next up previous
Next: Conclusion Up: Introduction Previous: Problems Facing Dynamic Encyclopedias

Solutions to the Problems

Quality Control

Like other high-quality reference works, the authors of entries will be nominated and/or approved by a carefully selected board of editors and the entries themselves will be subject to critical evaluation. But given that the authors have the right to access and change their entries at will, the dynamic encyclopedia has the special problem of how to evaluate updates to entries. Our solution is to monitor changes to each entry and to notify both the Editor and the editorial board member responsible for that particular entry. When notified of a change, the Editor immediately verifies that the entry has not been accidentally or maliciously damaged. More importantly, however, we have written a script that will send out email notices to the relevant board member automatically, not only when the entry is first transferred to the encyclopedia, but also when any changes are made thereafter.* A problem with this procedure is that Board members will be notified even if there have been trivial modifications to entries. Though we have configured our script so that changes that the Editor makes to an entry (to fix typographical errors, HTML formatting errors, etc.) are not reported, we are planning to make our script `smarter', so that it reports to the Board member only significant changes to content made by the author.*

Given that entries in the dynamic encyclopedia can be modified, the authors can improve their entries not only in response to comments from the relevant Board member, but also in response to comments received from colleagues in the field. The latter may also be aware of relevant research not mentioned in the article. However, this introduces a controversial element, since commentators might not be satisfied by the modifications, if any, that authors make in response to their comments and may therefore write to the Editors to make their case. So the Editors and Board members of a dynamic encyclopedia must be prepared to moderate between authors and such commentators.

As a final resort, the Editors can always remove entries should the authors fail to respond to valid criticism, from whatever source.


To solve the problems of production, we have created an annotated HTML sourcefile of a sample entry. The authors may use this sourcefile as a model, replacing its content with their own content.* We created a list of HTML manuals available on the World Wide Web and linked this list into the Editorial Information page of the Encyclopedia. For those authors with HTML experience, we created a empty template sourcefile defining the basic entry format, which they can download and simply fill in with their content. Recently, however, a wide variety of HTML-editors have become available and we have created a special page containing links directly to the download archives containing these editors. So the simplest way for an author with no HTML experience to create an entry would be for him or her to first download Netscape Navigator Gold from the archive, download our HTML template from the Encyclopedia, load the template into Navigator Gold, and then complete their entry simply by selecting text that they have entered and using menu items provided by Navigator Gold to format the text automatically.

Instructions which explain these options are automatically sent to the authors when we set up their accounts. These instructions also explain to the authors how to ftp their entry to our machine and get them into webspace once they have created the HTML sourcefile for their entry and tested it locally on their own computer. We have organized the author accounts in such a way that files transferred into the author's home directory immediately become a part of the encyclopedia.*


We have automated many of the routine editorial tasks so that the encyclopedia can be administered without a large staff. We have written UNIX and perl scripts to do the following: create accounts for the authors (from keyboard input by the Editors), send the authors email about their account and the ftp commands they might need, take notice of newly submitted entries, monitor changes in the content to entries, manage the cross-referencing between encyclopedia entries by linking keywords of new entries to other entries, modify the email aliases such as `authors' (which contains a list of the email addresses of all the authors), and notify the board members that entries for which they are responsible have been changed. Here is a more detailed description of some of the scripts that have been written:

new-author script: This script will perform the system tasks necessary to add a new author to the encyclopedia. The script automatically sets up an account and home directory for the author with the proper access privileges (i.e., `write' privileges for the author and the editors only), updates the encyclopedia archives (databases with information about authors and their entries), and mails customized information to the author about how to prepare his or her entry, access his or her account, and transfer the new entry to the encyclopedia's machine.

asterisks script: When an entry is assigned but not yet written, the name of the entry in the table of contents is marked with an asterisk. The `asterisks' script notices when an author has ftp'd a new entry to the encyclopedia and then removes the asterisk from the table of contents.

modifications script: This script sends email on a regular schedule to the Editorial Board members indicating which entries have been modified on which date. It determines which Board member is in charge of the entry and updates that Board member's log file with the filename, author, and date the file was modified.

encyclopedia script: This script is a database manager. It extracts and modifies information in the encyclopedia's databases. Among the tasks it performs are: (a) provide information about an author, (b) provide information about a board member, (c) provide information about an entry, (d) list authors by last name, (e) list keywords to be used for cross-referencing completed entries, (f) add a keyword to the database, (g) remove a keyword from the database, (h) list the entry associated with a keyword, and (i) list all keywords for a given entry.

keyword script: This script verifies and, if necessary, updates the keyword cross-referencing links between entries. When a new entry is submitted, the script notifies the Editor if the author has included keywords for which there are no entries in the table of contents. The Editor can then decide either to add the entry to the encyclopedia (or associate the keyword with an existing entry) or to remove the keyword. The script also verifies that keywords for which authors have included links are linked to the correct entries. Finally, any keyword references to the new entry in previously written entries are automatically linked to the new entry by the script.

It should be mentioned that the selection of keywords is, in the first instance, carried out by the members of the Board of Editors at the stage when they identify topics for inclusion in the Encyclopedia. Since each board member will be chosen for his or her expertise in a philosophy subspecialty, the selection of topics and their corresponding keywords will be driven initially by the perspective that the board members have on their fields. However, the authors will also determine and list the concepts that are essential to understanding the entry they have contributed. When there are discrepancies between the concepts listed by the author and the topics identified by the board member, it will be the job of the Editor to work with these individuals and find the best way to organize the Encyclopedia. These judgements cannot always be made a priori and the keyword script identifies when such judgements have to be made.

Copyright Protection

Authors are instructed to read the encyclopedia's copyright notice before transferring their entry to the encyclopedia. The transfer of their entry constitutes an implicit acceptance of the copyright terms stated. The notice has three parts:*

Copyright Notice. Authors contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy retain copyright to their entry or entries but grant to Stanford University and the Editor an exclusive license to publish their entry or entries on the Internet. All rights not expressly granted to the University and Editor are retained by the authors. Copyright of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy itself is held by Stanford University and the Editor. All rights are reserved. No part of the Encyclopedia (excluding individual contributions and works derived solely from those contributions, for which rights are reserved by the individual authors) may be reprinted, reproduced, stored, or utilized in any form, by any electronic, mechanical, or other means, now known or hereafter invented, including printing, photocopying, saving (on disk), broadcasting or recording, or in any information storage or retrieval system, other than for purposes of fair use, without written permission from the Editor.
While this part gives authors copyright over their entries, the authors in turn give Stanford University and the Editor an exclusive license to publish the entry on the Internet. Note that to view an entry, the web browser accessing it makes a complete copy of the entry somewhere in the user's machine. We are assuming that such copying of entries qualifies as fair use, and is not ruled out by this portion of the copyright notice.
Licensing Agreement. By contributing to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy authors grant to Stanford University and the Editor a perpetual, exclusive, worldwide right to copy, distribute, transmit and publish their contribution on the Internet. The authors also grant to the University and Editor a perpetual, non-exclusive, worldwide right to copy, distribute, transmit and publish any and all derivative works prepared or modified by the Editor from the original contribution, in whole or in part, by any variety of methods on all types of publication and broadcast media, now known or hereafter invented. Authors also grant to Stanford University and the Editor a perpetual, non-exclusive, worldwide right to translate their contribution, as well as any modified or derivative works, into any and all languages for the same purposes of copying, distributing, transmitting and publishing their work.
This part gives the Editor a license to use and modify submitted entries. The license gives the Editor the exclusive right to publish the entry on the Internet, using whatever technology is currently available, and a non-exclusive right to publish the entry in other media. It also gives the Editor the right to publish portions of an entry. For example, if someone searches the encyclopedia, a search engine will return only those portions of an entry relevant to the search keyword(s). The Editor may also wish to include a portion of an entry in an advertisement for the encyclopedia or in a description of the encyclopedia. Finally, it gives the Editor the right to modify entries, for example, to add links in the sourcefile to other entries or change the way entries are formatted.
Statement of Liability. By contributing to the Encyclopedia authors grant to Stanford University and the Editor immunity from all liability arising from their work. All authors are responsible for securing permission to use any copyrighted material, including graphics, quotations, and photographs, within their articles. The University and the Editor of the Encyclopedia therefore disclaim any and all responsibility for copyright violations and any other form of liability arising from the content of the Encyclopedia or from any material linked to the Encyclopedia.
Because authors have access to their entries, they could include copyrighted material in an entry without the Editor's knowledge. Moreover, there is an interval between the time when an entry is modified and the time when it is checked. This clause protects the encyclopedia and its Editors from any problems with entries arising from these situations.


Dynamic encyclopedias require infrequent but regular maintenance by the authors and Board members, and require only moderate maintenance by the Editor. Once the Board and authors have been selected and the entries have been written, maintenance of the encyclopedia will primarily involve revisions by authors and examinations of the revisions by the board members. The Editor will only need to handle activities that are not automated, such as communicating with authors and the board concerning any problems that arise, troubleshooting the operation of the encyclopedia, and commissioning new entries as new concepts become important.

We suggest that authors update their entries at least once every year. When an author no longer wishes to maintain his or her entry, the Editors and author have several options. One is to leave it in the encyclopedia, indicating that no further revisions will be made. It may come to be of historical interest. The Editor will then have to commission another author to write a second entry on the same topic. A second option is to transfer maintenance of the original entry to someone else, with the details to be worked out between the original author and the new author.


For the most part, the security problems of a dynamic encyclopedia are the usual security problems of system administration. We have given our authors an `ftp account' on our machine rather than setting up an anonymous ftp server.* So only authors and the Editor can submit or modify entries. Moreover, an author can only modify entries in his or her own home directory.

The only way to protect against malicious and unauthorized access to the machine is to back it up on a regular basis. This also protects the encyclopedia against machine failures. We back up our encyclopedia onto tape and also onto an external hard drive.* This external hard drive has been configured as a boot disk and contains all the system software necessary to run the Encyclopedia. In case the machine that runs the Encyclopedia experiences catastrophic failure, we can install the external hard drive into one of our backup UNIX workstations and reboot, a process that takes fifteen minutes.

Citation and Digital Preservation

We propose that citations to our Encyclopedia conform to the Modern Languages Association style for the citation of electronic sources. The `MLA-style' format for citation is:*

Author's Lastname, Author's Firstname. "Title of Document." Title of Complete Work (if applicable). Version or File Number, if applicable. Document date or date of last revision (if different from access date). Protocol and address, access path or directories (date of access).
So, for example, a citation to our entry on Bertrand Russell, would look like this:
Irvine, Andrew. "Bertrand Russell." Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. January 28, 1997. (October 12, 1997)

So that cited material does not disappear when entries are revised, we have decided to fix a quarterly edition of the Encyclopedia and store those editions online on a special `Archive Page' of the Encyclopedia. By checking and citing the most recent quarterly edition, one can be sure that the material being cited won't disappear. Thus, the citation to the entry on Bertrand Russell becomes:

Irvine, Andrew. Bertrand Russell." Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Fall 1997 Edition. (October 12, 1997)
We are currently exploring whether there are any other alternatives to fixing a quarterly edition.*

Long term preservation of digital information is a somewhat more global problem than secure backup. From the previous section, it should be clear that on any given day, there exist three copies of the Encyclopedia (one on the principal computer, one on external hard drive and one recoverable from the backup tapes).* We maintain an archive of the backup tapes of the Encyclopedia in a separate building. We also have several similar UNIX workstations in the lab housing the main Encyclopedia workstation and each of these computers could serve as a backup machine. As long as we maintain the present edition and past quarterly editions on 3 separate hardware devices (transferring the data to new technology as it becomes available) and follow the security measures outlined above (employing whatever new backup systems become available), we will have adequately safeguarded the material that appears in our Encyclopedia for scholarly research far into the future.

next up previous
Next: Conclusion Up: Introduction Previous: Problems Facing Dynamic Encyclopedias

Eric Hammer and Edward N. Zalta
Wed May 14 17:44:00 PDT 1997