Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Dec 15, 2001; substantive revision Sat May 5, 2007

Confucianism, Daoism (Taoism), and Buddhism commonly name the three main pillars of traditional Chinese thought, although it should be obvious that like any “ism,” they are abstractions — what they name are not monolithic but multifaceted traditions with fuzzy boundaries and complex histories and internal divisions. “Daoism,” in particular, needs to be handled with care, for it designates both a philosophical tradition and an organized religion, which in modern Chinese are identified separately as Daojia and Daojiao, respectively.

Philosophical Daoism traces its origins to Laozi (or Lao-tzu, in the “Wade-Giles” system of transliteration), who flourished during the sixth century B.C.E., according to Chinese tradition. According to some modern scholars, however, Laozi is entirely legendary; there was never an historical Laozi. In religious Daoism, Laozi is revered as a supreme deity. The name “Laozi” is best taken to mean “Old (lao) Master (zi),” and Laozi the ancient philosopher is said to have written a short book, which has come to be called simply the Laozi. When the Laozi was recognized as a “classic”(jing) — that is, accorded “canonical” status, so to speak, on account of its profound insight and significance — it acquired a more exalted and hermeneutically instructive title, Daodejing (Tao-te ching), commonly translated as the “Classic of the Way and Virtue.” Its influence on Chinese culture is pervasive, and it reaches beyond China. Next to the Bible, the Daodejing is the most translated work in world literature. It is concerned with the Dao or “Way” and how it finds expression in “virtue” (de), especially through what the text calls “naturalness” (ziran) and “nonaction” (wuwei). These concepts, however, are open to interpretation. While some see them as proof that the Laozi is a deeply “mystical” work, others emphasize their contribution to ethics and/or political philosophy. Interpreting the Laozi demands careful hermeneutic reconstruction, which requires both analytic rigor and an informed historical imagination.

1. The Laozi Story

The Shiji (Records of the Historian) by the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.-220 C.E.) court historian Sima Qian (ca. 145-86 B.C.E.) offers a “biography” of Laozi. Its reliability has been questioned, but it serves as a common point of departure for scholarly debate.

Laozi was a native of Chu, according to the Shiji, a southern state in the Zhou dynasty (see map and discussion in Loewe and Shaughnessy 1999 (The Cambridge History of Ancient China), 594, 597). His surname was Li; his given name was Er, and he was also called Dan. Laozi served as a keeper of archival records at the court of Zhou. Confucius (551-479 B.C.E.) had consulted him on the rites, we are told, and praised him lavishly (Shiji 63). This establishes the traditional claim that Laozi was a senior contemporary of Confucius. A meeting or meetings between Confucius and Laozi, identified as “Lao Dan,” is reported also in the Zhuangzi and other early Chinese sources.

“Laozi cultivated Dao and virtue,” as Sima Qian goes on to relate, and “his learning was devoted to self-effacement and not having fame. He lived in Zhou for a long time; witnessing the decline of Zhou, he departed.” When he reached the northwest border then separating China from the outside world, Yin Xi, the official in charge of the border pass, asked that he put his teachings into writing. The result was a book consisting of some five thousand Chinese characters, divided into two parts, which discusses “the meaning of Dao and virtue.” Thereafter, Laozi left; no one knew where he had gone. This completes the main part of Sima Qian's account. The remainder puts on record attempts to identify the legendary Laozi with certain known historical individuals and concludes with a list of Laozi's purported descendants (see W. T. Chan 1963, Lau 1963, and Henricks 2000 for an English translation).

Few scholars today would subscribe fully to the Shiji report. Indeed, according to William Boltz, it “contains virtually nothing that is demonstrably factual; we are left no choice but to acknowledge the likely fictional nature of the traditional Lao tzu [Laozi] figure” (1993, 270). Disagreements abound on every front, including the name Laozi itself. Although the majority takes “Laozi” to mean “Old Master,” some scholars believe that “Lao” is a surname. The Zhuangzi and other early texts refer to “Lao Dan” consistently but not “Li Er.” According to Fung Yu-lan, Sima Qian had “confused” the legendary Lao Dan with Li Er, who flourished during the “Warring States” period (480-221 B.C.E.) and was the “real” founder of the Daoist school (1983, 171).

In an influential essay, A. C. Graham (1986) argues that the story of Laozi reflects a conflation of different legends. The earliest strand revolved around the meeting of Confucius with Lao Dan and was current by the fourth century B.C.E. During the first half of the third century, Lao Dan was recognized as a great thinker in his own right and as the founder of a distinct “Laoist” school of thought. It was not until the Han dynasty, when the teachings of Laozi, Zhuangzi, and others were seen to share certain insights centering on the concept of Dao, that they were classified together under the rubric of philosophical “Daoism” (daojia).

It is clear that by 100 B.C.E. if not earlier, Laozi was already shrouded in legends and that Sima Qian could only exercise his judgment as an historian to put together a report that made sense to him, based on the different and sometimes competing sources at his disposal.

The fact that Lao Dan appears favorably in both Confucian and Daoist sources seems to argue against the likelihood that the figure was fabricated for polemical purposes. Lao Dan could have gathered around him a group of disciples, who out of respect would address him as “Laozi.” Confucius had sought his advice presumably on mourning and funeral rites, given that the Confucian work Liji (Record of Rites) has Confucius citing Lao Dan four times specifically on these rites. Indeed, various dates have been proposed for the encounter — for example, 501 B.C.E., following the account in the Zhuangzi (ch. 14) — about which different versions circulated later among the elite during the Warring States period, when the Confucian and “Laoist” schools had secured their place in the intellectual arena. Admittedly, this is conjecture; the identity of Laozi no doubt will continue to attract and divide scholarly opinion.

The story of Laozi occupies a cherished place in the Daoist tradition. It is important also because it raises certain hermeneutic expectations and affects the way in which the Laozi is read. If the work was written by a single author, one might expect, for example, a high degree of consistency in style and content. If the Laozi was a work of the sixth or fifth century B.C.E., one might interpret certain sayings in the light of what we know of the period. There is little consensus among scholars, however, on the date or authorship of the Laozi, as we shall see below.

With the arrival of the “Way of the Celestial Master”(tianshidao), the first organized religious Daoist establishment (daojiao) in the second century C.E., the story of Laozi gained an important hagiographic dimension. In the eyes of the faithful, the Dao is a divine reality, and Laozi is seen as the personification of the Dao. Lao Dan is but one manifestation of the divine Laozi, albeit a pivotal one because of the writing of the Daodejing, which in religious Daoism commands devotion as a foundational scripture that promises not only wisdom but also immortality and salvation to those who submit to its power. During the Tang dynasty (618-906 C.E.), the imperial Li family traced its ancestry to Laozi. Today, Laozi's “birthday” is celebrated in many parts of Asia on the fifteenth day of the second lunar month.

The influence of the Laozi on Chinese culture is both deep and far-reaching. One indication of its enduring appeal and hermeneutical openness is the large number of commentaries devoted to it throughout Chinese history — some seven hundred, according to one count (W. T. Chan 1963, 77). The Laozi has inspired an intellectual movement known as xuanxue, “Learning of the Mysterious (Dao)” — or “Neo-Daoism,” as some scholars prefer, emphasizing its roots in classical Daoism — that dominated the Chinese elite or high culture from the third to the sixth century C.E. (See the entry on “Neo-Daoism” in this Encyclopedia.) Consequently, the Laozi played a significant role in informing not only philosophic thought but also the development of literature, calligraphy, painting, music, and other cultural traditions.

Imperial patronage enhanced the prestige of the Laozi and enlarged its scope of influence. In 731 C.E., the emperor Xuanzong decreed that all officials should keep a copy of the Daodejing at home and placed the classic on the list of texts to be examined for the civil service examinations. In religious Daoism, recitation of the Daodejing is a prescribed devotional practice and figures centrally in ritual performance. The Daodejing has been set to music from an early time. The term “Laozi learning” (Laoxue) has come to designate an important field of study; a recent effort in Chinese that sketches the major landmarks in this development is Zhongguo Laoxue shi (A History of Laozi Learning in China) (Xiong Tieji, et al. 1995).

The influence of the Laozi extends beyond China, as Daoism reaches across Asia and in the modern period, the Western world. In Hong Kong, Taiwan, and among the Chinese in Southeast Asia, Daoism is a living tradition. Daoist beliefs and practices have contributed also to the formation of Korean and Japanese culture, although here the process of cultural transmission, assimilation, and transformation is highly complex, especially given the close interaction among Daoism, Buddhism, and indigenous traditions such as Shintō (see Fukui, et al. 1983, vol. 3). During the seventh century, the Laozi was translated into Sanskrit; in the eighteenth century a Latin translation was brought to England, after which there has been a steady supply of translations into Western languages, yielding a handsome harvest of some 250 (LaFargue and Pas 1998, 277), with new ones still hitting bookstores almost every year. Some of the more notable recent translations in English are Roberts 2001, Ivanhoe 2002, Ames and Hall 2003, and Wagner 2003.

Laozi is an “axial” philosopher whose insight helps shape the course of human development, according to Karl Jaspers (1974). Memorable phrases from the Laozi such as “governing a large country is like cooking a small fish” (ch. 60) have found their way into Western political rhetoric. At the popular level, several comic versions of the Laozi reach out to a younger and wider readership (e.g., Tsai Chih Chung, et al. 1995). Some may have come to learn about the Laozi through such best-selling works as The Tao of Physics (Capra 1975) or The Tao of Pooh (Hoff 1982); and there is also A Taoist Cookbook (Saso 1994), which comes with “meditations” from the Daodejing. From nature lovers to management gurus, a growing audience is discovering that the Laozi has something to offer to them. The reception of the Laozi in modern Asia and the West falls outside the scope of this article; nevertheless, it is important to note that the Laozi should be regarded not only as a work of early Chinese philosophy but also in a larger context as a classic of world literature with keen contemporary relevance.

2. Date and Authorship of the Laozi

The date of composition refers to the time when the Laozi reached more or less its final form; it does not rule out later interpolations or corruptions. Generally, three positions can be distinguished. First, some scholars maintain that we should accept on the whole Sima Qian's account that the Laozi was written by Lao Dan in the sixth or early fifth century B.C.E. A second and more widely held view traces the Laozi to the fourth century, while a third argues for an even later date, not earlier than the mid-third century B.C.E. Although recent archaeological discoveries may seem to rule out the last, the issue is complex because the Laozi may turn out to be a composite work involving a long process of textual formation.

Both external and internal considerations play a role in determining the date of the Laozi. Quotations from the Laozi in other classical works are often cited as evidence. For example, if the Mozi quotes explicitly from the Laozi, and if the Mozi can be dated to the fifth century, then the Laozi would have been current by that time. There is in fact one such quotation preserved in the Song dynasty encyclopedic work, Taiping yulan (322.5b), although it is not found in the present Mozi. Until new archaeological evidence comes to light, the available external evidence can only confirm that parts of the current Laozi were available around 300 B.C.E. (see further discussion in the next section) and that the work became widely recognized by the middle of the third century B.C.E., when it was quoted extensively in such works as the Hanfeizi and the “outer” and “miscellaneous” chapters of the Zhuangzi.

The language of the Laozi provides important clues. Much of the text is rhymed. Focusing on rhyme patterns, Liu Xiaogan (1994 and 1997) concludes that the poetic structure of the Laozi is closer to that of the Shijing (Classic of Poetry) than that of the later Chuci (Songs of Chu). Although the dating of the Shijing and the Chuci itself is by no means precise, generally the poems collected in the former should not be later than the early fifth century B.C.E., before the close of the “Spring and Autumn” period (770-481 B.C.E.), whereas those collected in the latter can be traced to no earlier than the middle of the Warring States period, around 300 B.C.E. (There are different ways to date the Spring and Autumn and Warring States periods, but they do not affect the argument here.) For this reason, Liu Xiaogan argues, the traditional view first articulated by Sima Qian should be upheld. Examining a wider range of linguistic evidence, William Baxter agrees that the Laozi should be dated earlier than the Zhuangzi and the Chuci, but he traces “the bulk of the Lao-tzu to the mid or early fourth century” (1998, 249). Both Liu and Baxter provide a concise analysis of the different theories of the date of the Laozi.

It is possible that the Laozi has “preserved” the ideas of Lao Dan. W. T. Chan, for example, believes that the text “embodied” the teachings of Laozi, although it was not written until the fourth century (1963, 74). According to A. C. Graham, the Laozi was ascribed to Lao Dan around 250 B.C.E. by the text's author or “publiciser,” capitalizing on Lao Dan's reputation (1986, 119; also see Graham 1989). This leaves open the possibility that the book or parts of it existed before the middle of the third century. It also raises the question whether the Laozi was the work of a single author.

Conceivably, an editor or compiler, or a group or succession of them, could have brought together diverse sources. D. C. Lau, for example, is of the view that the Laozi is an “anthology” (1963, 14). According to Bruce Brooks and Taeko Brooks, the Laozi contains different layers of material spanning the period between 340 and 249 B.C.E. — “its long timespan precludes a single author” (1998, 151). Indeed, Chad Hansen describes the “dominant current textual theory” of the Daodejing as one which “treats the text as an edited accumulation of fragments and bits drawn from a wide variety of sources … there was no single author, no Laozi” (1992, 201). In contrast, Rudolf Wagner (1984 and 2000) asserts that the Laozi has a consistent “rhetorical structure,” characterized by an intricate “interlocking parallel style,” which would cast doubt on the “anthology” thesis.

The idea of an oral tradition that preceded the writing of the Laozi has gained wide acceptance in recent years. However, it is not always clear what that entails. On the one hand, it could lend support to W. T. Chan's view cited above, that Lao Dan's disciples had kept alive the teachings of the master orally before some later student(s) committed them to writing. On the other hand, it could also mean that the editor(s) or compiler(s) had access to disparate sayings originated from and circulated in different contexts. As Michael LaFargue emphasizes, oral tradition need not refer to the sayings of one person; it functions rather as a reservoir of “aphorisms,” which were circulated among like-minded “Laoist” scholars and formed the basis of the Daodejing (1992, 197). This does not prejudge whether the final product contains sayings that were put together at random, or reflects a careful distillation on the part of the compiler(s) who arranged and/or altered the material at their disposal. LaFargue appears to favor the latter view, but other scholars (e.g., Lau 1963 and Mair 1990) see little sign of tight editorial control.

Much remains uncertain, although I will venture an opinion in the next section. It may be argued that date and authorship are immaterial to and may detract from interpretation. The “truth” of the Laozi is “timeless,” according to this view, transcending historical and cultural specificities. Issues of provenance are important, however, if context has any role to play in the production of meaning. Polemics among different schools of thought, for example, were far more pronounced during the Warring States period than in the earlier Spring and Autumn period. The Zhou government had been in decline; warfare among the “feudal” states intensified both in scale and frequency from the fourth century onward. As the political conditions deteriorated, philosophers and strategists vied to convince the rulers of the various states of their program to bring order to the land. At the same time, perhaps with the increased displacement and disillusionment of intellectuals, a stronger eremitic tradition also emerged. If the Laozi had originated from the fourth century, it might reflect some of these concerns. From this perspective, the origin of the Laozi is as much a hermeneutical issue as it is an historical one.

3. Textual Traditions

The discovery of two Laozi silk manuscripts at Mawangdui, near Changsha, Hunan province in 1973 marks an important milestone in modern Laozi research. The manuscripts, identified simply as “A” (jia) and “B” (yi), were found in a tomb that was sealed in 168 B.C.E. The texts themselves can be dated earlier, the “A” manuscript being the older of the two, copied in all likelihood before 195 B.C.E. (see Lau 1982, Boltz 1984, and Henricks 1989).

Before this find, access to the Laozi was mainly through the received text of Wang Bi (226-249 C.E.) and Heshanggong, a legendary figure depicted as a teacher to the Han Emperor Wen (r. 179-157 B.C.E.). There are other manuscript versions, but by and large they play a secondary role in the history of the classic. A more recent archaeological find in Guodian, the so-called “Bamboo-slip Laozi,” which predates the Mawangdui manuscripts, has rekindled debates on the origin and composition of the Laozi. But first a note on the title and structure of the Daodejing.

The Laozi did not acquire its “classic” status until the Han dynasty. According to the Shiji (49.5b), the Empress Dowager Dou — wife of Emperor Wen and mother of Emperor Jing (r. 156-141) — was a dedicated student of the Laozi. Later sources add that it was Emperor Jing who established the text officially as a classic. However, the title Daodejing appears not to have been widely used until later, toward the close of the Han era.

The Daodejing is also referred to as the Daode zhenjing (True Classic of the Way and Virtue), the Taishang xuanyuan Daodejing (Classic of the Way and Virtue of the Highest Primordial Mystery), and less formally the “five-thousand character” text, on account of its approximate length. Most versions exceed five thousand characters by about five to ten percent, but it is interesting to note that numerological considerations later became an integral part of the history of the work. According to the seventh-century Daoist master Cheng Xuanying, Ge Xuan (fl. 200 C.E.) shortened the text that accompanied the Heshanggong commentary to fit the magical number of five thousand. This claim cannot be verified, but a number of Laozi manuscripts discovered at Dunhuang contain 4,999 characters.

The current Daodejing is divided into two parts (pian) and 81 chapters or sections (zhang). Part one, comprising chapters 1-37, has come to be known as the Daojing (Classic of Dao), while chapters 38-81 make up the Dejing (Classic of Virtue). This is understood to be a thematic division — chapter 1 begins with the word Dao, while chapter 38 begins with the phrase “superior virtue” — although the concepts of Dao and virtue (de) feature in both parts. As a rough heuristic guide, some commentators have suggested that the Daojing is more “metaphysical,” whereas the Dejing focuses more on sociopolitical issues.

In this context, it is easy to appreciate the tremendous interest occasioned by the discovery of the Mawangdui Laozi manuscripts. The two manuscripts contain all the chapters that are found in the current Laozi, although the chapters follow a different order in a few places. For example, in both manuscripts, the sections that appear as chapters 80 and 81 in the current Laozi come immediately after a section that corresponds with chapter 66 of the present text.

Both manuscripts are similarly divided into two parts, but in contrast with the current version, in reverse order; i.e., both manuscripts begin with the Dejing, corresponding to chapter 38 of the received text. “Part one” of the “B” manuscript ends with the editorial notation, “Virtue, 3,041 [characters],” while the last line of “Part two” reads: “Dao, 2,426.” Does this mean that the classic should be renamed? One scholar, in fact, has adopted the title Dedaojing for his translation of the Mawangdui Laozi (Henricks 1989). It seems unlikely that the Mawangdui arrangement stems simply from scribal idiosyncrasy or happenstance — e.g., that the copyist, in writing out the Laozi on silk, had made use of an original text in bamboo slips and just happened to start with a bundle of slips containing the Dejing (Yan 1976, 12, explains how this is possible). If the order is deliberate, does it imply that the “original” Laozi gives priority to sociopolitical issues? This raises important questions for interpretation.

The division into 81 chapters reflects numerological interest and is associated particularly with the Heshanggong version, which also carries chapter titles. It was not universally accepted until much later, perhaps the Tang period, when the text was standardized under the patronage of Emperor Xuanzong (r. 712-755). Traditional sources report that some versions were divided into 64, 68, or 72 chapters; and some did not have chapter divisions (Henricks 1982).

The Mawangdui “A” manuscript contains in some places a dot or “period” that appears to signal the beginning of a chapter. The earlier Guodian texts are not divided into two parts, but in many places they employ a black square mark to indicate the end of a section. The sections or chapters so marked generally agree with the division in the present Laozi. Thus, although the 81-chapter formation may be relatively late, some attempt at chapter division seems evident from an early stage of the textual history of the Daodejing.

Until recently, the Mawangdui manuscripts have held the pride of place as the oldest extant manuscripts of the Laozi. In late 1993, the excavation of a tomb (identified as M1) in Guodian, Jingmen city, Hubei province, has yielded among other things some 800 bamboo slips, of which 730 are inscribed, containing over 13,000 Chinese characters. Some of these, amounting to about 2,000 characters, match the Laozi (see Allan and Williams 2000, and Henricks 2000). The tomb is located near the old capital of the state of Chu and is dated around 300 B.C.E. Robbers entered the tomb before it was excavated, although the extent of the damage is uncertain.

The bamboo texts, written in a Chu script, have been transcribed into standard Chinese and published under the title Guodian Chumu zhujian (Beijing: Wenwu, 1998), which on the basis of the size and shape of the slips, calligraphy, and other factors divides the Laozi material into three groups. Group A contains thirty-nine bamboo slips, which correspond in whole or in part to the following chapters of the present text: 19, 66, 46, 30, 15, 64, 37, 63, 2, 32, 25, 5, 16, 64, 56, 57, 55, 44, 40 and 9. Groups B and C are smaller, with eighteen (chs. 59, 48, 20, 13, 41, 52, 45, 54) and fourteen slips (chs. 17, 18, 35, 31, 64), respectively.

On the whole, the Guodian “bamboo-slip Laozi” is consistent with the received text, although the placement or sequence of the chapters is different and there are numerous variant and/or archaic characters. Particularly, whereas chapter 19 of the current Laozi contains what appears to be a strong attack on Confucian ideals — “Cut off benevolence (ren), discard rightness (yi)” — the Guodian “A” text directs its readers to “cut off artificiality, discard deceit.” This has been taken to suggest that in the course of its transmission, the Laozi has taken on a more “polemical” outlook. However, the Guodian “C” text indicates that ren and yi arose only after the “Great Dao” had gone into decline, which agrees with chapter 18 of the current Laozi. In other words, it should not be assumed that the Guodian texts do not engage in a critique of Confucian philosophy.

It is not clear whether the Guodian bamboo manuscripts were copied from one source and were meant to be read as one text divided into three parts, whether they were “selections” from a longer original, or whether they were three different texts copied from different sources at different times. There is one important clue, however. The “A” and “C” texts give two different versions of what is now part of chapter 64 of the Laozi, which suggests that they came from different sources. One scholar at least has suggested a chronology to the making of the Guodian Laozi bamboo slips, with the “A” group being the oldest of the three, copied around 400 B.C.E. (Ding 2000, 7-9).

It is possible that the Guodian texts only furnished some of the textual “raw material” or “building blocks” that were used later to create the Laozi (Boltz 1999). In other words, they were independent writings and not versions of or excerpts from a text called Laozi, which in this scenario did not yet exist when the Guodian texts were made. Nevertheless, taking into account all the available evidence, it seems likely that a body or bodies of sayings attributed to Laozi gained currency during the fourth century B.C.E. They may have been derived from earlier, oral or written sources. By the mid-third century if not earlier, the Laozi then reached more or less its final form and began to attract commentarial attention.

Two approaches to the making of the Laozi warrant consideration, for they bear directly on interpretation. A linear “evolutionary” model of textual formation would suggest that there was an original Laozi, by Lao Dan or of unknown authorship, and that the Guodian Laozi was close to or were abridged versions of this original text. Concerned with the decline of Zhou rule, the original Laozi addressed above all issues of governance. During the third century B.C.E., the Laozi had undergone substantial change and grown into a longer and more complex work, becoming in this process more polemical against the Confucian and other schools of thought, and acquiring new material of stronger metaphysical or cosmological interest. The Mawangdui manuscripts were based on this mature version of the Laozi; the original emphasis on politics, however, can still be detected in the placement of the Dejing before the Daojing. Later versions reversed this order and in so doing subsumed politics under a broader philosophical vision of Dao as the beginning and end of all beings.

The Guodian and Mawangdui manuscripts are certainly older than the received text of the Laozi, but this does not necessarily mean that they are therefore closer to the “original,” if there was an original. As opposed to a linear evolutionary model, it is conceivable that there were several overlapping collections of sayings attributed to Laozi from the start, each inhabiting a particular interpretive context, from which different versions of the Laozi were derived.

Although some key chapters in the current Laozi that deal with the nature of Dao (e.g., chs. 1, 14) are not found in the Guodian corpus, the idea that the Dao is “born before heaven and earth,” for example, which is found in chapter 25 of the received text is already present. The critical claim that “being [you] is born of nonbeing [wu]” in chapter 40 also figures in the Guodian “A” text. This seems to argue against any suggestion that the Laozi, and for that matter ancient Chinese philosophical works in general were not interested or lacked the ability to engage in abstract philosophic thought, an assumption that sometimes appears to underlie evolutionary approaches to the development of Chinese philosophy.

The Guodian and Mawangdui finds are extremely valuable. They are syntactically clearer than the received text in some instances, thanks to the larger number of grammatical particles they employ. However, they cannot resolve all the controversies and uncertainties surrounding the Laozi. Perhaps the two approaches identified above are not mutually exclusive; it may be best to envisage a process of textual evolution without assuming a single original.

More specifically, different written collections of Laozi sayings, leaving open the time and the way in which they were first formed, circulated among the educated elite during the fourth century B.C.E. The Guodian texts would be examples of these, and I see no reason not to believe that there were others, perhaps even longer collections. Overlapping in some cases and with varying emphases in others, they address both the nature of Dao and Daoist government. These were then developed in several ways — e.g., some collections were combined; new sayings were added; and explanatory comments, illustrations, and elaboration on individual sayings were integrated into the text. The demand for textual uniformity rose when the Laozi gained recognition, and consequently the different textual traditions eventually gave way to the received text of the Laozi.

As mentioned, the current Laozi on which most reprints, studies and translations are based is the version that comes down to us along with the commentaries by Wang Bi and Heshanggong. Three points need to be made in this regard. First, technically there are multiple versions of the Wang Bi and Heshanggong Laozi — over thirty Heshanggong versions are extant — but the differences are on the whole minor. Second, the Wang Bi and Heshanggong versions are not the same, but they are sufficiently similar to be classified as belonging to the same line of textual transmission. Third, the Wang Bi and Heshanggong versions that we see today have suffered change. Prior to the invention of printing, when each manuscript had to be copied by hand, editorial changes and scribal errors are to be expected. In particular, the Laozi text that now accompanies Wang Bi's commentary bears the imprint of later alteration, mainly under the influence of the Heshanggong version, and cannot be regarded as the Laozi that Wang Bi himself had seen and commented on. Boltz (1985) and Wagner (1989) have examined this question in some detail.

The “current” version refers to the Sibu beiyao and the Sibu congkan editions of the Daodejing. The former contains the Wang Bi version and commentary, together with a colophon by the Song scholar Chao Yuezhi (1059-1129), a second note by Xiong Ke (ca. 1111-1184)), and the Tang scholar Lu Deming's (556-627) Laozi yinyi (Glosses on the Meaning and Pronunciation of the Laozi). It is a reproduction of the Qing dynasty “Wuying Palace” edition, which in turn is based on a Ming edition (see especially Hatano 1979). The Heshanggong version preserved in the Sibu congkan series is taken from the library of the famous bibliophile Qu Yong (fl. 1850). According to Qu's own catalogue, this is a Song dynasty version, published probably after the reign of the emperor Xiaozong (r. 1163-1189). Older extant Heshanggong versions include two incomplete Tang versions and fragments found in Dunhuang.

Besides the Guodian bamboo texts, the Mawangdui manuscripts, and the received text of Wang Bi and Heshanggong, there is an “ancient version” (guben) edited by the early Tang scholar Fu Yi (fl. 600). Reportedly, this version was recovered from a tomb in 574 C.E., whose occupant was a consort of the Chu general Xiang Yu (d. 202 B.C.E.), the rival of Liu Bang before the latter emerged victorious and founded the Han dynasty. A later redaction of the “ancient version” was made by Fan Yingyuan in the Song dynasty. There are some differences, but these two can be regarded as having stemmed from the same textual tradition.

Manuscript fragments discovered in the Dunhuang caves form another important source in Laozi research. Among them are several Heshanggong fragments (especially S. 477 and S. 3926 in the Stein collection, and P. 2639 in the Pelliot collection) and the important Xiang'er Laozi with commentary. Another Dunhuang manuscript that merits attention is the Suo Tan fragment, now at the University Art Museum, Princeton University, which contains the last thirty-one chapters of the Daodejing beginning with chapter 51 of the modern text. It is signed and dated at the end, bearing the name of the third-century scholar and diviner Suo Tan, who is said to have made the copy, written in ink on paper, in 270 C.E. According to Rao Zongyi (1955), the Suo Tan version belongs to the Heshanggong line of the Laozi text. A more recent study by William Boltz (1996) questions its third-century date and argues that the fragment in many instances also agrees with the Fu Yi “ancient version.”

While manuscript versions inform textual criticism of the Laozi, stone inscriptions provide further collaborating support. Over twenty steles, mainly of Tang and Song origins, are available to textual critics, although some are in poor condition (Yan 1957). Students of the Laozi today can work with several Chinese and Japanese studies that make use of a large number of manuscript versions and stone inscriptions (notably Ma 1965, Jiang 1980, Zhu 1980, and Shima 1973). Boltz (1993) offers an excellent introduction to the manuscript traditions of the Laozi. Wagner (2003) attempts to reconstruct the original face of Wang Bi's Laozi (cf. Lou 1980 and Lynn 1999). A recent major contribution to Laozi studies in Chinese in Liu Xiaogan 2006, which compares the Guodian, Mawangdui, Fu Yi, Wang Bi, and Heshanggong versions of the Laozi and provides detailed textual and interpretive analysis for each chapter. In an article in English, Liu (2003) sets out some of his main findings.

4. Commentaries

Commentaries to the Laozi offer an invaluable guide to interpretation and are important also for their own contributions to Chinese philosophy and religion. Two chapters in the Hanfeizi (chs. 21 and 22) are entitled “Explaining the Laozi” (Jie Lao) and “Illustrating the Laozi” (Yu Lao), which can be regarded as the earliest extant commentary to the classic. The “bibliographical” section of the Hanshu (History of the Former Han Dynasty) lists four commentaries to the Laozi, but they have not survived. Nevertheless, Laozi learning began to flourish from the Han period. The commentaries by Heshanggong, Yan Zun, Wang Bi, and the Xiang'er commentary will be introduced in what follows. Some mention will also be made of later developments in the history of the Daodejing. The late Isabelle Robinet has contributed an important pioneering study of the early Laozi commentaries (1977; see also Robinet 1998).

Traditionally, the Heshanggong commentary is regarded as a product of the early Han dynasty. The name Heshanggong means an old man who dwells by the side of the river, and some have identified the river in question to be the Yellow River. An expert on the Laozi, he caught the attention of Emperor Wen, who went personally to consult him. Heshanggong revealed to the emperor his true identity as a divine emissary sent by the “Supreme Lord of the Dao” — i.e., the divine Laozi — to teach him. The emperor proved a humble student, as the legend concludes, worthy of receiving the Daodejing with Heshanggong's commentary (A. Chan 1991a).

Recent Chinese studies generally place the commentary at the end of the Han period, although some Japanese scholars would date it to as late as the sixth century C.E. It is probably a second-century C.E. work and reflects the influence of the “Huang-Lao” (Yellow Emperor and Laozi) school, which flourished during the early Han dynasty (A. Chan 1991b). Called in early sources the Laozi zhangju, it belongs to the genre of zhangju literature, prevalent in Han times, which one may paraphrase as commentary by “chapter and sentence.” Its language is simple; its imagination, down-to-earth. The Heshanggong commentary shares with other Han works the cosmological belief that the universe is constituted by qi, the energy-like building blocks of life and the vital constituent of the cosmos, variously translated as “vital energy,” “life-force,” or “pneuma.” On this basis, interpreting the text in terms of yin-yang theory, the Laozi is seen to disclose not only the mystery of the origin of the universe but also the secret to personal well-being and sociopolitical order.

What the Laozi calls the “One,” according to Heshanggong, refers to the purest and most potent form of qi-energy that brings forth and continues to nourish all beings. This is the meaning of de, the “virtue” or power with which the “ten thousand things” — i.e., all beings — have been endowed and without which life would cease. The maintenance of “virtue,” which the commentary also describes as “guarding the One,” is thus crucial to self-cultivation. A careful diet, exercise, and some form of meditation are implied, but generally the commentary focuses on the diminishing of selfish desires. The government of the “sage” — a term common to all schools of Chinese thought but which is given a distinctive Daoist meaning in the commentary — rests on the same premise. Policies that are harmful to the people such as heavy taxation and severe punishment are to be avoided, but the most fundamental point remains that the ruler himself must cherish what the Laozi calls “emptiness” and “nonaction.” Disorder stems from the dominance of desire, which reflects the unruly presence of confused and agitated qi-energy. In this way, self-cultivation and government are shown to form an integral whole.

A second major commentary is the Laozi zhigui (The Essential Meaning of the Laozi) attributed to the Han dynasty scholar Yan Zun (fl. 83 B.C.E.-10 C.E.). Styled Junping, Yan's surname was originally Zhuang; it was changed in later written records to the semantically similar Yan to comply with the legal restriction not to use the name Zhuang, which was the personal name of Emperor Ming (r. 57-75) of the Later Han dynasty. Yan Zun is well remembered in traditional sources as a recluse of great learning and integrity, a diviner of legendary ability, and an author of exceptional talent. The famous Han poet and philosopher Yang Xiong (53 B.C.E.-18 C.E.) studied under Yan and spoke glowingly of him.

The Laozi zhigui (abbreviated hereafter as Zhigui), as it now stands, is incomplete; only the commentary to the Dejing, chapters 38-81 of the current Laozi, remains. The best edition of the Zhigui is that contained in the Daozang (Daoist Canon, no. 693 in the Daozang zimu yinde, Harvard-Yenching Sinological Index Series, no. 25), which clearly indicates that the work had originally thirteen juan or books, the first six of which have been lost. Judging from the available evidence, it can be accepted as a Han product (A. Chan 1998b). The Laozi text that accompanies Yan Zun's commentary agrees in many instances with the wording of the Mawangdui manuscripts.

Like Heshanggong, Yan Zun also subscribes to the yin-yang cosmological theory characteristic of Han thought. Unlike Heshanggong's commentary, however, the Zhigui does not prescribe a program of nourishing one's qi-energy or actively cultivating “long life.” This does not mean that it rejects the ideal of longevity. On the contrary, it recognizes that the Dao “lives forever and does not die” (8.9b), and that the man of Dao, correspondingly, “enjoys long life” (7.2a). Valuing one's spirit and vital energy is important, but the Zhigui is concerned that self-cultivation must not violate the principle of “nonaction.” Any effort contrary to what the Laozi has termed “naturalness” (ziran) is counter-productive and doomed to failure.

The concept of ziran occupies a pivotal position in Yan Zun's commentary. It describes the nature of the Dao and its manifestation in the world. It also points to an ethical ideal. The way in which natural phenomena operate reflects the workings of the Dao. The “sage” follows the Dao in that he, too, abides by naturalness. In practice this means attending to one's “heart-mind” (xin) so that it will not be enslaved by desire. Significantly, the Zhigui suggests that just as the sage “responds” to the Dao in being simple and empty of desire, the common people would in turn respond to the sage and entrust the empire to him. In this way, the Laozi is seen to offer a comprehensive guide to order and harmony at all levels.

An early commentary that maximizes the religious import of the Laozi is the Xiang'er Commentary. Although it is mentioned in catalogues of Daoist works, there was no real knowledge of it until a copy was discovered among the Dunhuang manuscripts (S. 6825 in the Stein collection). The manuscript copy, now housed in the British Library, was probably made around 500 C.E. The original text, disagreement among scholars notwithstanding, is generally traced to around 200 C.E. It is closely linked to the “Way of the Celestial Master” and has been ascribed to Zhang Daoling, the founder of the sect, or his grandson Zhang Lu, who was instrumental in ensuring the group's survival after the collapse of the Han dynasty. A detailed study and translation of the work in English is now available (Bokenkamp 1997).

The Xiang'er manuscript is unfortunately incomplete; only the first part has survived, beginning with the middle of chapter 3 and ending with chapter 37 in the current chapter division of the Laozi. It is not clear what the title, Xiang'er, means. Following Rao Zongyi and Ôfuchi Ninji, Stephen Bokenkamp suggests that it is best understood in the literal sense that the Dao “thinks (xiang) of you (er)” (1997, 61). This underscores the central thesis of the commentary, that devotion to the Dao in terms of self-cultivation and compliance with its precepts would assure boundless blessing in this life and beyond.

The Xiang'er commentary accepts without question the divine status of Laozi. While Yan Zun and Heshanggong direct their commentary primarily to those in a position to effect political change, the Xiang'er invites a larger audience to participate in the quest for the Dao, to achieve union with the Dao through spiritual and moral discipline. It is possible to attain the “life-span of an undefiled, godlike being” (xianshou). Nourishing one's vital qi-energy through meditation and other practices remains the key to attaining “long life” and ultimately to forming a spiritual body devoid of the blemishes of mundane existence (Rao 1991; see also Puett 2004).

Spiritual discipline, however, is not sufficient; equally important is the accumulation of moral merit. Later Daoist sources refer to the “nine precepts” of the Xiang'er. There is also a longer set known as the “twenty-seven precepts” of the Xiang'er. These include general positive steps such as being tranquil and yielding, as well as specific injunctions against envy, killing, and other morally reprehensible acts. Likening the human body to the walls of a pond, the essential qi-energy to the water in it, and good deeds the source of the water, the Xiang'er commentary makes clear that deficiency in any one would lead to disastrous consequences (see Bokenkamp 1993).

Compared with the Xiang'er, Wang Bi's Laozi commentary could not be more different. There is no reference to “immortals”; no deified Laozi. The Daodejing, as Wang Bi sees it, is fundamentally not concerned with the art of “long life” but offers profound insights into the radical otherness of Dao as the source of being, and the practical implications that follow from it.

Styled Fusi, Wang Bi (226-249) was one of the acknowledged leaders of the movement of “Learning of the Mysterious (Dao)” (xuanxue), a revival of Daoist philosophy that came into prominence during the Wei period (220-265) and dominated the Chinese intellectual scene well into the sixth century. The word xuan denotes literally a shade of dark red and is used in the Laozi (esp. ch. 1) to suggest the mystery or profundity of Dao. The movement has been identified, perhaps inappropriately, as “Neo-Daoism” in some Western sources. It signifies a broad philosophical front united in its attempt to discern the “true” meaning of Dao but not a homogeneous, sectarian school. Alarmed by what they saw as the decline of Dao, influential intellectuals of the day initiated a radical reinterpretation of the classical heritage. They did not neglect the Confucian classics but drew inspiration especially from the Yijing, the Laozi, and the Zhuangzi, which were then referred to as the “Three (Studies of) Mystery” (sanxuan); that is to say, the three key treatises unlocking the mystery of Dao. Wang Bi, despite his short life, distinguished himself as a brilliant interpreter of the Laozi and the Yijing (see A. Chan 1991b and Wagner 2000).

According to Wang Bi, Dao is indeed the “beginning” of the “ten thousand things.” Unlike Heshanggong or the Xiang'er, however, he did not pursue a cosmological or religious interpretation of the process of creation. Rather, Wang seems more concerned with what may be called the logic of creation. Dao constitutes the absolute “beginning” in that all beings have causes and conditions that derive logically from a necessary foundation. The ground of being, however, cannot be itself a being; otherwise, infinite regress would render the logic of the Laozi suspect. For this reason, the Laozi would only speak of Dao as “nonbeing” (wu).

The transcendence of Dao must not be compromised. To do justice to the Laozi, it is also important to show how the function of Dao translates into basic “principles” (li) governing the universe. The regularity of the seasons, the plenitude of nature, and other expressions of “heaven and earth” all attest to the presence of Dao. Human beings also conform to these principles, and so are “modeled” ultimately after Dao.

Wang Bi is often praised in later sources for having given the concept of “principle” its first extended philosophical treatment. In the realm of Dao, principles are characterized by “naturalness” (ziran) and “nonaction” (wuwei). Wang Bi defines ziran as “an expression of the ultimate.” In this regard, attention has been drawn to Yan Zun's influence. Nonaction helps explain the practical meaning of naturalness. In ethical terms, Wang Bi takes nonaction to mean freedom from the dictates of desire. This defines not only the goal of self-cultivation but also that of government. Wang Bi's Laozi commentary has exerted a strong influence on modern interpretations of the Laozi in both Asia and the West. There are four English translations available (Lin 1977, Rump 1979, Lynn 1999, and Wagner 2003).

Among these four commentaries, Heshanggong's Laozi zhangju occupied the position of preeminence in traditional China, at least until the Song dynasty. For a long period, Wang Bi's work was relatively neglected. The authority of the Heshanggong commentary can be traced to its place in the Daoist religion, where it ranks second only to the Daodejing itself. Besides Heshanggong's work and the Xiang'er, there are two other commentaries, the Laozi jiejie (Sectional Explanation) and the Laozi neijie (Inner Explanation), that are closely associated with religious Daoism. Both have been ascribed to Yin Xi, the keeper of the pass who “persuaded” Laozi to write the Daodejing and who, according to Daoist hagiographic records, later studied under the divine Laozi and became an “immortal.” These texts, however, only survive in citations (see Kusuyama 1979).

From the Tang period, one begins to find serious attempts to collect and classify the growing number of Laozi commentaries. An early pioneer is the eighth-century Daoist master Zhang Junxiang, who cited some thirty commentaries in his study of the Daodejing (Wang 1981). Du Guangting (850-933) provided a larger collection, involving some sixty commentaries (Daode zhenjing guangshengyi, Daozang no. 725). According to Du, there were those who saw the Laozi as a political text, while others focused on spiritual self-cultivation. There were Buddhist interpreters (e.g., Kumārajīva and Sengzhao), and there were those who explained the “Twofold Mystery” (chongxuan). This latter represents an important development in the history of interpretation of the Daodejing.

The term “Twofold Mystery” comes from chapter 1 of the Laozi, where Dao is said to be the mystery of all mysteries (xuan zhi you xuan). As a school of Daoist learning, “Twofold Mystery” seizes this to be the key to understanding the Laozi. Daoist sources relate that the school goes back to the fourth-century master Sun Deng. Through Gu Huan (fifth century) and others, the school reached its height during the Tang period, represented by such thinkers as Cheng Xuanying and Li Rong in the seventh century. The school reflects the growing interaction between Daoist and Buddhist thought, particularly Mādhyamika philosophy. Unlike Wang Bi, it sees “nonbeing” as equally one-sided as being when applied to the transcendence of Dao. Nonbeing may highlight the profundity or mystery of Dao, but it does not yet reach the highest truth, which according to Cheng Xuanying can be called the “Dao of Middle Oneness” (Kohn 1992, 144). Like other polar opposites, the distinction between being and nonbeing must also be “forgotten” before one can achieve union with Dao.

The Laozi has been viewed in still other ways. For example, a Tang commentary by Wang Zhen, the Daodejing lunbing yaoyishu (Daozang no. 713), presented to Emperor Xianzong (r. 806-820) in 809, sees the text as a treatise on military strategy (Rand 1979-80; see also Wang Ming 1984 and Mukai 1994). The diversity of interpretation is truly remarkable (see Robinet 1998 for a typological analysis). The Daodejing was given considerable imperial attention, with no fewer than eight emperors having composed or at least commissioned a commentary on the work. These include Emperor Wu and Emperor Jianwen of the Liang dynasty, Xuanzong of the Tang, Huizong of the Song, and Taizu of the Ming dynasty (see Liu Cunren 1969 for a discussion of the last three).

By the thirteenth century, students of the Daodejing were already blessed, as it were, with an embarrassment of riches, so much so that Du Daojian (1237-1318) could not but observe that the coming of the Dao to the world takes on a different form each time. That is to say, different commentators were shaped by the spirit of their age in their approach to the classic, so that it would be appropriate to speak of a “Han Laozi,” “Tang Laozi,” or “Song Laozi,” each with its own agenda (Xuanjing yuanzhi fahui, Daozang no. 703).

5. Approaches to the Laozi

Is the Laozi a manual of self-cultivation and government? Is it a metaphysical treatise, or does it harbor deep mystical insights? Chapter 1 of the current Laozi begins with the famous words: “The Way that can be spoken of is not the constant Way.” Chapter 10 speaks of nourishing one's “soul” and embracing the “One.” Chapter 80 depicts the ideal polity as a small country with few inhabitants. The Laozi is a difficult text. Its language is often cryptic; the sense or reference of the many symbols it employs remains unclear, and there seems to be conceptual inconsistencies. For example, whereas chapter 2 refers to the “mutual production of being and nonbeing,” chapter 40 declares, “Being originates in nonbeing” (Henricks, trans. 1989). Is it more meaningful to speak of the “worldviews” of the Daodejing, instead of a unified vision? If the Laozi were an “anthology” put together at random by different compilers over a long period of time, coherence need not be an issue. Traditionally, however, this was never a serious option. Most modern studies are equally concerned to disclose the “deeper” unity and meaning of the classic. While some seek to recover the “original” meaning of the Laozi, others celebrate its contemporary relevance. Consider, first of all, some of the main modern approaches to the Daodejing (cf. Hardy 1998).

One view is that the Laozi reflects a deep mythological consciousness at its core. The myth of “chaos,” in particular, helps shape the Daoist understanding of the cosmos and the place of human beings in it (Girardot 1983). Chapter 25, for example, likens the Dao to an undifferentiated oneness. The myth of a great mother earth goddess may also have informed the worldview of the Laozi (Erkes 1935; Chen 1969), which explains its emphasis on nature and the feminine (Chen 1989). Chapter 6, for example, refers to the “spirit of the valley,” which is also called the “mysterious female.”

A second view is that the Laozi gives voice to a profound mysticism. According to Victor Mair (1990), it is indebted to Indian mysticism (see also Waley 1958). According to Benjamin Schwartz (1985), the mysticism of the Daodejing is sui generis, uniquely Chinese and has nothing to do with India. Indeed, as one scholar suggests, it is unlike other mystical writings in that ecstatic vision does not play a role in the ascent of the Daoist sage (Welch 1965, 60). According to another interpretation, however, there is every indication that ecstasy forms a part of the world of the Laozi, although it is difficult to gauge the “degree” of its mystical leanings (Kaltenmark 1969, 65). A more recent champion of the mystical view is Harold Roth, who argues that Daoist “inner cultivation” and Indian yoga may be similar, but “they are parallel developments in different cultures at different times.” (Roth 1999, 137). It is possible to combine the mystical and mythological approaches to yield a third view. Although the presence of ancient religious beliefs can still be detected, they have been raised to a “higher” mystical plane in the Laozi (e.g., Ching 1997).

A fourth view sees the Laozi mainly as a work of philosophy, which gives a metaphysical account of reality and insight into Daoist self-cultivation and government; but fundamentally it is not a work of mysticism (W. T. Chan 1963). The strong practical interest of the Laozi distinguishes it from any mystical doctrine that eschews worldly involvement. It is, in Creel's (1977) words, “purposive” and not “contemplative.” Fifth, to many readers the Laozi offers essentially a philosophy of life. Remnants of an older religious thinking may have found their way into the text, but they have been transformed into a naturalistic philosophy. The emphasis on naturalness translates into a way of life characterized by simplicity, calmness, and freedom from the tyranny of desire (e.g., Liu Xiaogan 1997). For Roger Ames and David Hall (2003), indeed, the essence of the Laozi is “making this life significant.” Unlike the claim that the Laozi espouses a mystical or esoteric teaching directed at a restricted audience, this view tends to highlight its universal appeal and contemporary relevance.

A sixth and influential view is that the Laozi is above all concerned with realizing peace and sociopolitical order. It is an ethical and political masterpiece intended for the ruling class, with concrete strategic suggestions aimed at remedying the moral and political turmoil engulfing late Zhou China. Self-cultivation is important, but the ultimate goal extends beyond personal fulfillment (Lau 1963, LaFargue 1992, Moeller 2006). The Laozi criticizes the Confucian school not only for being ineffectual in restoring order but more damagingly as a culprit in worsening the ills of society at that time. The ideal seems to be a kind of “primitive” society, where people would dwell in harmony and contentment, not fettered by ambition or desire (Needham 1956).

This list is far from exhaustive; there are other views of the Laozi. Chad Hansen (1992), for example, focuses on the “anti-language” philosophy of the text. Different combinations are also possible. A. C. Graham, for example, emphasizes both the mystical and political elements, arguing that the Laozi was probably targeted at the ruler of a small state (1989, 234). For Hans-Georg Moeller (2006), though a work of political philosophy in its original context, the Laozi offers a powerful critique of “humanism” that is ethically as relevant then as it is now. The Laozi could be seen as encompassing all of the above — such categories as the metaphysical, ethical, political, mystical, and religious form a unified whole in Daoist thinking and are deemed separate and distinct only in modern Western thought. Alternatively, coming back to the question of multiple authorship and coherence, it could be argued that the Laozi contains “layers” of material put together by different people at different times (Emerson 1995).

Is it fair to say that the Laozi is inherently “polysemic” (Robinet 1998), open to diverse interpretations? This concerns not only the difficulty of the Laozi but also the interplay between reader and text in any act of interpretation. Polysemy challenges the assertion that the “intended” meaning of the Laozi can be recovered fully. But, it is important to emphasize, it does not follow that context is unimportant, that parameters do not exist, or that there are no checks against particular interpretations. While hermeneutic reconstruction remains an open process, it cannot disregard the rules of evidence. Questions of provenance, textual variants, as well as the entire tradition of commentaries and modern scholarship are important for this reason. The following presents some of the main concepts and symbols in the Laozi based on the current text, focusing on the key conceptual cluster of Dao, de (virtue), ziran (naturalness), and wuwei (nonaction), in a way that highlights their philosophical significance and suggests a degree of coherence.

To begin with Dao, the etymology of the Chinese graph or character suggests a pathway, or heading in a certain direction along a path. Most commentators agree in translating dao as “way.” As a verb, perhaps on account of the directionality involved, dao also conveys the sense of “speaking.” Thus, the opening phrase of chapter 1, dao ke dao, literally “Dao that can be dao-ed,” is often rendered, “The Way that can be spoken of.” In most cases, the capitalized form — “Way” or “Dao” — is used, to distinguish it from other usages of the term.

The concept of dao figures centrally also in Confucian writings, and as mentioned some parts of the current Laozi represent a critique of the Confucian school (especially chs. 18 and 19). In general, whereas dao signifies a means to a higher end in other schools of Chinese philosophy, the Laozi sees it as an end in itself. This distinction is captured in the Oxford English Dictionary (online edition), which defines “Dao” as follows: “In Taoism, an absolute entity which is the source of the universe; the way in which this absolute entity functions.” “In Confucianism and in extended uses,” however, the term means “the way to be followed, the right conduct; doctrine or method.”

The Laozi underscores both the ineffability and creative power of Dao. Chapter 1 states that the “constant” (chang, also translated as “eternal” — e.g., W. T. Chan 1963) Dao cannot be described; it is “nameless.” Chapter 14 brings out clearly that Dao transcends sensory perception; it has no shape or form. Nameless and formless, Dao can only be described as “dark” or “mysterious” (xuan) or wu, literally “not having” any name, form, or other characteristics of things (see also chs. 21 and 32). Indeed, though suggestive, the term “Dao” itself is no more than a symbol — as the Laozi makes clear, “I do not know its name; I style it Dao” (ch. 25; see also ch. 34). This suggests a sense of radical transcendence, which may explain why the Laozi has been approached so often as a mystical text.

The concept of wu is difficult and has been translated variously as “nothing,” “nothingness,” “negativity,” or “nonbeing.” It marks not only the mystery of Dao but also its limitlessness or inexhaustibility (e.g., ch. 4). Names serve to delimit, to set boundaries; in contrast, Dao is without limits and therefore cannot be captured fully by language. This suggests a positive dimension to transcendence, which brings into view the creative power of Dao: “All things under heaven are born of being (you); being is born of wu” (ch. 40). What does this mean?

Elsewhere in the Laozi, Dao is said to be the “beginning” of all things (chs. 1, 25). Daoist creation involves a process of differentiation from unity to multiplicity: “Dao gives birth to One; One gives birth to Two; Two gives birth to Three; Three gives birth to the ten thousand things” (ch. 42). The text does not indicate tense or spell out what the numbers refer to — is it saying that something called the “One” produced or produces the “Two” in the sense of two other things?

The “nothingness” of Dao helps impose certain constraints on interpretation. Specifically, the idea of a creator god with attributes, like the “Lord on High” (Shangdi) in ancient Chinese religion, does not seem to fit with the emphasis on transcendence.

The dominant interpretation in traditional China is that Dao represents the source of the original, undifferentiated, essential qi-energy, the “One,” which in turn produces the yin and yang cosmic forces. While the yang energy rises to form heaven, yin solidifies to become earth. A further “blending” of the two generates a “harmonious” qi-energy that informs human beings.

This is essentially the reading of the Heshanggong commentary. Although the Laozi may not have entertained a fully developed yin-yang cosmological theory, which took shape during the Han period, it does suggest at one point that natural phenomena are constituted by yin and yang (ch. 42). That which gave rise to the original qi-energy is indescribable. The Laozi calls it Dao, or perhaps more appropriately in this context, “the Dao,” with the definite article, to signal its presence as the source of the created order. In modern terms, minus the language of yin-yang cosmology, this translates into an understanding of the Dao as “an absolute entity which is the source of the universe” (see the Oxford definition cited above). Not being anything in particular, the Dao may be described as “nothing” (wu). However, on this reading, wu does not mean “nothingness,” “negativity” or absence in the nihilistic sense, in view of the creative power of the Dao.

Alternatively, one could argue that Dao signifies a conceptually necessary ontological ground; it does not refer to any indescribable original substance or energy. “Beginning” is not a term of temporal reference but suggests ontological priority in the Laozi. The process of creation does proceed from unity to multiplicity, but the Laozi is only concerned to show that “two” would be impossible without the idea of “one.” The assertion “One gives birth to Two” affirms that duality presupposes unity; to render it as “The One gave birth to the Two” is to turn what is essentially a logical relation into a cosmological event.

As the source of being, Dao cannot be itself a being, no matter how powerful or perfect; otherwise, the problem of infinite regress cannot be overcome. For this reason, the Laozi makes use of the concept of wu, “nonbeing,” not to suggest a substance or something of which nothing can be said, but to signify the conceptual “otherness” and radical transcendence of the ground of being.

This agrees with Wang Bi's interpretation. If wu points to a necessary ontological foundation, the distinction between “Dao” and “One” seems redundant. Commenting on chapter 42 of the Laozi, Wang Bi writes, “One can be said to be wu”; “One is the beginning of numbers and the ultimate of things” (commentary on ch. 39; see also Wang's commentary on the Yijing, trans. in Lynn 1994, 60). The concept of “One” and the concept of wu thus complement each other in disclosing different aspects of the logic of creation — both unity and nonbeing are necessary for understanding the generation of beings.

Comparing the two interpretations, whereas the first, “cosmological” reading has to explain the sense in which the Dao can be said to be “nothing,” the second emphasizes the centrality of wu, for which “Dao” is but one designation. Depending on the interpretation, wu may be translated as “nothing” or “nonbeing” accordingly. The metaphor of “Dao” is apt. It shows that all things are derived ultimately from an absolute “beginning,” in either sense of the word, like the start of a pathway. It also suggests a direction to be followed, which brings out the ethical interest of the Laozi.

The Daodejing is concerned with both Dao and de. The graph de has also made it into the Oxford: “In Taoism, the essence of Tao inherent in all beings”; “in Confucianism and in extended use, moral virtue.” De has been translated variously as virtue, potency, efficacy, integrity, or power (for an etymological study, see Nivison 1978-79, and Hall and Ames 1987, 216). The Confucian usage is quite clear; virtue is a matter of moral character and presupposes self-cultivation. The Laozi seems to be suggesting a “higher” de against any moral achievement attained through repeated effort (e.g., ch. 38). The different translations aim at bringing out the uniquely Daoist sense of the term. In Latin, as many scholars have noted, “virtue” has to do with strength and capacity. Though ambiguous, “virtue” reminds us that the Laozi is giving new meaning to an established concept, as opposed to introducing a new concept not found in other schools of Chinese philosophy.

The marriage of Dao and de effectively bridges the gap between transcendence and immanence. Traditional commentaries beginning with the Hanfeizi often play on the homonymic relation between de (virtue) and another graph also pronounced de, which means to “acquire” or “obtain” something. De is thus what one has “obtained” from (the) Dao, a “latent power” by “virtue” of which any being becomes what it is (Waley 1958, 32). In this sense, the Laozi speaks of de as that which nourishes all beings (e.g., ch. 51).

Within these parameters, interpretations of de follow from the understanding of Dao and wu. On the one hand, for Heshanggong and other proponents of the cosmological view, what one has obtained from the Dao refers specifically to one's qi-endowment, which determines one's physical, intellectual, moral, and spiritual capacity. Read this way, the Daodejing should be translated as the “Classic of the Way and Its Virtue,” given that de is understood to have emanated from the Dao.

On the other hand, for Wang Bi and others who do not subscribe to a substantive view of Dao, de represents what is “genuine” or “authentic” (zhen) in human beings (e.g., see Wang Bi's commentary on Laozi chs. 3, 5, 16, 51). Because wu does not refer to any substance or cosmological power, what the Laozi means by de, the “virtue” that one has “obtained” from Dao, can only be understood as what is originally, naturally present in human beings.

In either case, the concept of de emerges as a Daoist response to the question of human nature, which was one of the most contested issues in early Chinese philosophy. The two readings of the Laozi, despite their differences, agree that there is a prescriptive side to de. The empowerment enables a person to conform to the way in which Dao operates. When realized, “virtue” signifies the full embodiment of the Dao or the flourishing of authenticity. As such, Dao points not only to the “beginning” but also through de to the “end” of all things.

The Laozi makes use of the concept of ziran, literally what is “self (zi) so (ran),” to describe the workings of Dao. As an abstract concept, it gives no specific information, except to say that Dao does not “model” after anything (ch. 25). However, since “heaven and earth” — interpreted as nature in most modern studies — are said to be born of Dao and come to be in virtue of their de, the Laozi is in effect saying that the ways of nature reflect the function of Dao. In a cosmological reading, this suggests an understanding of nature as governed by the operation of qi-energies in an ideal yin-yang system characterized by harmony and fecundity. As interpreted by Wang Bi, the Laozi means more generally that there are “principles” (li) inherent in nature.

Human beings are, in turn, born of heaven and earth and so are “modeled” after them, either in terms of their qi-constitution or in the sense that they are governed also by the same basic principles. Usually translated as “naturalness” or “spontaneity,” ziran thus builds on the concept of de in suggesting not only that the power of Dao finds expression in nature but also at the practical level a mode of being and way of action in accordance with the ways of nature.

Nature in the Daoist sense, it is important to note, need not exclude the spiritual and the social. The existence of gods and spirits was hardly questioned in early China. The Laozi makes clear that they, too, stem from Dao and form a part of the order of ziran (e.g., chs. 39, 60). Further, “nature” encompasses not only natural phenomena but also sociopolitical institutions. The king clearly occupies a central place in the realm of Dao (chs. 16, 25); the family also should be regarded as a “natural” institution (chs. 18, 54). As an ethical concept, ziran thus extends beyond the personal to the sociopolitical level. It is worth mentioning that ziran remains an influential idea today, especially in conceptions of romantic love and beauty in Chinese thinking.

The concept of wuwei, “nonaction,” serves to explain naturalness in practice. “Nonaction” is awkward, and some translators prefer “non-assertive action,” “non-coercive action” or “effortless action,” but it identifies wuwei as a technical term. It does not mean total inaction. Later Daoists may see a close connection between wuwei and techniques of spiritual cultivation — the practice of “sitting in forgetfulness” (zuowang) discussed in the Zhuangzi is often mentioned in this regard. In the Laozi, the concept seems to be used more broadly as a contrast against any form of action characterized especially by self-serving desire (e.g., chs. 3, 37).

It is useful to recall the late Zhou context, where disorder marched on every front. The Laozi, one assumes, is not indifferent to the forces of disintegration tearing the country asunder, although the remedy it proposes is subject to interpretation. The problems of political decline are traced to excessive desire, a violation of ziran. Nonaction entails at the personal level simplicity and quietude, which naturally follow from having few desires. At the political level, the Laozi condemns aggressive measures such as war (ch. 30), cruel punishment (ch. 74), and heavy taxation (ch. 75), which reflect but the ruler's own desire for wealth and power. If the ruler could rid himself of desire, according to the Laozi, the world would be at peace of its own accord (chs. 37, 57).

In this sense, the Laozi describes the ideal sage-ruler as someone who understands and follows ziran (e.g., chs. 2, 17, 64). In this same sense, it also opposes the Confucian program of benevolent intervention, which as the Laozi understands it, addresses at best the symptoms but not the root cause of the disease. The Confucian project is in fact symptomatic of the decline of the rule of Dao. Conscious efforts at cultivating moral virtues only accentuate the loss of natural goodness, which in its original state would have been entirely commonplace and would not have warranted distinction or special attention (chs. 18, 38). Worse, Confucian ethics assumes that learning and moral self-cultivation can bring about personal and social improvement. From the Daoist perspective, artificial effort to “improve” things or to correct the order of ziran only fuels a false sense of self that alienates human beings from their inherent “virtue.”

The concept of nonaction is exceedingly rich. It brings into play a cutting discernment that value distinctions are ideological, that human striving and competitive strife spring from the same source. Nonaction entails also a critique of language and conventional knowledge, which to the Daoist sage has become impregnated with ideological contaminants.

The use of paradoxes in the Laozi especially heightens this point. For example, the person of Dao is depicted as “witless” or “dumb,” whereas people driven by desire appear intelligent and can scheme with cunning (ch. 20). The way of learning, as one would normally understand it,“increases” the store of knowledge and adds value to goods and services; in contrast, questioning the very meaning of such “knowledge” and “value,” the Laozi describes the pursuit of Dao as constantly “decreasing” or chipping away at the artifice built by desire (ch. 48). Driving home the same point, to cite but one more example, the Laozi states, “The highest virtue is not virtuous; therefore it has virtue” (ch. 38). In other words, those who fully realize “virtue” in the Daoist sense do not act in the way that men and women of conventional morality typically act or are expected to act. Paradoxes of this kind function as a powerful rhetorical device, which forces the reader, so to speak, to move out of his or her “comfort zone” and to take note of the proposed higher truth of Dao (see also, e.g., chs. 41, 45, 56). In this context, one can also understand some of the provocative statements in the Laozi telling the ruler, for example, to keep the people in a state of “ignorance” (ch. 65).

Some scholars would object that this interpretation misses the religious import of the Daodejing, while others would question whether it is too eager to defend the philosophical coherence of the classic. Perhaps the Laozi in chapter 65 of the current text did mean to tell the ruler literally to keep the people ignorant or stupid for better control, which as a piece of political advice is not exactly extraordinary. The remarks offered here take nonaction as central to the Daoist view of life, taking into account that the concept of wuwei does not only initiate a critique of value but also points to a higher mode of knowledge, action, and being.

At the critical level, the Laozi emphasizes the relativity of knowledge and value. Things appear big or small only in relation to other things; knowledge and ignorance are meaningful only in relation to each other. Good and bad, being and nonbeing, and other opposites should be understood in the same light (ch. 2). Distinctions as such are not necessarily problematic; for example, an object can be described as rare or difficult to find as compared with other objects. Problems arise, however, when objects that are rare are deemed more valuable than commonplace objects, when “big” is deemed superior to “small,” or in general terms when distinctions become a basis for value discrimination. When certain things or features (e.g., precious stones, reputation, being slim, skin color) are regarded as “beautiful” or “worthy” — i.e., desirable — other things will inevitably be deemed “ugly” and “unworthy,” with serious social, economic, and political consequences (ch. 3).

The recognition of the relativity of value does not end in a kind of ethical paralysis. The Laozi also does not appear to be advocating the obliteration of all distinctions, and by extension civilization as a whole, in a state of mystical oneness. For example, while there is some concern that technology may bring a false sense of progress, the antidote does not lie in a deliberate rejection of technology but rather in a life of natural simplicity and contentment that stems from having few desires (ch. 80).

The critique of value demonstrates the way in which desire (yu), as distinguished from basic needs, perverts the mind — xin, literally, “heart” — and colors our judgment and experience of reality. Nonaction contrasts sharply, according to the Laozi, with the way people typically act, with profit motives, calculated steps, expectations, longings, regrets, and other expressions of desire. In this way, the Laozi aims at making us understand why we do what we do.

As a philosophical concept, wuwei intimates a mode of being that governs existential engagement at all levels, transforming the way in which we think, feel, and experience the world. It does not stipulate what one ought to do or ought not to do in particular cases. Terms such as quietude, emptiness, and simplicity favored by the Laozi describe a general ethical orientation rather than specific practices. Although in following wuwei there are things that a person of Dao naturally would not do (e.g., wage a war of aggression), and there is a sense in which doing less may be more productive than self-conscious over-exertion, philosophically wuwei is not about not doing certain things (thus, military engagement is not ruled out entirely — e.g., see chs. 67, 68, 69) but suggests a reorientation of perception and value that ideally would bring an end to the dominance of desire and a return to the order of ziran.

Nonaction need not exclude meditation or other forms of spiritual practice; the point is rather that once realized, the transformative power of nonaction would ensure not only personal fulfillment but also sociopolitical order. This seems to weigh against a mystical reading of the Laozi, if mysticism is understood to entail a kind of personal union with the Dao transcending all political interests. The concept of “virtue,” whether interpreted in terms of authenticity or the purity and fullness of qi-energy, depicts a pristine natural and sociopolitical order in which naturalness and nonaction are the norm. The ethics of wuwei rests on this insight.

In this interpretive framework, a number of symbols which both delight and puzzle readers of the Laozi can be highlighted. Suggestive of its creativity and nurturance, Dao is likened to a mother (e.g., chs. 1, 25). This complements the paradigm of the feminine (e.g., chs. 6, 28), whose “virtue” is seen to yield fecundity and to find expression in yieldingness and non-contention. The infant (e.g., chs. 52, 55) serves as a fitting symbol on two counts. First, it brings out the relationship between Dao and world; second, the kind of innocence and wholesome spontaneity represented by the infant exemplifies the pristine fullness of de in the ideal Daoist world.

Natural symbols such as water (e.g., chs. 8, 78) further reinforce the sense of yielding and deep strength that characterizes nonaction. The low-lying and fertile valley (e.g., chs. 28, 39) accentuates both the creative fecundity of Dao and the gentle nurturance of its power. Carefully crafted and ornately decorated objects are treasured by the world, and as such can be used as a powerful symbol for it. In contrast, the utterly simple, unaffected, and seemingly valueless pu, a plain uncarved block of wood, brings into sharp relief the integrity of Daoist virtue and of the person who embodies it (e.g., chs. 28, 32). Finally, one may mention the notion of reversal (e.g., chs. 40, 65), which suggests not only the need to “return” to Dao, but also that the Daoist way of life would inevitably appear the very opposite of “normal” existence, and that it involves a complete revaluation of values.

In sum, any interpretation of the current Laozi as a whole must take into account the way in which wuwei and ziran provide a guide to the good life. Specifically, two related issues need to be addressed. First, naturalness and nonaction are seen to reflect the function of the nameless and formless Dao. As such, ethical ideals are anchored in a non-empirical view of nature, which raises the concept of de to a higher level than “virtues” in the sense of moral attainments.

The understanding of de, however, is dependent on that of Dao, which in turn hinges on the interpretation of wu as either original substance or nonbeing. Both readings are plausible, although I am more inclined toward the former. A cosmological reading is attractive also because it aligns the Laozi more closely with other early Chinese philosophical texts. However, an ontological reading emphasizing the conceptual nature of wu has the advantage of allowing the reader to draw out more readily the philosophical implications of the Laozi; it cannot be ruled out, especially if the only appeal is to a perceived evolutionary development in Chinese philosophy.

The second issue concerns the ethics of the Laozi. As mentioned, one main approach to the classic stresses its political orientation. In many chapters, the text seems to be addressing the ruler or the ruling elite, explaining to them the ideal government of the Daoist sage. This is not surprising given the Zhou context and given that the production of written documents and the access to them were generally the preserve of the ruling class in ancient China. But this need not restrict interpretation to politics in the narrow sense of statecraft or political strategies. In the light of the emphasis on ziran and wuwei, there is sufficient evidence that the Laozi views politics in a larger ethical context. The more difficult question is whether wuwei suggests a kind of moral relativism that would render any suggestion of a “higher” Daoist truth problematic.

If things are relative, they should be regarded as being of equal value. There are no objective criteria beyond relative utility for specific purposes in favoring, for example, what is “soft” over something “hard.” Yet, as D. C. Lau (1963) has pointed out, at the ethical level the Laozi seems to favor the “lower” term — for example, the “weakness” or “yieldingness” of water is singled out as a metaphor for ideal ethical conduct (ch. 78). We have suggested that the Laozi makes use of a critical mode to deconstruct conventional knowledge and value. The sense of moral relativity, however, gives way to a “higher” ethical mode based on insight into the order of ziran derived from an idealized view of nature. In this sense, the Laozi thus also makes use of such expressions as the “highest good” (ch. 8) and “highest virtue” (ch. 38). Wuwei ultimately derives its meaning from wu, which as an ethical orientation privileges “not having” over the constant strivings of the mundane world. This constitutes a powerful critique of a world given to the pursuit of wealth and power. More important, in being “empty,” the person of Dao is said to be “full”; without desire, he or she is able to rediscover the riches of ziran and finds fulfillment. This invites reflection and continuing dialogue with the Laozi.


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Transliteration of Chinese terms in this article follows the hanyu pinyin romanization system, except for a few proper names and quotations. Some of the material presented above first appeared in “The Daodejing and Its Tradition,” Daoism Handbook, edited by Livia Kohn [Leiden: E. J. Brill, 1999], pp. 1-29; permission by the publisher to rework them here is gratefully acknowledged.