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Problems Facing Dynamic Encyclopedias

There are a number of problems that face the production of a dynamic encyclopedia. First and foremost is the problem of quality control. Whereas all encyclopedias face the problem of choosing high quality board members and authors and the problem of editing entries, the dynamic encyclopedia has the further problem of evaluating changes to entries because authors have the right to access and change their entries when the occasion arises. In a static encyclopedia, once board members and authors are chosen, there is a single further step of quality control which involves the careful editing of submitted entries, so that errors are not published in the fixed medium. In contrast, a dynamic encyclopedia needs a systematic method of evaluating both the new entries posted to the encyclopedia and the subsequent changes made to those entries.

Second, there are the problems involved in producing an electronic work, such as maintaining a uniform entry style and familiarizing authors with markup languages and electronic file transfer.

Third, there are the problems of automating routine editorial and administrative tasks so that the encyclopedia can be set-up and maintained without a large staff. For example, the following processes can be automated: creating accounts for the authors, sending them email about their accounts and the ftp commands they might need, monitoring changes in the content to entries, updating the table of contents, cross-referencing entries, modifying the email aliases (such as the list of the authors' email addresses), notifying the board members that entries for which they are responsible have been changed, etc.

Fourth, there are the issues of copyright. Who should own the copyright to individual entries? Who has the responsibility for obtaining permission to display photographs? What rights do the authors have over their entries? What rights does the encyclopedia have to republish entries in altered form?

Fifth, there are the problems of maintaining the encyclopedia. How often should authors be expected to update their entries? What happens when an author no longer wants to be responsible for updating his or her entry? How do we turn over an entry to a new author? Under what conditions should the encyclopedia allow multiple entries for a single topic?

Sixth, there are the problems of site security. How does one prevent authors or anyone else from gaining access to other parts of the encyclopedia. What if an article is accidentally deleted or damaged?

Finally, there are the issues of citation and digital preservation. How should people using the Encyclopedia cite the articles? What happens if the cited material is subsequently deleted when an author updates or modifies the entry? How will the Encyclopedia be preserved so that the material will always be available for scholarly research in the same way that the citations to current and past encyclopedias are available?

next up previous
Next: Solutions to the Problems Up: Introduction Previous: Computer Supported Collaborative Work

Eric Hammer and Edward N. Zalta
Wed May 14 17:44:00 PDT 1997