Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Nov 10, 2001

‘Zhuangzi’ is the name of the second foundational text of the Daoist philosophical and religious tradition and the name of the putative author of this text, who early historical sources say flourished between about 350 and 300 B.C.E. As one of the two most popular Daoist texts in the Chinese tradition, the Zhuangzi has been the subject of more than sixty major East Asian commentaries since the third century C.E., some of which contain philosophically significant interpretations of the text. The most important of these are the commentary by Guo Xiang, which focuses on his understanding of Zhuangzi's philosophy of spontaneity, the commentary by Cheng Xuanying (ca. 620-670), a religious Daoist master with strong interests in emptiness theory, and commentaries by the following Sung and Ming dynasty literati scholars: Wang Pang (1042-76), Lin Xiyi (ca. 1200-73), Lo Miandao (ca. 1240-1300), and Jiao Hong (1541-1620). None of these has been fully translated into English and modern studies of them in any language are few, thus yielding a fertile field for future research. The existence of these commentaries demonstrates the great popularity of the Zhuangzi among Chinese literati who saw within it support for a withdrawal from a life of social and political service into a private life of reclusion and self-cultivation. If Confucianism came to stand for the foundational philosophy of this ethos of self-sacrifice, the Daoism of the Zhuangzi came to stand for its opposite, the escape from societal pressure into an individual path of freedom. While thus important to literati scholars, the work was also significant for Daoist religious practitioners who often took ideas and themes from it for their meditation practice, for example Sima Chengzhen's ‘Treatise on Sitting and Forgetting’ (ca. 660 C.E.) (Kohn 1987).

1. Provisos Concerning the Text

What we know of the philosophy of Zhuangzi comes primarily from this work but readers of translations of the received recension (Watson, Graham 1981, Mair 1998) should be aware of the following provisos.

First, the received recension contains thirty-three chapters and is not the original recension of the text. Guo Xiang (d. 312 C.E.) revised a fifty-two chapter original recension first listed in Imperial bibliographies circa 110 C.E. by removing material he thought was superstitious and generally not of philosophical interest to his literati sensibilities. He appended a philosophical commentary to the text that became famous and within four centuries his shorter and snappier expurgated recension became the only one known. This recension is traditionally divided into three sections: ‘Inner Chapters’ (1-7), ‘Outer Chapters’ (8-22), ‘Miscellaneous Chapters’ (23-33). This division is quite old and is likely to have been part of the original recension.

Second, the Zhuangzi text is clearly not the work of a single author and it is difficult to affix definitive authorship to any one person. At the very least there are five authorial voices best summarized by A.C. Graham: the historical Zhuangzi, later followers of Zhuangzi, followers influenced by the individualist thinker Yang Zhu, a ‘Primitivist’ Daoist author whose ideas are akin to those of the Daode jing, and the ‘Syncretist’ Daoist authors who Graham thinks compiled the first recension of the text (Graham 1979).

While it is true that many of the philosophical insights for which this work has become renowned in China and more recently in the West are found in the ‘Inner Chapters’ that have traditionally been ascribed to the historical Zhuangzi, we cannot fully understand these ideas and their significance without grasping how they relate to the entire thirty-three chapter text and the variety of ideas it contains. In this entry we shall accept the convention that a historical Zhuangzi authored most of the seven ‘Inner chapters’ while noting that there have been questions about this attribution that are not sufficient to overturn this traditional belief.

2. The Philosophy of the Inner Chapters

The Zhuangzi has become renowned for a series of original insights into human nature and the nature of the cosmos and many of these are found in the ‘Inner chapters.’ These insights are communicated in a variety of literary styles: didactic narratives, poetry, and very short prose essays. Like its famous companion, the Daode jing, the Zhuangzi is grounded in the complementary ideas of Dao and De. Dao, the ‘Way,’ is an ineffable monistic principle that infuses and guides the spontaneous processes of all phenomena; De, ‘Inner Power,’ is the realized manifestation of this Way within all phenomena. Despite sharing these foundational ideas, these two Daoist works discuss them very differently. The Daode jing often presents the characteristics and features of the Way in a direct discursive analysis (e.g., DDJ 1: "The Way that can be told of is not the Constant Way"). On the other hand, the Zhuangzi often approaches the Way indirectly through narratives and poetry. Witness the following rhetorical pointing to the Way:

Heaven turns circles, yes!
Earth sits firm, yes!
Sun and Moon vie for a place, yes!
Whose is the bow that shoots them?
Whose is the net that holds them?
Who is it sits with nothing to do and gives them the push that sends them away?

(Graham 1981, p. 49; all following translations based on this work)

Or consider this rumination on epistemological relativity that ends with a vivid pointing to the Way:

What is It is also Other, what is Other is also It. There they say, "this is true and that is false" from one point of view; here we say, "this is true and that is false" from another point of view. Are there really It and Other? Or really no It and Other. Where neither It nor Other finds its opposite is called the axis of the Way. When once the axis is found at the center of the circle there is no limit to responding with either, on the one hand no limit to what is it, on the other no limit to what is not.... (Graham, p. 53, modified)

This questioning of the certainty of knowledge from any normal human viewpoint is another hallmark of the ‘Inner chapters,’ as is the considerable degree of humor and irony with which the most profound insights into the cosmos are presented. This is true as well for Zhuangzi's presentation of Inner Power, which is done through narratives in which the most highly evolved human beings in terms of realizing this power are skilled butchers (see chapter 3) and criminals punished by mutilation (see chapter 5). This flaunting of societal prejudices is another way in which Zhuangzi challenges entrenched beliefs and demonstrates the breathtaking freedom from fixed conventions that has delighted readers for two millennia.

The Zhuangzi of the ‘Inner Chapters’ is also known for a thorough questioning of the canons, methods, and value of discursive reason and logic as practiced by contemporary thinkers in the traditions of the Mohists, Confucians, and Terminologists (ming jia). He is particularly critical of assumptions such as the one to one correspondence between words and the objects to which they refer that is an offshoot of the Confucian doctrine of the rectification of names. He demonstrates that naming is purely arbitrary and conventional and cannot be used to give any objective certainty about the world. Furthermore no matter how sophisticated the logic involved, no argument can establish objective truths because all knowing remains confined to the standpoint of the knower:

Gaptooth put a question to Wang Ni: "Would you know something which all things agreed is true?" "How would I know that?" he replied. "Would you know what you did not know?" "How would I know that?" he replied again. "Then does no thing know anything?" "How would I know that?" he replied again. He then continued, "however, let me try to put this in words: how do I know that what I call knowing is not ignorance? How do I know that what I call ignorance is not knowing? ... Gibbons are sought by baboons as mates, elaphures like the company of deer, loaches play with fish. Maoqiang and Lady Li were beautiful in the eyes of men but when the fish saw them they plunged into the deep and when the birds saw them they flew away. Which of these four knows what is truly beautiful in the world? In my judgment, the principles of Humaneness and Rightness, the paths of True and False are inextricably confused: how could I know how to discriminate between them?" (Graham, p. 58, mod.)

Inspired by such ideas -- which are principally located in the second chapter of the Zhuangzi, entitled ‘Discourse on Seeing all things as Equal’ (Qiwu lun) -- Western comparative philosophers during the past two decades have taken a considerable interest in Zhuangzi and have engaged in spirited debate about whether he can be classified as a skeptic, a relativist, or a perspectivist. For example, Hansen argues that Zhuangzi espouses a ‘perspectival relativism,’ that shows that all discrimination and classification are relative to some changeable context of judgment (Hansen 1983). Relative judgments yield relative knowledge and so there are no standpoints from which anything can be known to be objectively true. Raphals finds that in this chapter Zhuangzi employs skeptical methods but not skeptical doctrines (Raphals 1996). This is because while denying the objectivity of common forms of knowledge (‘small knowledge’ in the text) Zhuangzi does acknowledge the existence of a greater form of knowledge (‘illumination’) and hence does not advance a ‘true skepticism.’ Ivanhoe argues that Zhuangzi was neither a sense skeptic nor an ethical skeptic, but that he definitely was both an epistemological skeptic about intellectual (in contrast to intuitive) knowledge and a language skeptic who doubted distinctions between right and wrong and the ability of words to express the Way (Ivanhoe 1993).

Yearley and Roth maintain that in addition to demonstrating elements of skepticism and relativism, that Zhuangzi was also a mystic. Yearley argues for an ‘intraworldly mysticism’ in which the goal is not union with some unchanging monistic principle but instead full participation in the natural world (Yearley 1983). Roth sees a ‘bimodal’ mystical experience in Zhuangzi that shows evidence for Stace's categories of introvertive and extrovertive mysticm (Roth 2000). He argues that the greater form of knowledge seen by Raphals and the acceptance of intuitive knowledge seen by Ivanhoe derive from a firm grounding in a meditative practice attested to in both the Zhuangzi and in many other sources of early Daoism. It is this practice that Roth calls ‘inner cultivation’ (Roth 1999). Simply put, it involves sitting quietly and systematically circulating the breath until mind and body become tranquil and the contents of consciousness gradually empty. Taken to its ultimate levels, this apophatic practice gives the adept a direct experience of the Way. In the ‘Inner chapters’ Zhuangzi talks of meditation in two famous narratives, one in which, ironically, his spokesman is the uncontemplative Confucius who teaches his favorite disciple Yan Hui about a technique he calls ‘the fasting of the mind,’ and the other in which the tables are turned and Yan teaches Confucius about ‘sitting and forgetting.’ In the former Confucius gives the following instructions:

...Unify your attention. Do not listen with the ears, listen with the mind. Do not listen with the mind but listen with the vital breath (qi). The ears only listen to sounds. The mind is only aware of its objects. But to focus on the vital breath is to be empty and await the arising of objects. It is only the Way that settles in emptiness. Emptiness is the fasting of the mind. (compare Graham, 68)

In the latter, Yan teaches Confucius:

I let organs and members drop away, dismiss hearing and eyesight, part from the body and expel knowledge, and merge with the Great Pervader. This is what I mean by ‘just sit and forget.’ (Graham, 92 mod.)

Both passages attest to this apophatic inner cultivation practice in which all normal perceptions and thoughts are removed from consciousness and one eventually achieves union with the Way (the ‘Great Pervader’). This yields what Stace has called an ‘introvertive mystical experience’ (Stace, 1960) Yet for Zhuangzi this experience, although profound, is not the ultimate goal. Speaking metaphorically, through Confucius, he says: ‘to stop making footprints is easy but it is difficult to walk without touching the ground.’(comp. Graham 69). This type of ungrounded ‘walking’ has a significant epistemological dimension: a distinctive mode of cognition that Zhuangzi refers to as ‘flowing’ (yin-shi: literally ‘to affirm by following along’) in opposition to the ‘fixed’ mode of cognition (wei-shi: literally ‘to affirm by forcing’) that is bound to one individual perspective. Zhuangzi playfully contrasts these modes in the following famous story:

A monkey keeper handing out nuts said, "Three every morning and four every evening." The monkeys were all in a rage. "All right," he said, "four every morning and three every evening." The monkeys were all delighted. Without anything being missed out either in name or in substance, their pleasure and anger were put to use: his too was a flowing cognition (yin-shi). This is why the sage smoothes things out with his flowing categories and stays at the point of rest on the Potter's Wheel of Heaven... (Graham, 54 mod.)

The monkeys exemplify the fixed mode of cognition in their rigid attachment to one and only one way of seeing the seven nuts. In this they symbolize all the contemporary intellectual traditions -- Confucians, Mohists, Terminologists -- that were arguing the truth of their individual positions against all others. The keeper is able to shift his conceptual categories to harmonize with those of the monkeys because he is free of attachment to any one particular way of seeing the nuts. His is a flowing cognition that adapts spontaneously to the situation, an ‘illumined’(ming) awareness that exhibits an intuitive knowledge of how to act without even knowing that it is acting. Zhuangzi also calls this ‘illuminating things with the light of heaven.’ For him, ‘heaven’ stands for the spontaneous and intuitive aspect of our being that emerge when someone is grounded in the empty Way.

Zhuangzi further makes clear that abandonment of fixed cognition is concomitant with abandonment of attachment to the self: "Without an Other there is no Self; without Self, no choosing one thing rather than another." (Graham, 51) That is, if you lose the distinction between self and other then you lose the self and with it, any bias towards choosing one thing rather than another: "No thing is not ‘Other;’ no thing is not ‘It.’ If you treat yourself too as ‘Other,’ they do not appear. If you know of yourself you know of them" (Graham, 52). That is, in this situation It and Other do not appear because ‘treating yourself as Other’ involves abandoning attachment to your self -- in other words having the same degree of attachment to Self as you do to Other. This lack of self-attachment is an essential characteristic of the free and spontaneously functioning consciousness of Zhuangzi's ‘flowing cognition.’ That this flowing mode, which is similar to Yearley's ‘intraworldly mysticism’ and which Roth asserts is a type of ‘extrovertive mysticism,’ develops from a union with the Way is articulated in the following passage from the ‘Discourse on Seeing all things as Equal’:

If being ‘so’ is inherent in a thing ... then from no perspective would it not be ‘so’ ... . Therefore when a fixed cognition picks out a stalk from a pillar, a hag from beautiful Xishi, things however peculiar and incongruous, the Way pervades and unifies them (tong wei yi). As they divide they develop, as they develop they dissolve. All things whether developing or dissolving revert to being pervaded and unified. Only those who penetrate this know how to pervade and unify things. Fixed cognition they do not use, but find lodging places in daily life. It is in daily life that they make use of this perspective. It is in making use of this perspective that they pervade things. It is in pervading things that they attain it. And when they attain it they are almost there. ‘Flowing cognition’ comes to an end. It ends and when it does, that of which we do not know what is ‘so’ of it, we call ‘the Way.’ (Graham, 53-4 mod.)

Here Zhuangzi argues that there are no perspectives from which a thing is always ‘so,’ is always true. Common fixed cognition clearly differentiates things such as a stalk and a pillar and so on and it simultaneously makes preferences based on these perceptual distinctions. However it is only the Way that can pervade these things and unify them. That is, it is the one and only perspective from which all things are seen just as they are, without bias and without preference, from which ‘all things are seen to be equal.’ It is just this kind of seeing that is the essential defining characteristic of the ‘great knowledge’ or ‘illumination’ of the ‘flowing cognition’ that is developed by those rare sages who can penetrate through ‘fixed cognition’ and who can, as the Way does, ‘pervade and unify’ all things.

Using this ability, sages find temporary ‘lodging-places,’ i.e. viewpoints to which they are completely unattached within daily life. Yet even this ‘flowing cognition’ does eventually rest on something more profound: it comes to an end in the experience of union with the Way, described here as ‘that of which we do not know what is so.’ Knowing what is ‘so’ of something implies knowing its essential truth as an object of cognition and hence from the dualistic perspective of Self and Other. Yet the Way can never be known as an object: it can only be realized when the distinction between Self and Other dissolves in the introvertive mystical experience of uniting with the Way. Thus the extrovertive mystical experience of ‘pervading and unifying’ depends on the introvertive mystical experience of union referred to elsewhere in chapter six as ‘merging with the Great Pervader’ (tong yu datong). Once one temporarily loses the Self in this union and then returns to the everyday dualistic world one is no longer attached to Self. ‘Flowing cognition’ arises from this detachment.

Hence Zhuangzi's renowned questioning of logic and his skepticism and relativism are based upon this shift from fixed cognition to flowing cognition, from self-centered perspective to ‘Way-centered’ perspective. His epistemological critique is thus applied to knowledge derived from ‘fixed cognition.’ ‘Flowing cognition’ is exempted from this critique because it is this continually changing ‘Way-centered’ position from which the critique is made.

These complementary mystical experiences (‘merging with the Great Pervader’ and pervading and unifying using flowing cognition) are critical for the understanding of the other important philosophical themes for which the Zhuangzi is renowned. Naturalness and spontaneity arise directly from the ‘flowing cognition’ that is free of attachment to any one perspective. When sages act from this mode they can respond without self-consciousness to whatever situation in which they find themselves. Yet their spontaneity is grounded not in their individual separate selves but rather in the Way; we might say they have moved from a ‘self-centered’ perspective to a ‘Way-centered’ perspective. Thus living at the ‘axis of the Way’ they are able to blend the perspectives of Heaven and of human beings:

The Realized Ones (zhenren) ... were one with what they liked and one with what they disliked, one when they were one and one when they were not one. When one, they were of Heaven's faction and when not one they were of the human faction. Someone in whom neither Heaven nor human is victor over the other, this is what is meant by ‘Realized Ones.’ (Graham p. 85 mod.)

This freedom from attachment to any individual perspective that characterizes Zhuangzi's ‘flowing cognition’ also leads to the freedom from fear of death and acceptance of it as part of the natural processes of life that is another of the famous themes of this work. In this narrative from chapter six a dying Daoist master addresses his friends:

A child that has father and mother goes east and west, north and south, and has only their commands to obey. For humans the Yin and Yang are more than father and mother. As something other than me approaches, I am dying; if I were to refuse to listen it would be defiance on my part so how can I blame it? That Vast Clod of Soil (the Way) loaded me with a body, had me toiling through a life, eased me with old age, rests me with death. Therefore that I found it good to live is the very reason that I find it good to die. If today a master sword smith were smelting metal and the metal should jump up and say "I insist on being made into an Excalibur," the sword smith would surely think it metal with a curse on it. If now having once happened on the shape of a human being I were to say, "I'll be a human, nothing but a human," that which fashions and transforms us would surely think me a baleful sort of person. Now if once and for all I think of heaven and earth as a vast foundry and the fashioner and transformer as a master smith, wherever I am going why should I object? ... (Graham 88-9 mod.)

3. The Philosophy of the Outer and Miscellaneous Chapters

3.1 The Disciples of Zhuangzi

With writings as profound and vibrant as these the historical Zhuangzi must have had quite a devoted group of followers and it is to them -- in all likelihood -- that we owe both the transmission of his ideas beyond his lifetime and at least six chapters of new material, much of it consisting of narratives written in the style of the ‘Inner chapters’ but generally not demonstrating the same creativity and rhetorical skill. Zhuangzi is a figure in about one quarter of these narratives, which were probably based on stories told by his immediate disciples and written down after his death. The chapters in this section, 17-22, are almost completely devoid of the philosophical essays, jottings, or even the diatribes we find in the first third of the book. Yet they contain some of the most famous narratives in the entire text.

The ‘autumn floods’ passage that dominates chapter 17 continues the theme of the relativity of different perspectives and the wholeness of the Way-centered perspective. This epistemological relativity is also the theme of the well-known dialogue between Zhuangzi and his Terminologist friend and debating rival Huishi while strolling over the Hao River Bridge found in this chapter. Chapter 18, ‘Complete Happiness,’ centers around the theme of the acceptance of death as part of the natural processes of Heaven and Earth and contains the famous narrative about Huishi's visit to Zhuangzi after the death of the latter's wife. Chapter 19 is perhaps the most famous of this grouping as it contains a series of ‘skill’ or ‘knack’ passages that feature heroes who can be seen as masters of the flowing mode of cognition emphasized in the ‘Inner chapters.’ These include the cicada-catching hunchback, the swimmer at Spinebridge Falls, and the bellstand carver who fasts for seven days before undertaking his task, thus recalling the mind-fasting advice Confucius gave to Yan Hui in chapter 4. Chapter 20 contains a group of narratives loosely organized around the theme of uselessness first presented in chapters 1 and 4. Only things that are not of use to anyone else are able to flourish and attain their full potential. Chapter 21 is filled with stories featuring exemplars of self-cultivation who have achieved the utmost inner power. The famous ‘knowledge wanders north’ narrative that begins chapter 22 contains insights on the limitations of the fixed mode of cognition to comprehend the Way. Filled with ideas from Daode jing and with references to breath meditation, it also contains the famous dialogue in which Zhuangzi details where the Way can be found.

Unlike the ‘Inner chapters’ that contain no references to Lao Tzu the man and to the text of the Daode jing, many of these chapters show an awareness of the Daode jing by their use of ideas and quotations from this text. This indicates that they were most likely written after this work began widely circulating in China after in about 260 B.C. E. To the extent that they recast material from the ‘Inner chapters’ in new narrative frameworks and frequently see it in light of ideas from the Daode jing, these chapters represent a unique blending of the two intellectually foundational sources of early Daoism.

The first group of the ‘Miscellaneous chapters,’ 23-27, and chapter 32 are much more heterogeneous in their content. They appear to contain more writings of the followers of Zhuangzi into which are interspersed passages from the other major authorial voices in the complete work, mostly the Zhuangzi of the ‘Inner chapters,’ the Primitivist, and, on occasion, the Syncretist. Given this lack of coherence, these ‘Miscellaneous chapters’ could contain material from some of the nineteen chapters that Guo Xiang deleted from the original recension of the text. In these chapters Zhuangzi's followers continue their engagement with their master's teachings from the ‘Inner chapters’ and attempt to integrate it with the teachings of the Daode jing now often attributed in narratives to Lao Dan, the shadowy fifth-century B.C.E. figure to whom this text began to be attributed after about 250 B.C.E. Perhaps the most interesting narrative in this grouping is the one that constitutes almost the entirety of chapter 23. In it the character Nanguo Chu goes on a quest for mystical knowledge and ends up being instructed by Lao Dan in a meditative practice that blends together ideas from the ‘Inner chapters,’ the Daode jing, and other sources of ‘inner cultivation’ such as Guanzi's ‘Inward Training’ (Neiye) text (Roth 1999). This narrative, as well as several others in this group of chapters from the disciples of Zhuangzi, indicates that such meditation practices continued to be as central to the followers of Zhuangzi as they were to their teacher himself.

3.2 The Yangist Chapters

Chapters 28-31 of the received recension of the Zhuangzi were the first to be perceived as so different from the philosophy of the renowned ‘Inner Chapters’ that they were thought to be the work of an entirely different intellectual lineage. Indeed, these chapters are now seen to be similar in thought to five essays from the first two chapters of the compendium Lüshi chunqiu (240 B.C.E.) that consitute the only surviving works of the long-lost tradition of the philosopher Yang Zhu. Graham regards these Zhuangzi chapters themselves as Yangist while Liu Xiaogan links them to the ‘Primitivist’ material. Close examination reveals many common philosophical themes between these two groups of chapters but also reveals some key differences as well, as we shall see.

Yang Zhu was a fourth century B.C.E. contemporary of Mencius who engendered great antipathy in this Confucian thinker for suggesting that the basic tendencies of human nature were not what we might call ‘other-regarding.’ Mencius condemned Yang for being so egotistical as to be unwilling to sacrifice even a single hair in order to benefit the state (Mencius 7A26; Lau, p. 275). However if we are to base our understanding of Yang's doctrines on these two surviving sources, a much more complex and interesting picture of his philosophy emerges.

Yang Zhu may have been the first Chinese philosopher to speak of the concept of human nature (xing), and the parameters for all early Chinese discussions of this concept seem to have been established by Yang and Mencius. In brief, human nature is given to us by Heaven, the power responsible for everything in life beyond human control. The early Chinese conceived of two major aspects of our lives that fall into this category: ming (fate, destiny), the various things that occur as the result of agencies other than ourselves and xing (nature), the sum total of our genetic inheritance both as a species and as unique individual members of it. According to Graham and Ames, human nature in early China is conceived as totally dynamic, in contrast to the implicit static basis of human nature we find in the West (Graham 1967, Ames 1991). The Chinese concept of human nature can be best understood as referring to the spontaneous tendencies that an individual has from birth that govern its development as a particular individual within a species and which also act as forces in its daily life. Thus this concept implies both the potential to develop in a certain way and the spontaneous tendencies for this development and for certain characteristic types of activities. We might call the former tendencies ‘genetic’ and the latter tendencies ‘instinctive.’ Mencius argued that the essential goodness of human nature rested in the spontaneous tendencies to act selflessly and respectfully, tendencies that persist throughout the lifetime of an individual even if left undeveloped. In other words, it is a basic human instinct to act selflessly. For him the purpose of self-cultivation was to nurture these spontaneous instinctive tendencies until they blossomed into complete ethical virtues. The Yangist challenge to the social emphasis of the Confucians consisted in the primacy they placed on the maintenance of the individual life and the fact that they supported this mode of living with the theory that to act in this fashion was to nourish the nature that we receive from Heaven. Since Confucians placed a high value on the sanctions and approvals of Heaven, it was incumbent upon them to argue for a different vision of human nature.

The single most basic of the spontaneous tendencies of human nature for the Yangists is longevity. They argued that human beings tend to live long if they keep themselves from being disturbed by the ‘external things’ of this world such as fame and profit. The second important aspect of human nature is the desire of the five sense faculties (eye, ear, nose, tongue, skin) for sense-objects. It is the senses' desire for their objects that in a fundamental way helps to maintain the health and the development of the organism, thus enabling it to realize its inherent tendency for longevity. However the senses themselves need to be regulated and limited to only the ‘suitable’ amount of stimulation. Over-stimulation causes the senses to be impaired and eventually damaged. Thus there is a suitable amount of stimulation that is conducive to the health and development of the human organism and that suitable amount must be determined by Sages; the senses on their own do not have the ability to do this. Self-cultivation for the Yangists therefore consists of nourishing one's inherent nature by strictly limiting sense stimulation to the appropriate degree needed to maintain health and vitality. One of their principal practices was to prevent the loss of one's finite supply of jing (essential vital energy), which is lost due to over-stimulation of the senses. The Yangists shared an understanding of how the human organism functioned with the thinkers of the ‘inner cultivation’ tradition and with early Chinese medical philosophers and practitioners who envisioned a body-mind complex made up of various systems of qi (vital energy). It is also worth noting that, in keeping with their dynamic concept of human nature, the Yangists included the senses' desire for sense objects in it and not the senses themselves, which would imply a static basis.

Implicit in the Yangist authors' inclusion of longevity within human nature is the understanding that the various systems of vital energy that constitute a living organism tend to function harmoniously if left unimpaired. Nurturing the nature by limiting the senses to their appropriate degree of stimulation and avoiding activities that would damage the organism involve assisting in this inherent tendency for harmony. Human beings, as well as all things in the world, cohere and function if undamaged; they do not fall apart. The individual microcosm, just as the universal macrocosm, is not random and chaotic. It functions according to certain basic laws and patterns. To understand them, and to live according to them, to understand the spontaneous tendencies of human nature and to nurture them by conscious choice, is the basis of the Yangist method of self-cultivation.

Given their concept of human nature and their resultant ideas about self-cultivation, and their emphasis on avoiding placing oneself in jeopardy for fame and profit, it is not surprising that the Yangists do not proffer an elaborate social and political philosophy. "The most genuine in the Way is for supporting one's own person ..." reads Zhuangzi 28, (‘Yielding the Throne’), "its left-overs are for running a state, its discards are for ruling the empire. Seen from this viewpoint, the achievements of emperors and kings are the left-over deeds of the sage, they are not the means by which he keeps his person whole and nurtures life." (Graham, p. 227) In chapter 29 of Zhuangzi (‘Robber Zhi’) we find the dictum: ‘If you can't look after yourself, you can't look after others.’ (Graham, p. 238) In the ‘Valuing Life’ essay of the Lüshi chunqiu, we read, "only those who would not impair their natures are able to be entrusted with ruling the empire" (Riegel/Knoblock p. 80, mod.). A very similar idea is expressed in chapter 13 of the Daode jing: "Hence he who values his body more than dominion over the empire can be entrusted with the empire." (Lau 1982, p. 19) This seems to imply that such a ruler would treat others as carefully as he treats himself, although the ethical implications of putting oneself first for government are never worked out in the surviving Yangist documents.

What we do find in the Yangist-oriented chapters of the Zhuangzi are many stories in which the concern for not impairing one's nature leads people to either resign the throne, or to never accept public office. The life of the recluse is commended, but the authors are sharply critical of those moralists who would rather kill themselves than participate in government. The Yangist political philosophy is clear: do not seek after fame, wealth, and power, all of which are far beyond your essential needs. Never do anything to impair your inherent tendency to live a long and fulfilling life. To know this is to differentiate the important from the unimportant, to understand, in the words of the ‘Giving Weight to the Self’ essay in Book 1 of the Lüshi chunqiu, ‘the essentials of our nature and destiny’ (xingming zhi qing) Riegel/Knoblock, pp. 67-68 mod.) Only those who can do this are truly fit to govern.

Structurally, the four Yangist-oriented chapters of the Zhuangzi are each unique. Chapter 28 is a collection of eighteen narratives, ten of which are found in slightly varying forms dispersed throughout the Lüshi chunqiu. Chapter 29 contains only three narratives, including the famous long one in which Robber Zhi berates Confucius, accusing him of practicing a way that ‘is a crazy obsession, a thing of deception, trickery, vanity, and falsehood [that] will not serve to keep the genuine in us intact...’(Graham, 239). Chapter 30 consists of one short narrative in which Zhuangzi demonstrates the inferiority of sword fighting. Chapter 31 contains a dialogue between Confucius and a hermit known as the ‘Old Fisherman,’ who teaches him that the art of self-cultivation lies in ‘guarding the genuine within you.’ He defines ‘the genuine’ as the spontaneous expression of emotions. This concept of ‘guarding the genuine’ resonates most closely with the central theme of the rest of the text, that of cultivating the flowing mode of cognition. However, there are virtually no mystical elements in these Yangist chapters and this both distinguishes them from the remainder of the Zhuangzi and prevents them from being classified as ‘Daoist.’ Yet in their discussion of human nature, their attacks on the Confucians and their praise of ancient primitive Utopias, they so much echo ideas from the Primitivist chapters that scholars such as Liu Xiaogan conclude they belong to the same intellectual tradition.

3.3 The Primitivist Chapters

There are three chapters (8-10) and half of a fourth (11) that present such a consistent literary structure, technical terminology, and written style that Graham maintains them to be the work of a single author, one who espouses a viewpoint similar to that found in the Daode jing differing principally in that it is not addressed to the ruler. To these Roth would add chapter 16, ‘Menders of Nature,’ when modified by the removal of a short Syncretist gloss that has previously prevented scholars from linking it with the others (Roth 2002). Because of their advocacy of a return to a government and social organization similar to that found in primitive tribal Utopias, Graham has labeled these chapters as ‘Primitivist.’ While similar in their Utopian vision, critique of the Confucians, and their focus on a theory of human nature to the Yangist-oriented chapters, they depart from them in containing key elements of mystical philosophy such as a cosmology of the Way and Inner power and reference to methods of ‘inner cultivation.’ In addition, rather than totally eschewing political philosophy, they advocate a government by Non-action similar to that found in the Daode jing. These chapters are important because they contain the first discussion of human nature in the entire Daoist tradition and they seem to define it by building on the Yangist conceptions of it.

Like the Yangists, the Primitivists commend, and, in ‘Menders of Nature,’ even defend the life of the recluse who withdraws from political involvement. Both label their Utopias ages ‘when Inner Power was at its utmost,’ and Robber Zhi, the Yangist critic of Confucius in chapter 29 is a somewhat sympathetic, if ironic, figure in the chapter 10, ‘Rifling Trunks.’ Like the Yangists, the Primitivists recognize the two complementary aspects of human nature, both the ‘genetic’ tendencies that determine the characteristic course of development of members of a given species and the spontaneous ‘instinctive’ tendencies that arise within the daily activity of individual members of said species. Both agree that this nature is not the actual physical attributes (such as horses hooves for the Primitivist, or the sense organs for both), but rather the tendencies for them to develop in a species-characteristic way and to function spontaneously without additional help. Both believe that these tendencies can be nurtured or can be interfered with, and both maintain that to avoid interfering with them is to understand the ‘essentials of our nature and destiny,’ which is mentioned once in the Yangist-oriented chapters and eight times in the Primitivist chapters. If we take the word ‘destiny’ to refer to one's allotted years, we might argue that the Primitivists as well, at least tacitly accept longevity as an attribute of human nature. To this extent there is a Yangist basis for the Taoist Primitivists. However there are also substantial differences.

As we have seen, the Yangist inclusion of longevity in human nature contains an implicit understanding that the physiological systems that constitute the individual organism tend to function spontaneously and harmoniously. This understanding is made explicit by the Primitivists; indeed, the inherent spontaneous activity of the individual becomes one of the cornerstones of their unique concept of human nature. It is so important that it replaces the Yangist longevity as the overall goal of self-cultivation and the raison d'etre for human existence. In contrast to the Yangists, the Primitivists maintain that the natural tendency of the senses is not merely to desire sense-objects, but, rather, to perceive them clearly. When the senses are allowed to operate unimpeded by the culturally established normative categories (the Five Tastes, the Five Colors, the Five Tones, and so on) and they hence operate spontaneously, they will clearly grasp their objects. These cultural norms insert an element of bias and inclination into the perceptual process thereby leading perception astray. In an analogous manner, Confucian ethical norms of humaneness and rightness, inject ‘inclinations and aversions’ into the spontaneous functioning of the mind and disrupt its inherent tendency to operate in an unbiased and harmonious fashion. As the author of ‘Menders of Nature’ succinctly states: "If someone else lays down the direction for you you blinker your Inner Power." (Graham, p. 171, mod.). For the Primitivists, Inner Power is simply allowing the spontaneous tendencies of one's nature to operate without interference. It is our nature for them to do so; culture, with the self-consciousness it forces on human beings, disrupts and damages it. As we read in chapter 8, ‘Webbed Toes,’:

To depend on the carpenter's curve and line, compasses, L-square, to straighten you out, is to pare away your nature; to depend on cords, knots, glue, lacquer, to hold you together, is to violate your Inner Power; and to bow and crouch for Rituals and Music, and smirk and simper over Humaneness and Rightness, in order to soothe the hearts of the world, is to lose the constant in you. There is such as thing as constancy in the world.... Thus everything in the world springs into life without knowing how it is born, attains unthinkingly without knowing how it attains. Hence the present is no different from the past, and nothing can be missing from its place. (Graham, p. 201, mod.)

That which is the constant in the world for the Primitivists, is its tendency for spontaneous and harmonious activity. In human beings this is inherent in their very natures. The author of ‘Menders of Nature,’ in harkening back to an earlier time when people "lived in the midst of the merged and featureless, and found tranquility and mildness with those of their own time..." says, "At this era no one took any (deliberate) action and things were constantly so of themselves." (Graham, p. 171, mod.) This reiterates two important ideas in the Daode jing, Non-action (wu-wei) and ‘so-ness’ or spontaneity (ziran). The former refers to acting without egotism and self-consciousness. The latter refers to allowing things to be just as they naturally are. This theme of the constancy in human nature is central to the Primitivist vision of an ideal society. It is fully described in chapter 9, ‘Horses Hooves:’

The people have a nature that is constant:
By their weaving clothed, by their ploughing fed-
This is called ‘sharing Inner Power’.
In oneness and without faction:
The name for it is ‘free as the air’.

Therefore, in the age when Inner Power was at its utmost....
people lived in sameness with birds and beasts, side by side as fellow clansmen with the myriad creatures; how would they know a gentleman from a knave?

In sameness, knowing nothing!
Not parted from their Inner Power.
In sameness, desiring nothing!-
Call it "the simple and unhewn."

In the simple and unhewn the nature of the people is found. (Graham pp. 204-5, mod.)

The ‘simple’ (so) and the ‘unhewn’ (pu) are important ideas in the Daode jing wherein to be ‘simple’ mean to be unselfish (DDJ 19) and to be ‘unhewn’ means to be without desires (DDJ 19, 38) The definitions in ‘Horses Hooves’ are similar, the only difference being that to be simple means ‘knowing nothing.’ Both words suggest a state of mind totally devoid of self-consciousness, a state of mind in which people act spontaneously and without self-reflection. It is a state of mind that is reminiscent of the ‘flowing cognition’ of the ‘Inner chapters.’ For the Primitivists, it is human nature to attain this state of mind when people are left on their own, when the institutions of culture do not interfere with their spontaneous tendencies. To attain this state is to realize your Inner Power. Throughout their writings the Primitivists harken back to an earlier Utopian age when people lived in selfless harmony with one another and with all things in the world and when the Way and Inner Power were fully realized. The Confucian sage-rulers, who established cultural norms and thereby forced people to think about how to attain them, destroyed this harmony and made it much more difficult for people to attain the ‘simple and unhewn’ state of mind. However by doing away with the sages and their cultural norms we can return to a primitive Utopia: ‘Utterly demolish the laws of the sages throughout the world, and for the first time it will be possible to sort out and discuss things with people...cast away Humaneness and Rightness, and at last Inner Power throughout the world will be the same from its profoundest depths.’ (Graham, 208-9, mod.) Then society can be governed by a ruler who learns how to practice Non-action. In chapter 11, ‘To Locate and Circumscribe,’ we read:

So if the gentleman is left with no choice but to preside over the world, his best policy is Non-action. Only by Non-action will he find security in the essentials of his nature and destiny. So if you value regard for you own person more than governing the world, you are fit to be entrusted with the world; if you love the care of your own person more than governing the world, you deserve to have the world delivered to you. If then a gentleman does prove able not to dislocate his Five Spheres [of vital energy] and not to stretch his eyesight and hearing, then sitting as still as a corpse he will look majestic as a dragon, from the silence of the abyss he will speak with a voice of thunder, he will move like a spirit and veer like Heaven, he will be relaxed and take no action.... (Graham, p. 212, mod.)

So if forced to rule the Primitivist author here follows the dictum of the Daode jing to take no action, that is, to act effortlessly, not interfering with your spontaneous response. By so acting you can ‘locate and circumscribe’ your nature by identifying and nurturing its spontaneous tendencies and preventing it from being led astray by Confucian cultural norms. The Primitivist here echoes the Yangists by arguing that to do this rulers must place their own self-cultivation first. However unlike the Yangists who maintain that personal longevity is the goal and purpose of human existence, the Primitivists maintains that returning to the ‘simple and unhewn’ unselfconscious mode of experience is this goal. In order to accomplish this rulers must practice inner cultivation and through this attain the profound tranquility and silence needed to find ‘security in the essentials of nature and destiny.’

Thus the Primitivist authors in the Zhuangzi extend the definition of human nature past that of the Yangists by arguing that it consists not simply of the desire of the senses for sense-objects and the tendency for the biological systems these senses support to function harmoniously but of the tendency of these senses to spontaneously function clearly and for people to attain the ‘simple and unhewn’ unself-conscious state of mind. In other words, it is our most basic tendency to be able to experience the flowing mode of cognition so often advocated in the ‘Inner chapters.’ It is this that links these chapters most strongly with the remainder of the Zhuangzi.

3.4 The Syncretist Chapters

The final stratum of the Zhuangzi contains a distinctive and largely consistent viewpoint that connects with the rest of the text and with a larger philosophical context. It is contained in three complete essays: 1. the first two-thirds of chapter 13, ‘The Way of Heaven;’ 2. chapter 15 ‘Inveterate Ideas,’ and 3.the final chapter, 33, ‘Below in the Empire,’ as well as in narratives that play key roles in chapters 12 and 14. This material shares a common cosmology of the Way and interest in inner cultivation that we have seen in most of the rest of the text but veers in a different direction in its political thought, advocating a hierarchical social and political structure that incorporates the best ideas of other earlier intellectual lineages within a Daoist cosmological framework. However it agrees with the Primitivist idea that government should be led by a sage enlightened through inner cultivation techniques. In its general intellectual viewpoint it exemplifies many of the characteristics of the Daoist tradition that were first enunciated by the Han dynasty historian, Sima Tan (d. 110 B.C.E.), the man who coined the very term ‘Daoism’ (dao-jia):

The Daoists enables the essential vital energy and spirit of human beings to be concentrated and unified. They move in unison with the Formless and provide adequately for all living things. In deriving their techniques, they follow the grand compliances [between humans and the cosmos] of the Naturalists, select the best of the Confucians and Mohists, and extract the essentials of the Terminologists and Legalists...[Daoists] take no action but also say that nothing is left undone. Their substance is easy to practice but their words are difficult to understand. Their techniques take emptiness and nothingness as the foundation, adaptation and compliance [with cosmic patterns] as the application....[They show how] the ruler [can] unite with the Great Dao, obscure and mysterious, and after illuminating the whole world revert to the Nameless. (Queen and Roth, pp. 279-82, mod.)

Thus, according to Sima Tan, Daoists advocate these essential ideas: 1. Humans can cultivate themselves to attain harmony of body and mind and to realize their essential connection to the Way and to the entire cosmos; 2. When rulers become adept at such ‘inner cultivation’ they can govern dispassionately and humanely according to the greater patterns of heaven and earth, upon which they model their social and political institutions; 3. While remaining faithful to this general Daoist orientation rulers should make use of the best ideas of other early intellectual lineages; 4. With these institutions and practices established, rulers can govern by taking no action while leaving nothing undone.

All these ideas are found in the Syncretist Zhuangzi. Inner cultivation practice is advocated to attain a deep and tranquil state of mind to enable both sages and rulers to act efficaciously in the world. In ‘Inveterate Ideas’ we read:

Hence it is said that calm repose, silent stillness, empty nothingness, and Non-action: these are the even level of heaven and earth, the substance of the Way and its Inner Power; therefore sages find rest in them. At rest they are unperturbed and relaxed; being unperturbed and relaxed, they are calm and reposed. If they are unperturbed and relaxed, calm and reposed,

Cares and misfortunes cannot enter
Deviant vital energy cannot make inroads.

Therefore their inner power is intact and their spirit is unimpaired. Hence it is said that sages:

In life proceed with heaven,
In death transform with other things.
In stillness share the inner power of the Yin,
In motion share the surge of the Yang.
They won't make the first move to gain advantages,
They won't take the first step to avoid trouble.
Only when stirred will they respond,
Only when pressed will they move.
Only when it is inevitable will they arise,
Rejecting knowledge and precedent
They take their course from the patterns of heaven.

(Graham, 265, mod.)

So sages attain profound levels of tranquility and through them they get in touch with the Way and preserve its inner power within them. They then make use of this experience to act spontaneously and harmoniously while being guided by the greater patterns of the cosmos. In other words, this is the Syncretists' version of attaining the flowing mode of cognition advocated in the other parts of the text. As if embracing the other viewpoints in the Zhuangzi, the Syncretist author of chapter 13, ‘The Way of Heaven,’ argues that this flowing mode can be applied to a variety of life circumstances:

Empty tranquility, calm repose, silent stillness, and Non-action are the foundation of all living things. To be clear about these when you sit facing south is to be the kind of ruler [the legendary sage-king] Yao was. To be clear about these when you sit facing south is to be the kind of minister that [the legendary sage-minister] Shun was. To have these as your resources in a high position is the inner power which is in emperor, king, Son of Heaven. To have these as your resources in a low position is the Way of the obscure sage, the untitled king. Use these to settle in retirement or wander at leisure, and the hermits of river, sea, mountain, and forest will submit to you. Use these to come forward and act in order to bring comfort to the age and your achievement is great and name illustrious, and the empire is united. In stillness a sage, in motion a king, you do nothing yet are exalted, you are simple and unhewn yet no one in the empire is able to rival your glory. (Graham 259-60, mod.)

Hence, ruler and minister, politician and hermit can utilize flowing cognition; but it is perhaps when applied to rulership that it attains its greatest achievement. Government by enlightened sages who attain flowing cognition is the pinnacle of Daoist political thought for the Syncretist: it is symbolized above by the phrase ‘in stillness a sage, in motion a king,’ which is elsewhere in the final chapter 33 referred to as ‘to be inwardly a sage and outwardly a king.’ It is with this cultivated mind that the sage ruler establishes human society in parallel to the greater patterns of the cosmos. For example, human social and political hierarchies are based upon normative natural patterns:

The ruler comes first, the minister follows; the father comes first, the son follows ... the senior comes first, the junior follows ... . Being exalted or lowly, first or last, belongs to the progressions of heaven and earth; therefore sages take their model from them ... spring and summer first, autumn and winter last, is the sequence of the four seasons ... . Heaven and earth are extremely numinous yet have sequences of the exalted and lowly, the first and the last, and how much more should this be true of the Way of human beings! If you expound a Way without their sequences, it is not their Way; and if you expound a Way which is not their Way, from what will you derive a Way? (Graham, 261, mod.)

This coordination of human society with cosmic patterns is a characteristic tenet of the early Daoist syncretic lineage that historians first called the ‘Way of the Yellow Emperor and Laozi’ (Huang-Lao zhi dao). This concern with cosmic patterns and their human parallels is incorporated from the Naturalist thinkers who first systematized the concepts of Yin and Yang (complementary negative and positive aspects of all living things). The Syncretist author of Zhuangzi 13 demonstrates further evidence of this characteristic adaptation of ideas from other early philosophical lineages:

...Therefore, the ancients who made clear the great Way first made heaven clear and the Way and its Inner Power were next. When the Way and its Inner Power were clear, [Confucian concepts of ] humaneness and rightness were next. When humaneness and rightness were clear [Legalist concepts of] portions and responsibilities were next. When portions and responsibilities were clear, [Terminologist concepts of] title and performance were next ... when [Terminologist concepts of] judging right and wrong were clear, [Legalists concepts of] reward and punishment were next. ... This is how one served the ruler above or was pastor to the people below, put other things in order or cultivated one's own person. Cleverness and strategy were not used and they invariably referred back to what was from heaven in them. It is this that is meant by supreme tranquillity, the utmost in government. (Graham 261-2, mod.)

This is an excellent example of the kind of Daoist syncretism Sima Tan describes and that survives in other early texts such as the Huang-Lao Silk Manuscripts found in 1973 at Ma-wang-tui (ca. 250 B.C.), parts of the philosophical compendia Guanzi (ca. 320-150 B.C.) and Lüshi chunqiu (240 B.C.), and the Huai-nan Tzu (139 B.C.). All these works are the products of a loosely organized intellectual tradition of masters and disciples that carried Daoist ideas into the unified empire of second century B.C. China and that transmitted what we know of this philosophy into the modern world.

The final chapter of the Zhuangzi, ‘Below in the Empire,’ exemplifies this kind of syncretism in its analysis of early intellectual traditions. After establishing its own position, the comprehensive ‘Way of Heaven and Earth’ that embraces all the ‘techniques of the Way,’ it analyzes how each of these earlier traditions understood one part of this comprehensive Way but ultimately failed to grasp the whole. Zhuangzi himself is included in this analysis:

...Above he roamed with the maker of things; below, he made friends with those for whom life and death are externals and there is neither end nor beginning. As for the Foundation, he opened it up in all its comprehensiveness, ran riot in the vastness of its depths. As for the Ancestor, it may be said that by being in tune he withdrew all the way back to it. However, when one assents to transformation and is released from things, the body has not exhausted its pattern, having come it will not be shaken off. Abstruse! Obscure! A man who did not succeed in getting it all. (Graham 283, mod.)

The Syncretist author thus praises Zhuangzi for his depth of mystical cultivation but chides him for failing to realize that there are practical affairs in the world that must be attended to. It is an interesting yet telling comment. The Syncretist criticizes the very impractibility for which Zhuangzi became renowned to later literati. The irony is that without the more prosaic and responsible Syncretists, who transmitted earlier parts of the text that contained the authentic voice of Zhuangzi, the iconoclastic ideas of this philosophical giant may have never been known. This is because of the extensive support and patronage of early philosophy by the kings of the various ‘warring states’ starting in the middle of the fourth century B.C. and continuing into imperial times. These rulers were interested in learning how to govern more efficaciously. Philosophical works were valued for their teachings about rulership and virtually all the texts that were widely circulated during this period had some political relevance, including, of course, the Daode jing. The ‘Inner Chapters’ of Zhuangzi had none, but were preserved, as we have seen, in a larger collection that did contain important ideas for rulership.

So, in the last analysis, what is it that holds together this disparate collection of materials that were written over a span of more than a century? All the various authorial voices in the text (except possibly the Yangist) share a common interest in cultivating the spontaneous ‘flowing mode’ of cognition that is symbolized throughout the work by the ‘heavenly’ side of human beings. They vary somewhat in how they conceive of this mode and they apply it in different ways but nonetheless they concur in emphasizing its importance. It is possible that all the authors were part of an intellectual tradition that descended from the historical founder, Zhuangzi, by direct master-disciple lines and each authorial voice constitutes a generation of such descent. It is also possible that the Zhuangzi collection was compiled by later Daoists, perhaps those at the court of Liu An, the second king of Huai-nan, who were attempting to reconstruct a lost Zhuangzi lineage (Roth 1991). We cannot know for certain. The precise way this text formed has, in all likelihood, disappeared into the mists of time, but we can rejoice in the fact that because of its politically relevant final stratum, the entire text has not met the same fate.


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