 22)

How can we perceive absences? They seem causally inert and so not the sort of thing that we could check empirically. Negative truths seem redundant; there are no more truths than those entailed by the conjunction of all positive truths. The negative truths seem psychological; we only assert negative truths to express a frustrated expectation. When Jean Paul Sartre (1969, 41) arrives late for his appointment with Pierre at the cafe, he sees the absence of Pierre but not the absence of the Duke of Wellington.

Philosophers have had much trouble vindicating any of these intuitions. Bertrand Russell (1985) labored mightily to reduce negative truths to positive truths. Russell tried paraphrasing ‘The cat is not on the mat’ as ‘There is a state of affairs incompatible with the cat being on the mat’. But this paraphrase is covertly negative; it uses ‘incompatible’ which means not compatible. He tried modeling ‘Not p’ as an expression of disbelief that p. But ‘disbelief’ means believing that something is not the case. Is it even clear that absences are causally inert? Trapped miners are killed by the absence of oxygen. In the end Russell gave up. In a famous lecture at Harvard, Russell concluded that irreducibly negative facts exist. He reports this nearly caused a riot.

Were it not for the threat to social order, one might stand the intuition on its head: Negative truths are more fundamental than positive truths. From a logical point of view, there is greater promise in a reduction of positive truths to negative truths. Positive truths can be analyzed as the negations of negative truths or perhaps as frustrated disbelief. Positive truths would then be the redundant hanger-ons, kept in circulation by our well-documented difficulty in coping with negative information. Think of photographic negatives. They seem less informative than positive prints. But since the prints are manufactured from the negatives, the negatives must be merely more difficult for us to process.

As difficult as negation might be psychologically, it is easier to work with than the alternatives suggested by Henry Sheffer. In 1913, he demonstrated that all of the logical connectives can be defined in terms of the stroke function |. It is the dual of conjunction: p|q is false exactly when p and q are each true. The same goes for the dual of disjunction, the dagger function, which is true exactly when p and q are each false. From a logical point of view, negation is dispensable. This raises hope that all of the paradoxes of negation can be translated away.

Bertrand Russell quickly incorporated the stroke function into Principia Mathematica. Sheffer's functions have also been a great economy to computers (as witnessed by the popularity of NAND gates). However, human beings have trouble achieving fluency with Sheffer's connectives. Even Sheffer translates p|q as neither p nor q. Psychologically, this is a double dose of negation rather than an alternative to negation.

But we could let computers do our metaphysics just as we let them do our taxes. The only serious objection is that the problems of negation do not really go away when we translate into artificial languages. For instance, the challenge posed by negative existential sentences such as ‘Pegasus does not exist’ persists when it is translated with a Sheffer stroke into ‘Pegasus exists|Pegasus exists’. Any desire to make ‘Pegaus does not exist’ come out true warrants a desire to make ‘Pegasus exists|Pegasus exists’ come out true. (Since classical logic does not permit empty names, the stroke existential sentence will be false.)

The more general concern is that the problems which are naturally couched in terms of negation persist when they are translated into a different logical vocabulary. Given that the translation preserves the meaning of the philosophical riddle, it will also preserve its difficulty.

We will engage in negative thinking to avoid highly complicated positive thinking. What is the probability of getting at least one head in ten tosses of a coin? Instead of directly computing the probability of this highly disjunctive positive event, we switch to a negative perspective. We first calculate the probability of an absence of heads and then exploit the complement rule: Probability (at least one head) = 1 − Probability (no heads).

Some possible worlds are easier to contemplate negatively. Thales said that all is water. Suppose he was nearly right except for the existence of two bubbles. These two absences of water become the interesting players (just as two drops of water in an otherwise empty space become interesting players in the dual of this universe). How would these bubbles relate to each other? Would the bubbles repel each other? Would the bubbles be mutually unaffected? Deep thinking about gravity yields the conclusion that the bubbles would attract each other! (Epstein 1983, 138-9)

The hazard of drawing metaphysical conclusions from psychological preferences is made especially vivid by caricatures. We know that caricatures are exaggerated representations. Despite the flagrant distortion (and actually because of it) we more easily recognize people from caricatures rather than from faithful portraits.

For navigational purposes, we prefer schematic subway maps over ones that do justice to the lengths and curves of the track lines. But this is not a basis for inferring that reality is correspondingly schematic.

Our predilection for positive thinking could reflect an objective feature of our world (instead of being a mere anthropocentric projection of one style of thought). But if this objective positiveness is itself contingent, then it does not explan why there is something rather than nothing. For Bergson's explanation to succeed, the positive nature of reality needs to be a metaphysically necessary feature.

7. The subtraction argument

Thomas Baldwin (1996) reinforces the possibility of an empty world by refining the following thought experiment: Imagine a world in which there are only finitely objects. Suppose each object vanishes in sequence. Eventually you run down to three objects, two objects, one object and then Poof! There's your empty world.

What can be done temporally can be done modally. There is only a small difference between a world with a hundred objects and a world with just ninety-nine, and from there …. well, just do the arithmetic!

Gonzalo Rodriguez (1997, 163) warns that we must subtract the right way. Assume that each part of a concrete entity is itself concrete. Also assume that concrete entities are infinitely divisible (as seems natural given that space is dense). An infinitely complex object cannot be nibbled away with any number of finite bites.

What to do? Rodriguez recommends big, infinite bites. Instead of subtracting entity by entity, subtract by the chunk (of infinitely composite entities).

Our metaphysical calculations are subtly influenced by how we picture possible worlds (Coggins 2003). If possible worlds are envisaged as containers, then they can be completely emptied out. Similarly, if possible worlds are pictured as stories (say maximally consistent ways things could have been), then our library will contain a tale lacking any concrete entities as characters. But if a possible worlds are pictured mereologically, as giant composites of concrete objects (Lewis 1986), our subtraction falters before we reach zero. Similarly, if possible worlds require an active construction (say, Ludwig Wittgenstein's imaginary rearrangements of objects drawn from the actual world), then the very process of construction ensures that there are some concrete objects in every possible world.

Some kind of background theory of possible worlds is needed. For without this substantive guidance, the subtraction argument seems invalid. More specifically, from a metaphysically neutral perspective, the fact that it is possible for each object to not exist seems compatible with it being necessary that at least one object exists.

The founder of modal logic, Aristotle, has special reason to deny that ‘Necessarily (p or q)’ entails ‘Necessarily p or necessarily q’. Aristotle believed that all abstract entities depend on concrete entities for their existence. Yet he also believed that there are necessary truths. The existence any particular individual is contingent but it is necessary that some individuals exist.

Science textbooks teem with contingent abstract entities: the equator, Jupiter's center of gravity, NASA's space budget, etc. Twentieth century mathematics makes sets central. Sets are defined in terms of their members. Therefore, any set that contains a contingent entity is itself a contingent entity. The set that contains you is an abstract entity that has no weight or color or electric charge. But it still depends on you for its existence.

Mathematics can be reconstructed in terms of sets given the assumption that something exists. From you we derive the set containing you, then the set containing that set, then the set containing that larger set, and so on. Through ingenious machinations, all of mathematics can be reconstructed from sets. Contemporary set theorists like to spin this amazing structure from the empty set so as to not assume the existence of contingent beings. This is the closest mathematicians get to creation from nothing!

Early set theorists and several contemporary metaphysicians reject the empty set. Yet the loveliness of the construction makes many receptive to Wesley Salmon's ontological argument: “The fool saith in his heart that there is no empty set. But if that were so, then the set of all such sets would be empty, and hence it would be the empty set.”

E. J. Lowe argues on behalf of the fool: “A set has these [well-defined identity conditions] only to the extent that its members do—but the empty set has none. Many things have no members: what makes just one of these qualify as ‘the empty set’” (1996, 116 fn.) Since mathematical statements such as ‘The first prime number after 1,000,000 is 1,000,003’ are necessary truths and can only be rendered true by the existence of a contingent being, Lowe concludes that there necessarily exists at least one contingent being. In other words, the empty world is impossible even if there are no necessary beings.

There are other metaphysical systems that make the existence of some concrete entities necessary without implying that there are any necessarily existing concrete things. In his Tractatus phase, Ludwig Wittgenstein takes a world to be a totality of facts. A fact consists of one or more objects related to each other in a certain way. By an act of selective attention, we concentrate on just the objects or just the relations. But objects and relations are always inextricably bound up with each other. Since every fact requires at least one object, a world without objects would be a world without facts. But a factless world is a contradiction in terms. Therefore, the empty world is impossible.

Nevertheless, the persuasiveness of the subtraction argument is not entirely hostage to background theories about the nature of possible worlds. Even those with metaphysical systems that guarantee the existence of some concrete entities feel pressure to revise those systems to accommodate the empty world, or at least to look for some loophole that would make their system compatible with Baldwin's thought experiment.

Consider the combinatorialist David Armstrong. He recently acquisced to the empty world by relaxing his account of truthmakers. A truthmaker is a piece of reality that makes a statement true. Armstrong believes that every contingent truth is made true by a truthmaker and has wielded the principle forcefully against analytical behaviorists, phenomenalists, nominalists, and presentists. Since there can be no truthmaker for an empty world, Armstrong appears to have a second objection to the empty world (supplementing the objection based on his combinatorial conception of a possible world). Yet Armstrong (2004, 91) instead claims that the empty world could borrow truthmakers from the actual world. His idea is that the truthmakers for possibilities are actual objects and that these actual objects could serve as the truthmakers for the empty world. David Erfid and Tom Stoneham (2009) object that cross-world truthmakers would be equally handy to the analytical behaviorists, phenomenalists and their ilk. Whether or not Armstrong has contradicted himself, he has illustrated the persuasiveness of the subtraction argument.

8. Ontological neutrality

Aristotle assumes that universal generalizations have existential import; ‘All men are mortal’ implies that there are men. But consider linked quantifications such as ‘All trespassers will be shot. All survivors will be shot again.’ The conjunction of these two universal generalizations is not a contradiction. The conjunction is false if there is a wounded trespasser who fails to be re-shot. But it can be true if all potential trespassers heed the warning. The force of the warning is conditional; ‘IF there is a trespasser, THEN he will be shot. And IF he survives this shooting, THEN he will be shot again.’

Twentieth century logicians were impressed by generalizations such as ‘All immortals live forever’ that do not commit to the existence of the subject items. They also wanted to preserve the intuitive equivalence between ‘All men are mortal’ and its contrapositive ‘All immortals are non-men’. They analyzed universal generalizations as conditionals: ‘All men are mortal’ means ‘For each x, if x is a man, then x is mortal’. If there are no men, then the generalization is vacuously true. Nevertheless, the logicians still insisted that the universal quantifier has existential import; if all is water, then there exists some water.

Even with this revision, classical logic militates against the empty world. Since its universal quantifier has existential import, each of its logical laws imply that something exists. For instance, the principle of identity, Everything is identical to itself entails There exists something that is identical to itself. All sorts of attractive inferences are jeopardized by the empty world.

Logicians do not treat their intolerance of the empty world as a resource for metaphysicians. They do not want to get involved in metaphysical disputes. They feel that logic should be neutral with respect to the existence of anything. They yearn to rectify this “defect in logical purity” (Russell 1919, 203).

The ideal of ontological neutrality has led some philosophers to reject classical logic. A direct response would be to be challenge the existential import of the classical quantifiers.

Proponents of “free logic” prefer to challenge the existential presupposition of singular terms (Lambert 2003, 124). In classical logic, names must have referents. Free logic lacks this restriction and so countenances empty names as in ‘Sherlock Holmes is a detective’ and negative existentials such as ‘Pegasus does not exist’.

These changes would have implications for W. V. Quine's (1953a) popular criterion for ontological commitment. Quine says that we can read off our ontology from the existentially quantified statements constituting our well-accepted theories. For instance, if evolutionary theory says that there are some species that evolved from other species, and if we have no way to paraphrase away this claim, then biologists are committed to the existence of species. Since philosophers cannot improve on the credentials of a scientific commitment, metaphysicians would also be obliged to accept species.

So how does Quine defend his criterion of ontological commitment from the menace looming from the empty domain? By compromise. Normally one thinks of a logical theorem as a proposition that holds in all domains. Quine (1953b, 162) suggests that we weaken the requirement to that of holding in all non-empty domains. In the rare circumstances in which the empty universe must be considered, there is an easy way of testing which theorems will apply: count all the universal quantifications as true, and all the existential quantifications as false, and then compute for the remaining theorems.

Is Quine being ad hoc? Maybe. But exceptions are common for notions in the same family as the empty domain. For instance, instructors halt their students' natural pattern of thinking about division to forestall the disaster that accrues from permitting division by zero. If numbers were words, zero would be an irregular verb.

9. The problem of multiple nothings

Many of the arguments used to rule out total emptiness also preclude small pockets of emptiness. Leibniz says that the actual world must have something rather than nothing because the actual world must be the best of all possible worlds, and something is better than nothing. But by the same reasoning, Leibniz concludes there are no vacuums in the actual world: more is better than less.

Leibniz also has arguments that target the possibility of there being more than one void. If there could be more than one void, then there could be two voids of exactly the same shape and size. These two voids would be perfect twins; everything true of one void would be true of the other. This is precluded by the principle of the identity of indiscernibles: if anything true of x is true of y, then x is identical to y.

A second problem with multiple voids arises from efforts to paraphrase them away. From the time of Melissus, there have been arguments against the possibility of a void existing in the manner that an object exists: “Nor is there any void, for void is nothing, and nothing cannot be.” (Guthrie 1965, 104) If you say there is a vacuum in the flask, then you are affirming the existence of something in the flask—the vacuum. But since ‘vacuum’ means an absence of something, you are also denying that there is something in the flask. Therefore, ‘There is a vacuum in the flask’ is a contradiction.

Some react to Melissus's argument by analyzing vacuums as properties of things rather than things in their own right. According to C. J. F. Williams (1984, 383), ‘There is a vacuum in the flask’ should be rendered as ‘The flask noths’. He does this in the same spirit that he renders ‘There is fog in Winchester’ as ‘Winchester is foggy’ and ‘There is a smell in the basement’ as ‘The basement smells’.

If this paraphrase strategy works for vacuums, it ought to work for the more prosaic case of holes. Can a materialist believe that there are holes in his Swiss cheese? The holes are where the matter is not. So to admit the existence of holes is to admit the existence of immaterial objects!

One response is to paraphrase ‘There is a hole in the cheese’ as ‘The cheese holes’ or, to be a bit easier on the ear, as ‘The cheese is perforated’. What appeared to be an existential claim has metamorphosized into a comment on the shape of the cheese.

But how are we to distinguish between the cheese having two holes as opposed to one? (Lewis and Lewis 1983, 4) Well, some cheese is singly perforated, some cheese is doubly-perforated, yet other cheese is n-perforated where n equals the number of holes in the cheese.

Whoa! We must be careful not to define ‘n-perforation’ in terms of holes; that would re-introduce the holes we set out to avoid.

Can holes be avoided by confining ourselves to the process of perforation? Single-hole punchers differ from triple-hole punchers by how they act; singlely rather than triply.

The difficulty with this process-oriented proposal that the product, a hole, is needed to distinguish between successful and merely attempted perforation. Furthermore, the paraphrase is incomplete because it does not extend to unmade holes.

Can we just leave expressions of the form ‘n-perforated’ as primitive, unanalyzed shape predicates? The Lewises note that this strands us with an infinite list of primitive terms. Such a list could never have been memorized. The Lewises do not see how ‘n-perforated’ can be recursively defined without alluding to holes.

The paraphrase prospects seem equally bleak for being ‘n-vacuumed’. Big meteorites pass through the atmosphere in about one second leaving a hole in the atmosphere—a vacuum in “thin air”. The air cannot rush in quickly enough to fill the gap. This explains why rock vapor from the impact shoots back up into the atmosphere and later rains down widely on the surface. During a meteorite shower, the atmosphere is multiply vacuumed. But this is just to say that there are many vacuums in the atmosphere.

10. Is there any nothingness?

The trouble sustaining multiple voids may push us to the most extreme answer to ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’, namely, ‘There must not only be something but there must not be any emptiness at all!’.

Parmenides maintained that it is self-defeating to say that something does not exist. The linguistic rendering of this insight is the problem of negative existentials: ‘Atlantis does not exist’ is about Atlantis. A statement can be about something only if that something exists. No relation without relata! Therefore, ‘Atlantis does not exist’ cannot be true. Parmenides and his disciples elaborated conceptual difficulties with negation into an incredible metaphysical monolith.

The Parmenideans were opposed by the atomists. The atomists said that the world is constituted by simple, indivisible things moving in empty space. They self-consciously endorsed the void to explain empirical phenomena such as movement, compression, and absorption.

Parmenides's disciple, Zeno of Elea, had already amassed an amazing battery of arguments to show motion is impossible. Since these imply that compression and absorption are also impossible, Zeno rejects the data of the atomists just as physicists reject the data of parapsychologists.

Less radical opponents of vacuums, such as Aristotle, re-explained the data within a framework of plenism: although the universe is full, objects can move because other objects get out of the way. Compression and absorption can be accommodated by having things pushed out of the way when other things jostle their way in.

Aristotle denied the void can explain why things move. Movement requires a mover that is pushing or pulling the object. An object in a vacuum is not in contact with anything else. If the object did move, there would be nothing to impede its motion. Therefore, any motion in a vacuum would be at an unlimited speed.

Aristotle's refutation of the void persuaded most commentators for the next 1500 years. There were two limited dissenters to his thesis that vacuums are impossible. The Stoics agreed that terrestrial vacuums are impossible but believed there must be a void surrounding the cosmos. Hero of Alexandria agreed that there are no naturally occuring vacuums but believed that they can be formed artificially. He cites pumps and siphons as evidence that voids can be created. Hero believed that bodies have a natural horror of vacuums and struggle to prevent their formation. You can feel the antipathy by trying to open a bellows that has had its air hole plugged. Try as you might, you cannot separate the sides. However, unlike Aristotle, Hero thought that if you and the bellows were tremendously strong, you could separate the sides and create a vacuum.

Hero's views became more discussed after the Church's anti-Aristotelian condemnation of 1277 which required Christian scholars to allow for the possibility of a vacuum.

Christians are selective about which parts of the Bible to take seriously. They do not always choose the easier assertions. A striking example is the doctrine of creation from nothing. This jeopardized their overarching commitment to avoid outright irrationality. If creation out of nothing were indeed a demonstrable impossibility, then faith would be forced to override an answer given by reason rather than merely answer a question about which reason is silent.

All Greek philosophy had assumed creation was from something more primitive, not nothing. Consistently, the Greeks assumed destruction was disassembly into more basic units. (If destruction into nothingness were possible, the process could be reversed to get creation from nothing.) The Christians were on their own when trying to make sense of creation from nothing.

Creation out of nothing presupposes the possibility of total nothingness. This in turn implies that there can be some nothingness. Thus Christians had a motive to first establish the possibility of a little nothingness. Their strategy was start small and scale up.

Accordingly, scholars writing in the aftermath of the condemnation of 1277 proposed various recipes for creating vacuums. One scheme was to freeze a sphere filled with water. After the water contracted into ice, a vacuum would form at the top.

Aristotelians replied that the sphere would bend at its weakest point. When the vacuists stipulated that the sphere was perfect, the rejoinder was that this would simply prevent the water from turning into ice.

Neither side appears to have tried out the recipe. If either had, then they would have discovered that freezing water expands rather than contracts.

To contemporary thinkers, this dearth of empirical testing is bizarre. The puzzle is intensified by the fact that the medievals did empirically test many hypotheses, especially in optics.

Hero was eventually refuted by experiments with barometers conducted by Evangelista Torricelli and Blaise Pascal. Their barometer consisted of a tube partially submerged, upside down in bowl of mercury. What keeps the mercury suspended in the tube? Is there an unnatural vacuum that causes the surrounding glass to pull the liquid up? Or is there no vacuum at all but rather some rarefied and invisible matter in the “empty space”? Pascal answered that there really was nothing holding up the mercury. The mercury rises and falls due to variations in the weight of the atmosphere. The mercury is being pushed up the tube, not pulled up by anything.

When Pascal offered this explanation to the plenist Descartes, Descartes wrote Christian Huygens that Pascal had too much vacuum in his head. Descartes identified bodies with extension and so had no room for vacuums. If there were nothing between two objects, then they would be touching each other. And if they are touching each other, there is no gap between them.

Well maybe the apparent gap is merely a thinly occupied region of space. On this distributional model, there is no intermediate “empty object” that separates the two objects. There is merely unevenly spread matter. This model is very good at eliminating vacuums in the sense of empty objects. However, it is also rather good at eliminating ordinary objects. What we call objects would just be relatively thick deposits of matter. There would be only one natural object: the whole universe. This may have been the point of Spinoza's attack on vacuums (Bennett 1980).

Descartes was part of a tradition that denied action at a distance. Galileo was disappointed by Johannes Kepler's hypothesis that the moon influences the tides because the hypothesis seems to require causal chains in empty space. How could the great Kepler believe something so silly? When Isaac Newton resurrected Kepler's hypothesis he was careful to suggest that the space between the moon and the Earth was filled with ether.

Indeed, the universality of Newton's law of gravitation seems to require that the whole universe be filled with a subtle substance. How else could the universe be bound together by causal chains? Hunger for ether intensified as the wave-like features of light became established. It is tautologous that a wave must have a medium.

Or is it? As the theoretical roles of the ether proliferated, physicists began to doubt there could be anything that accomplished such diverse feats. These doubts about the existence of ether were intensified by the emergence of Einstein's theory of relativity. He presented his theory as a relational account of space; if there were no objects, there would be no space. Space is merely a useful abstraction.

Even those physicists who wished to retain substantival space broke with the atomist tradition of assigning virtually no properties to the void. They re-assign much of ether's responsibilities to space itself. Instead of having gravitational forces being propagated through the ether, they suggest that space is bent by mass. To explain how space can be finite and yet unbounded, they characterize space as spherical. When Edwin Hubble discovered that heavenly bodies are traveling away from each other (like sleepy flies resting on an expanding balloon), cosmologists were quick to suggest that space may be expanding. “Expanding into what?” wondered bewildered laymen, “How can space bend?”, “How can space have a shape?”, ….

Historians of science wonder whether the ether that was loudly pushed out the front door of physics is quietly returning through the back door under the guise of “space”. Quantum field theory provides especially fertile area for such speculation. Particles are created with the help of energy present in “vacuums”. To say that vacuums have energy and energy is convertible into mass, is to deny that vacuums are empty. Many physicists revel in the discovery that vacuums are far from empty.

Are these physicists using ‘vacuum’ in a new sense? If they are trying to correct laymen, then they need to couch their surprises in sentences using the ordinary sense of ‘vacuum’. Laymen are generally willing to defer to scientists when they are characterizing natural kinds. But vacuums do not seem like natural kinds such as the elements of the periodic table. They are not substances.

11. Existential aspects of nothingness

After a mystical experience in 1654, Blaise Pascal's interest in nothingness passed from its significance to science to the significance of nothingness to the human condition. Pascal thinks human beings have a unique perspective on their finitude. His Pensees is a roller coaster ride surveying the human lot. Pascal elevates us to the level of angels by exalting in our grasp of the infinite, and then runs us down below the beasts for wittingly choosing evil over goodness. From this valley of depravity Pascal takes us up again by marveling at how human beings tower over the microscopic kingdom, only to plunge us down toward insignificance by having us dwell on the vastness of space, and the immensity of eternity.

He who regards himself in this light will be afraid of himself, and observing himself sustained in the body given him by nature between those two abysses of the Infinite and Nothing, will tremble at the sight of these marvels; and I think that, as his curiosity changes into admiration, he will be more disposed to contemplate them in silence than to examine them with presumption.

For in fact what is man in nature? A Nothing in comparison with the Infinite, an All in comparison with the Nothing, a mean between nothing and everything. Since he is infinitely removed from comprehending the extremes, the end of things and their beginning are hopelessly hidden from him in an impenetrable secret; he is equally incapable of seeing the Nothing from which he was made, and the Infinite in which he is swallowed up. (Pensees sect. II, 72)

Pascal's association of nothingness with insignificance and meaninglessness presages themes popularized by existentialists after World War II.

There are other important precursors. In The Concept of Dread, Soren Kierkegaard (1844) claims that nothingness wells up into our awareness through moods and emotions. Emotions are intentional states; they are directed toward something. If angered, I am angry at something. If amused, there is something I find amusing. Free floating anxiety is often cited as a counterexample. But Kierkegaard says that in this case the emotion is directed at nothingness.

According to Heidegger, we have several motives to shy away from the significance of our emotional encounters with nothingness. They are premonitions of the nothingness of death. They echo the groundlessness of human existence.

Some have hoped that our recognition of our rootlessness would rescue meaningfulness from the chaos of nothing. But Heidegger denies us such solace.

Heidegger does think freedom is rooted in nothingness. He also says we derive our concept of logical negation from this experience of nothing. This suggests a privileged perspective for human beings. We differ from animals with respect to nothing.

12. Animal Cognition of Absences

Since Heidegger thinks that animals do not experience nothingness, he is committed to skepticism about animal reasoning involving negation. Consider the Stoic example of a dog that is following a trail. The dog reaches a fork in the road, sniffs at one road and then, without a further sniff, proceeds down the only remaining road. The Stoics took this as evidence that the dog has performed a disjunctive syllogism: “Either my quarry went down this road or that road. Sniff—he did not go down this road. Therefore, he went down that road.” Heidegger must discount this as anthropomorphism.

Many biologists and psychologists side with the Stoic's emphasis on our continuity with animals. They deny that human beings have a monopoly on nothingness. A classic anomaly for the stimulus-response behaviorist was the laboratory rat that responds to the absence of a stimulus:

One rather puzzling class of situations which elicit fear are those which consist of a lack of stimulation. Some members of this class may be special instances of novelty. An anesthetised chimpanzee could be described as a normal chimpanzee with the added novelty of ‘no movement’; solitude could be the novelty of ‘no companions’. This is not simply quibbling with words; for there is very good evidence (see Chapter 13) that the failure of a stimulus to occur at a point in time or space where it usually occurs acts like any other kind of novel stimulus. However, the intensity of the fear evoked by the sight of a dead or mutilated body is so much greater than that evoked by more ordinary forms of novelty that we perhaps ought to seek an alternative explanation of the effects of this stimulus. Fear of the dark is also difficult to account for in terms of novelty, since by the time this fear matures darkness is no less familiar than the light. (Gray 1987, 22)

These anomalies for behaviorism fill rationalists with mixed emotions. On the one hand, the experiments refute the empiricist principle that everything is learned from experience. On the other hand, the experiments also constitute a caution against over-intellectualizing absences. A correct explanation of emotional engagement with absences must be more general and cognitively less demanding than rationalists tend to presuppose. Even mosquito larvae see shadows. Perhaps the earliest form of vision was of these absences of light. So instead of being a pinnacle of intellectual sophistication, cognition of absences may be primal.

Existentialists tend to endorse the high standards assumed by rationalists. Their disagreement with the rationalists is over whether the standards are met. The existentialists are impressed by the contrast between our expectations of how reality ought to behave and how it in fact performs.

This sense of absurdity makes existentialists more accepting of paradoxes. Whereas rationalists nervously view paradoxes as a challenge to the authority of reason, existentialists greet them as opportunities to correct unrealistic hopes. Existentialists are fond of ironies and do not withdraw reflexively from the pain of contradiction. They introspect upon the inconsistency in the hope of achieving a resolution that does justice to the three dimensionality of deep philosophical problems. For instance, Heidegger is sensitive to the hazards of saying that nothing exists. Like an electrician who must twist and bend a wire to make it travel through an intricate hole, the metaphysician must twist and bend a sentence to probe deeply into the nature of being.

Rudolph Carnap thinks Heidegger's contorted sentences malfunction. To illustrate, Carnap quotes snippets from Heidegger's What is Metaphysics??:

What is to be investigated is being only and—nothing else; being alone and further—nothing; solely being, and beyond being-nothing. What about this Nothing? … Does the Nothing exist only because the Not, i.e. the Negation, exists? Or is it the other way around? Does Negation and the Not exist only because the Nothing exists? … We assert: the Nothing is prior to the Not and the Negation…. Where do we seek the Nothing? How do we find the Nothing…. We know the Nothing…. Anxiety reveals the Nothing…. That for which and because of which we were anxious, was 'really'—nothing. Indeed: the Nothing itself—as such—was present…. What about this Nothing?—The Nothing itself nothings. (Heidegger as quoted by Carnap 1932, 69)

This paragraph, especially the last sentence, became notorious as a specimen of metaphysical nonsense.

The confusion caused by Heidegger's linguistic contortions is exacerbated by separating them from their original text and herding them into a crowded pen. But there is a difference between a failure to understand and an understanding of failure. The real test for whether Heidegger's sentences are meaningless is to see what can be made of them in action, applied to the questions they were designed to answer.

Carnap also needs to consider the possibility that Heidegger's sentences are illuminating nonsense. After all, Carnap was patient with the cryptic Wittgenstein. In the Tractatus, Wittgenstein speaks like an oracle. He even characterized his carefully enumerated sentences as rungs in a ladder that must be cast away after we have made the ascent and achieved an ineffable insight. And Wittgenstein meant it, quitting philosophy to serve as a lowly schoolmaster in a rural village.

Other critics deny that What is Metaphysics? suffers from an absence of meaning. Just the reverse: they think Heidegger's passages about nothing involve too many meanings. When Heidegger connects negation with nothingness and death, these logicians are put in mind of an epitaph that toys with the principle of excluded middle: Mrs Nott was Nott Alive and is Nott Dead. According to these critics, Heidegger's writings can only be understood in the way we understand the solution to equivocal riddles:

What does a man love more than life?
Hate more than death or mortal strife?
That which contented men desire,
The poor have, the rich require,
The miser spends, the spendthrift saves,
And all men carry to their graves?

(Leemings, 1953, 201)

The answer, Nothing, can only be seen through a kaleidoscope of equivocations.

Some of the attempts to answer ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ equivocate or lapse into meaninglessness. The comedic effect of such errors is magnified by the fundamentality of the question. Error here comes off as pretentious error.

Those who ask the question ‘Why is there something rather than nothing?’ commonly get confused. But the question itself appears to survive tests for being merely a verbal confusion.

In any case, the question (or pseudo-question) has helped to hone the diagnostic tools that have been applied to it. As the issue gets shaped and re-shaped by advances in our understanding of ‘is’, quantification and explanatory standards, it becomes evident that the value of these diagnostic tools is not exhausted by their service in exposing pseudo-questions. For genuine questions become better understood when we can discriminate them from their spurious look-alikes.


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abstract objects | condemnation of 1277 | existence | existentialism | holes | Japanese Philosophy: Kyoto School | nonexistent objects | Parmenides | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes