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Human beings, like all other organic creatures, die and their bodies decay. Nevertheless, there is a widespread and long-standing belief that in some way death is survivable, that there is “life after death.” The focus in this article is on the possibility that the individual who dies will somehow continue to live, or will resume life at a later time, and not on the specific forms such an afterlife might take. We begin by considering the logical possibility of survival, given different metaphysical views concerning the nature of the mind/soul, and then move on to consider possible arguments for and against the belief in survival.
- 1. Survival and its Alternatives
- 2. Objections to the Possibility of Survival — Dualism
- 3. Objections to the Possibility of Survival — Materialism
- 4. Empirical Support for Survival? Parapsychology and Near-Death Experiences
- 5. Metaphysical Considerations Concerning Survival
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
It matters to us what happens to us after we die. This statement is a truism to most reflective adults, and it is confirmed rather than contradicted by the contemporary culture of death-denial. One does not go to great lengths to deny, and avoid awareness of, that which is of little concern in the first place. It is also confirmed, against their intention, by the small band of philosophers who, ever since Epicurus, have maintained that “death is nothing to us.” A great deal of dialectical energy has been expended in order to sustain this deeply paradoxical assertion. But this effort tends to be self-defeating: things that really are “nothing to us” don't command that amount or intensity of attention.
In most cultures, this concern has taken the form of belief in some sort of personal afterlife, in which the same individual that lived and died nevertheless persists and continues to have new experiences. There are alternatives, however. The ancient Greeks are noted for having placed a high premium on “survival” in the memory and honor of the community — a practice reflected in our reference to deceased celebrities as (for example) “the immortal Babe Ruth.” (Strictly speaking, for the Greeks this was not a replacement for a personal afterlife, but rather a supplement to what was conceived as a rather colorless and unrewarding existence in Hades.) Such a hope, it would seem, provides a major consolation only if one is optimistic concerning the persistence and continued memory of the community, as well as the accuracy and justice of their judgments. An interesting variant of this is found in process theology, with its promise of “objective immortality” in the mind of God, who of course neither forgets nor misjudges the lives he remembers (Hartshorne 1962, p. 262). Another view, one whose implications for personal survival are unclear, is found in the Buddhist ideal of Nirvana. There are various accounts of Nirvana, and one widely held way of viewing it states that nothing can be said about it. Overall, it simply is not clear whether, and in what sense, it can be said that the same individual who lived on earth survives to experience Nirvana. It should not be overlooked, however, that the religious systems that posit Nirvana also have a need to affirm personal survival in a more straightforward sense. One must pass through innumerable cycles of the “wheel of rebirth” before one is ready for the final peace, and in these cycles the same individual must persist, otherwise the karmic outcomes would devolve on persons other than those who accumulated the karma in the first place. With this in view, it may be said that belief in some sort of personal survival has been nearly universal among known human cultures, though obviously it has not been accepted by all individuals in those cultures. Our primary topic in this article will be survival as such, rather than particular conceptions of the afterlife such as heaven and hell or reincarnation, and we begin by considering the logical possibility of life after death.
The possibility of survival cannot be considered without taking into account the nature of the human person. A natural way of thinking would seem to be that mind-body dualism is a “survival-friendly” metaphysical view, whereas materialism is inimical to survival. This may or may not turn out to be correct. However, the logical possibility of dualist survival — specifically, of disembodied survival — has been seriously questioned. The general form taken by such questioning lies in the assertion that we have no “criteria of identity” for disembodied persons. When we make judgments about the identity of persons we are not making judgments about the identity of souls. We cannot make judgments about the identity of souls, because souls are said to be imperceptible. And because of this, the identity of a person over time cannot consist of the identity of the person's soul over time. What we are able to identify — and reidentify — is a person's body. But once the person has died that body decomposes in a grave, and can't be the basis for our identification of the person who is supposed to have survived disembodied (Perry 1978, pp. 6–18).
This objection is confused (Hasker 1989, pp.208–09). It conflates two quite distinct questions, of which the first, or metaphysical question is, What does it mean to say that x at t1 is the same φ as y at t2? The second, epistemological question is How can we tell that x at t1 is the same φ as y at t2? The failure to distinguish these questions (a failure which may be due in part to Wittgenstein) is the source of serious philosophical confusions. The short answer to the first question is that normally, when we know what a φ is, we know also what it is for a φ at t1 to be the same individual φ as a φ at t2. The abnormal cases are those in which the φ at t1 has undergone changes, and we are unsure whether those changes amount to the destruction of the φ, or its replacement by another object, so that the very same φ cannot possibly have persisted until t2. The classic example is the ship of Theseus, but there are many others. In such cases, our first recourse is to seek to understand more accurately the concept of a φ — does our concept of a ship, for example, allow for the progressive replacement of all of the ship's parts, or not? But sometimes there may be no determinate answer to this question. Our concepts, after all, have been developed to deal with the sorts of contingencies that normally arise, and it may sometimes be possible to invent scenarios (or even to discover them empirically) that are not provided for in our ordinary usage of a concept. In that case, we must either provide for ourselves criteria to cover the novel situation (thus modifying our previous concept of a φ), or else admit that the question we were asking has no answer.
When we pose this question with regard to the persistence of immaterial souls, what we find is that there is no problem that needs a solution. We know what it is to be a subject of experience — to be a being that thinks, and believes, and desires various things, for example — and prima facie at least this does not entail being embodied. If we think of the immaterial soul in Cartesian terms, there simply isn't anything that can happen to such a soul (barring its being annihilated by God) that could cause it to cease to exist; Cartesian souls are “naturally immortal.” Some other dualist views may not opt for natural immortality of the soul, and if so they will need to say something about the sorts of changes that a soul can and cannot sustain if it is to remain in existence as the individual it was. But there is no problem here for the general hypothesis of survival as an immaterial soul (Hasker 1999, pp. 206–11).
The metaphysical question having been disposed of, it becomes apparent that the epistemological question is less significant than it may previously have appeared. How do we re-identify immaterial souls over time? Under normal circumstances, we do this by re-identifying the body that is animated by the soul in question. But not always: prior at least to the advent of DNA testing, cases of disputed identity could not always be settled by re-identifying bodies. Sometimes the subject's memory of events is an important clue, though not of course an infallible one. But can any tests establish the identity of a completely non-embodied subject? Evidently, the question of the identity of a non-embodied subject makes sense; those who consult spiritualist mediums certainly understand the question, whether they are conversing with dear departed Aunt Susie, or merely with a manipulative practitioner. But again, once it is seen that there is no metaphysical problem here, the epistemological question becomes purely a practical one, requiring to be answered if and when we have the need in practice to make such identifications.
There may still be an objection to this, to the effect that the idea of disembodied survival, even if not logically incoherent, is one we have don't have a sufficient grasp of to allow it to count as a real possibility. What would such survival amount to, anyway? Of course, if the souls of the departed are assumed to be fitted out immediately with resurrection bodies, this difficulty is greatly alleviated. But if the notion of an immaterial soul is to do any philosophical work, we need to be able to think what it might be like for such a soul to exist on its own, unembodied.
This challenge has been met in an interesting article by H. H. Price (Price 1953). Price spells out, in considerable detail, a notion of disembodied souls existing in a “world” of something like dream-images — images, however, that would be shared between a number of more or less like-minded, and telepathically interacting, souls. Included among these images would be images of one's own body and of other people's bodies, so that one might, at first, find it difficult to distinguish the image-world from the ordinary physical world we presently inhabit. The conception is similar to Berkeley's, except that Price does not invoke God directly as the sustainer of regularities in the image-world. He does say, however, that “if we are theists, we shall hold that the laws of nature, in other worlds as in this one, are in the end dependent on the will of a Divine Creator” (p. 390). I think anyone who reads, and seriously considers, Price's development of this idea will be forced to admit that he has given a reasonably clear account of what disembodied existence might be like. We need not follow Price in (what appears to be) his supposition that this is a plausible account of the actual state of persons who have died. It is enough if he has provided an account that makes plain the intelligibility of the notion of disembodied survival; the believer in an afterlife can then say, “If not in just this way, then in some other.”
Still other questions remain, of which the following is a sample: Suppose a person's soul were replaced instantaneously by another soul with the same memories, dispositions, and so on: how could we tell that this had happened? The conclusion drawn is that there is no difference between having a single soul and having a succession of souls, which reduces the notion of a soul to absurdity. But surely this moves too fast. Suppose a person's body were instantaneously annihilated, and after a gap of a nanosecond or so replaced by another body with identical characteristics. Again, how could we know this had occurred? (If the materialist can duplicate souls, the dualist can duplicate bodies.) These questions belong in the all-too-familiar category of evil-demon puzzles, and like other such puzzles the only appropriate response is to look them in the face and then move on. The mistake lies in assuming that they can be used to get rid of souls while leaving other, more respectable metaphysical beliefs unscathed.
If mind-body dualism is true, then, the logical possibility of survival is relatively unproblematic. But dualism has run upon hard times lately, and is widely regarded as being discredited. Whether or not this is true, dualism is undoubtedly subject to a number of objections, though these are not necessarily more severe than the difficulties that attend materialism. (See the entry on dualism, also Koons and Bealer (eds.) 2010.) In view of this we need to consider also the possibility of survival given some variety or other of materialism.
What are the prospects for survival on a materialistic view of persons? Materialists, of course, will not affirm immortality of the soul, but they have available an arguably preferable alternative in the form of bodily resurrection. Resurrection is in fact the standard view of the afterlife in all of the major theistic religions: Judaism, Christianity, and Islam. To be sure, there is no obvious, inherent incompatibility between the belief in an immaterial soul and the doctrine of bodily resurrection; in fact this combination has been the standard view in theology. But more recently a conflict has been discovered, or perhaps invented, between the views (Cullman 1955), and in any case those who are committed to materialism on the mind-body issue need to have their resurrection neat, uncontaminated by the suspect belief in immaterial souls.
The central logical problem for materialist versions of the resurrection is personal identity. On dualist assumptions, personal identity is preserved by the persistence of the soul between death and resurrection. But for materialism, nothing bridges the spatio-temporal gap between the body that perishes and the resurrection body; how then can the “resurrected” person be identical with the person who died? Considerable ingenuity has been expended in the search for an answer to this question.
Without doubt, the most popular materialist option here is the “re-creation” theory, according to which, at some time after a person's death, God re-creates the person by creating a body with the identical characteristics of the body that perished (Hick 1983, pp. 125–26). (Immediately thereafter God may proceed to improve the body in certain respects, such as correcting the disease or injury that led to death in the first place.) The problem is that this move does not seem to secure the necessity of the identity relation — and “identity” that is merely contingent is not identity at all. If God could create one body that is exactly similar to the body that died, why not two or more? It is not a satisfactory answer to this to say that God, being good, would not (and perhaps could not) do such a thing. On the view in question, what is necessary for resurrection is merely that material particles be arranged in the correct fashion, and it is hardly a necessary truth that only God could do this. (Perhaps a really smart rogue angel could pull it off!) Nor is it feasible to guarantee uniqueness by requiring that the identical particles present in the dead body make up the resurrection body. On the one hand, the body has no doubt shed, during its life, enough particles to make several bodies, and it is hardly credible that the replacement of one of the atoms present at the time of death with an atom shed by the body a few seconds before death would mean we have a different body (assuming other requirements to be satisfied). If, on the other hand, only particles from the body at the time of death may be used, there are the long-recognized problems about the availability of some of these particles, which within a few years may have made their ways into a large number of other human bodies. In any case there is a hard-to-quell intuition that reassembly, no matter how expertly completed, would at best produce a replica rather than the identical body that perished. Peter van Inwagen offers a compelling example:
Suppose a certain monastery claims to have in its possession a manuscript written in St. Augustine's own hand. And suppose the monks of this monastery further claim that this manuscript was burned by Arians in the year 457. It would immediately occur to me to ask how this manuscript, the one I can touch, could be the very manuscript that was burned in 457. Suppose their answer to this question is that God miraculously recreated Augustine's manuscript in 458. I should respond to this answer as follows: the deed it describes seems quite impossible, even as an accomplishment of omnipotence. God certainly might have created a perfect duplicate of the original manuscript, but it would not be that one; its earliest moment of existence would have been after Augustine's death; it would never have known the impress of his hand; it would not have been a part of the furniture of the world when he was alive; and so on.
Now suppose our monks were to reply by simply asserting that the manuscript now in their possession did know the impress of Augustine's hand; that it was a part of the furniture of the world when the Saint was alive; that when God recreated or restored it, He (as an indispensable component of accomplishing this task) saw to it that the object He produced had all these properties. I confess I should not know what to make of this. I should have to tell the monks that I did not see how what they believed could possibly be true. (van Inwagen 1992, pp. 242–43)
Given these difficulties with the re-creation view, attempts have been made to find other ways of accounting for resurrection in materialist terms. One of the more interesting of these is Lynne Rudder Baker's invocation of a constitution view of persons (Baker 2000, 2001, 2005). On this view persons are not identical with, but are constituted by, their bodies. (She discusses the constitution relation at considerable length; the details of this are not relevant here.) What is distinctive of persons is a “first-person perspective,” roughly, the capacity to think of oneself as oneself. This ability, which humans possess but other animals seem to lack, is an essential component of moral responsibility as well as of our ability to plan for the future and to perform many other distinctively personal activities and functions.
According to Baker, the constitution view opens the way for a doctrine of resurrection that avoids the difficulties of the re-creation theory. Since persons are not identical with their bodies, it need not be maintained that the resurrected body is the same identical body as the body that died. What is required, however, is that the first-person perspective of the resurrected body be the same: “if a person's first-person perspective were extinguished, the person would go out of existence” (2005, p. 385). So the first-person perspective must somehow be transferred from the original body to the resurrection body: “person P1 at t1 is the same person as person P2 at t2 if and only if P1 and P2 have the same first-person perspective” (2000, p. 132). Baker holds that there is indeed a fact of the matter as to whether a given future person has the same first-person perspective as I now have, though there is no “informative” way of specifying criteria of identity between the two.
It can be argued, however, that this criterion is not merely uninformative but is actually vacuous. To have a first-person perspective is to have the capacity to perform certain intentional acts of thinking and speaking. Such acts can in principle be qualitatively identical in different thinkers and speakers; what individuates them is the person who thinks or speaks. Which is to say: intentional acts derive their identity from the person performing them. But if this is true of the acts themselves it is also true of the first-person perspectives, which are nothing but the capacities of various persons to perform such acts. So to say that P1 and P2 have the same first-person perspective is just to say that P1 and P2 are the same person, and the criterion reduces to a tautology. We have not been given any help at all in understanding how a person, with her first-person perspective, can occupy first one body and then another.
Another proposal is offered by Kevin Corcoran (Corcoran 2005). Corcoran, like Baker, is a constitution theorist, but unlike Baker he does not believe persons can be transferred from one body to another. So the resurrection body does need to be identical with the body that died, and Corcoran has several different suggestions about how this might be possible. The one to be noted here, however, is what might be termed a “brute force” solution: “If God causes that body to exist once, why could God not cause it to exist a second time? … But what makes the first stage of the postgap body a different stage of the same body that perished is just that God makes it so” (p. 172). This comes extremely close to making identity over time a matter of convention – divine convention, to be sure, but convention all the same. (It is reminiscent of Jonathan Edwards' view that we are justly punished for Adam's sin in the Garden of Eden because God has decreed that the segment of Adam's life including the sin is a segment of our own lives also.)
I have left until last van Inwagen's own proposal for a materialist resurrection. For in spite of his criticisms of the common view, van Inwagen is himself a Christian and a believer in the resurrection. His proposal is stated as follows:
Perhaps at the moment of each man's death, God removes his corpse and replaces it with a simulacrum which is what is burned or rots. Or perhaps God is not quite so wholesale as this: perhaps He removes for “safekeeping” only the “core person” — the brain and central nervous system — or even some special part of it. These are details. (van Inwagen 1992, pp. 245–46)
Continuity is maintained, then, through the preservation of the body (or crucial body-part, such as the brain), and when the time comes for resurrection to occur, God restores life to the body in question and one's resurrected life can begin. In fairness, it should be pointed out that van Inwagen originally stated this proposal only in order to demonstrate the logical possibility of a materialist resurrection. In this he may well have succeeded. But as a proposal which is supposed to represent the actual way in which God enables humans to live again, the account has very little to recommend it. (In this view, God assumes the role of contemporary practitioners of cryonics, preserving the dead body until such time as it is revived and restored to health. But this is bad news for the actual practitioners, since the “bodies” they are preserving are mere simulacra and presumably incapable of being revived, even if all the technology functions flawlessly!) Furthermore, the feature of the account that makes it unacceptable — that God “spirits away” the crucial part of the person's body, leaving behind a simulacrum — is essential to the view's success in depicting a possible way of resurrection. In the Author's Note appended in 1992, van Inwagen says:
If I were writing a paper on this topic today, I should not make the definite statement “I think this is the only way such a being could accomplish it.” I am now inclined to think that there may well be other ways, ways that I am unable even to form an idea of because I lack the conceptual resources to do so. (1992, p. 246)
This entails that if we reject van Inwagen's story as implausible, other ways in which resurrection could be accomplished are at present inconceivable to us. It would seem that this offers at best minimal comfort to materialists who would like to believe in the resurrection!
It has not been shown conclusively that an identity-preserving materialist resurrection is impossible, but the difficulties, as outlined above, are formidable (Hasker 1999, pp. 211–31). Proponents of an afterlife, it seems, would be better served if they are able to espouse some variety of mind-body dualism. This entry cannot undertake an assessment of the comparative merits of dualism and materialism. It is worth noting, however, that recent philosophy has seen an increased recognition in some quarters of the difficulties resulting from materialist views, and a corresponding interest in different (not necessarily Cartesian) varieties of dualism. See Koons & Bealer (eds.) 2010, and Batthyani & Elitzur (eds.) 2009.
Is there empirical support for belief in an afterlife? One possible source of such support lies in parapsychology, a field of study which investigates phenomena that are alleged to lie outside the boundaries of ordinary naturalistic explanation. These phenomena include telepathy, clairvoyance, precognition, mediumistic messages, possession-type cases, reincarnation-type cases, apparitions, and others. Not all of these phenomena are directly relevant to survival and the afterlife, but some of them, if accepted as veridical, do provide such evidence: for instance, messages received through a medium, allegedly from a decesased person, that contain information to which the medium has no other access.
The evaluation of this body of evidence is highly contentious. Clearly there are both motive and opportunity for fraud and fabrication in many cases. It is questionable, however, whether a responsible inquirer can afford to dismiss out of hand all cases that seem to defy ordinary naturalistic explanation. It counts against this approach that the phenomena have been attested as probably veridical by a considerable number of highly reputable investigators, including such philosophers as William James, Henry Sidgwick, C. D. Broad, H. H. Price and John Beloff. These men had little to gain personally by their investigations; indeed in undertaking them they endangered already well-established reputations. These investigators have approached the subject with finely-honed critical instincts, and have applied stringent tests in selecting the instances they consider to be credible, rejecting many cases they held to be fraudulent or inadequately attested.
If we are willing to give an initial hearing to this evidence, what conclusions can reasonably be reached? A conclusion that many (but not all) of these investigators would accept is that the evidence provides some, but not conclusive, evidence for personal survival after death (Steinkamp 2002). However, the reason why the evidence is deemed inconclusive will give little comfort to many afterlife skeptics. The reason it is not conclusive is that the experiences are susceptible of a different explanation if we accept the existence of some rather spectacular forms of extra-sensory perception, also known as “super psi.” (See Braude 2002.) An example is a case in which a medium received information that apparently was known in its entirety to no living person. In order to avoid the conclusion that the information was communicated from the deceased person, the medium must be credited with clairvoyance as well as the ability to integrate information received telepathically from several different persons. C. D. Broad (Broad 1953, p. 114) summarized the situation well: the possibility of extra-sensory perception weakens the direct force of the evidence for survival by making possible alternative explanations of that evidence. But ESP strengthens the overall case by raising the antecedent probability of survival, insofar as it renders problematic the naturalistic view of the human person which for most contemporaries constitutes the greatest obstacle to belief in survival.
More recently, it has been claimed that a superior source of evidence lies in so-called “near-death experiences” (Bailey and Yates (eds.) 1996). These are experiences of persons who were, or perceived themselves to be, close to death; indeed many such persons met the criteria for clinical death. While in this state, they undergo remarkable experiences, often taken to be experiences of the world that awaits them after death. Returning to life, they testify to their experiences, claiming in many cases to have had their subsequent lives transformed as a result of the near-death experience. This testimony may seem especially compelling in that (a) large numbers of persons report having had such experiences; (b) the experiences come spontaneously to those near death, they are not sought out or deliberately induced; and (c) normally no one stands to benefit financially from either the experiences or the reports.
These experiences, furthermore, are not random in their contents. There are recurring elements that show up in many of these accounts, forming a general (but far from invariable) pattern. Typical elements include a sense of being dead, peacefulness and absence of pain; “out-of-body experiences” in which the subject views his or her own body “from outside” and witnesses various events, sometimes at a considerable distance from the location of the person's body; passing through a dark tunnel towards intense light; meeting “beings of light” (sometimes including friends and relatives who have died previously); and the “life review” in which the events of one's life pass before one and are subjected to evaluation. The subject may be initially disappointed or reluctant to return to the body, and (as already noted) many testify that the experience has been life-changing, leading to a lessened or absent fear of death and other beneficial results.
These experiences are surprisingly common. A Gallup poll taken in 1982 concluded that eight million Americans (about five percent of the adult population at that time) had survived a near-death experience. The experiences occur regardless of age, social class, race, or marital status. Probably the improvements in medical technology, which enable many to return from a state of “clinical death,” have increased the numbers in recent times. But NDEs have been reported throughout recorded history and from all corners of the earth . Since the publication in 1975 of Raymond Moody's book, Life After Life (Moody 1975), there have been numerous studies of the phenomenon, some of them carried out with careful attention to scientific objectivity (e.g., Ring 1980; Sabom 1982; van Lommel et al. 2001).
As one might expect, there is a wide variety in interpretations of NDEs, from those which take the experiences to be literally revelatory of a state that lies beyond death to debunking interpretations which see the experiences merely as a reflection of abnormal brain states. Clearly there is no one medical or physiological cause; the experiences occur for persons in a great variety of medical conditions. An interesting counterexample to explanations in terms of the “dying brain” is found in the NDEs experienced by mountain climbers in the midst of what they expected to be fatal falls (Heim 1892); it is hardly credible that these experiences can be put down either to drugs or to oxygen deprivation.
On the other hand, interpretations of NDEs as literally revelatory of the life to come, though common in the popular literature, are extremely questionable. Carol Zaleski has shown, through her comparative studies of medieval and modern NDEs, that many features of these experiences vary in ways that correspond to cultural expectations (Zaleski 1987). A striking instance of this is the minimal role played by judgment and damnation in modern NDEs; unlike the medieval cases, the modern life-review tends to be therapeutic in emphasis. In view of this, Zaleski ascribes the experiences to the religious imagination, insisting that to do so enhances rather than diminishes their significance. Claims of cross-cultural invariance in modern NDEs are also questionable. The majority of the research has been done in cultures where Christianity is the predominant religious influence, but research done in other cultures reveals significantly different patterns. One amusing difference occurs in the episodes in which it is decided that the experiencer will return to embodied life rather than remaining in the afterworld. In Western NDEs there is often a “spirit guide” who counsels the experiencer that it is better that he or she should return to life. In India, on the other hand, the person is often turned back with the information that there has been a clerical error in the paperwork, so that it was by mistake that he or she came to this point! (K. Augustine 2008, Other Internet Resources, see the section on “Cultural Differences.”)
The causation of these experiences is problematic. Some aspects of the experience have been deliberately induced by the administration of drugs (see Jansen 1997); this demonstrates that such phenomena can be produced by the brain, but in most NDE cases no such chemical causes can be identified. Several researchers have concluded that the triggering cause of the NDE is simply the perceived nearness of death. (NDEs have also been experienced by persons who believed they were close to death but were not in fact in any life-threatening situation (K. Augustine 2008, Other Internet Resources, see the section on Pam Reynolds).) The specific content of NDEs can be divided into mundane content, in which what is experienced is or resembles typical features of the ordinary world, and transcendental content, portraying “another realm” quite unlike the world of ordinary experience. The source of the transcendental content is problematic, though the cultural variations suggest that a significant role must be assigned to cultural expectations concerning the afterlife.
Finally, there is what Gary Habermas has termed the evidential aspect of NDEs. These are phenomena that, provided they can be verified, would indicate strongly that something is occurring that is not susceptible of an ordinary naturalistic explanation. This might seem to be the most helpful direction to look if the aim is to arrive an objectively compelling assessment of NDEs. If it should turn out to be possible to verify objectively certain paranormal aspects of NDEs, fully naturalistic explanations could be ruled out and the way would be open for further exploration concerning the meaning of the experiences. If on the other hand all such evidential aspects could be fully explained in terms of ordinary natural processes, the claim of NDEs to be revelatory of anything metaphysically significant would be greatly weakened.
Evidential aspects of NDEs fall into several categories. First, there are out-of-body sensory experiences, in which patients, often while comatose, observe accurately features to which they have no access through normal sensory channels. In one case an eight-year-old girl who nearly drowned required 45 minutes of CPR to restore her heartbeat:
In the meantime, she said that she floated out of her body and visited heaven. Additionally … she was able to totally and correctly recount the details from the time the paramedics arrived in her yard through the work performed later in the hospital emergency room. (Moreland and Habermas 1998, p. 159)
Second, there are accounts of sensory experiences which accurately report events that occurred during periods in which the subject's heart had stopped, and even during “flat EEG” periods in which there was no detectable brain activity. Finally, there are “surprise encounters” during the NDE with friends and relatives who had in fact recently died, but where the subject had no knowledge of this prior to the time of the experience. Here the crucial question would be, Where did the subject obtain knowledge of the other person's death? If ordinary channels of communication can be ruled out, the most natural conclusion would seem to be that this knowledge was obtained from the deceased person, who is somehow still alive.
All of these claims concerning the evidential value of NDEs have been called into question. One of the most thorough discussions is by Keith Augustine (Other Internet Resources, 2008), who draws on work by a large number of other researchers. As noted already, there is overwhelming evidence that NDEs do not provide a literal experience of conditions in the afterlife; this is attested, among other things, by the considerable variations in these experiences in different times and different cultures. Also relevant here is the fact that similar experiences sometimes happen to persons who mistakenly believe themselves to be in life-threatening circumstances. Apparently it is the perceived nearness to death, rather than the acual proximity of the afterworld, that triggers the experiences. The encounters with persons recently deceased, but whose deaths were previously unknown to the experiencer, become somewhat less impressive once it is recognized that still-living persons may also be encountered in NDEs (“Living Persons”). These still-living persons were otherwise occupied at the time of the NDEs; they cannot have been literally present in the other-worldly realm in which they were encountered. And given that still-living persons can appear in NDEs, it becomes statistically probable that on occsion there will also be encounters with persons who have recently died but whose death was unknown to the experiencer.
Claims that NDEs occurred during periods with no brain activity are countered by the rejoinder that an EEG may not reveal all activity within the brain. Functional magnetic resonance imaging, for example, can reveal activity that is missed by an EEG. In cases where brain activity has indeed ceased for a given patient, the NDE may have occurred either before the cessation or after normal brain activity has resumed; it is not necessary to assume that during the NDE the mind was active without the brain (“Living Persons”). With respect to the claim of information that was learned during the NDE that was not otherwise available, various answers are possible. It is noted, first of all, that inaccurate “information” is often reported (“Out-of-Body Discrepancies”). In some cases where the information is confirmed, we may be dealing with subsequent enhancement as a result of the repeated recital of the story. (This need not involve deliberate deception; it is a common experience that stories often repeated tend to gain new features of interest in the telling.) In other cases it is argued that the information was after all available through ordinary sensory channels, often through the experiencer's hearing of things said during a medical procedure when they were apparently unconscious and unresponsive. (There is considerable evidence that “unconscious” persons do hear and register things said when they are apparently oblivious to their surroundings.) (“Veridical Paranormal Perception During OBEs?”) It is however worth noting that Augustine makes little effort to establish that the factors cited in his naturalistic explanations were actually operative in the various NDE cases. It would appear to be his view that the burden of proof lies almost entirely on the shoulders of those who make claims on behalf of the evidential value of NDEs.
With regard to this entire body of evidence, both from parapsychology and from NDEs, we may be close to an impasse . Those who support the evidential value of the experiences will argue that the naturalistic explanations that have been offered are not adequate, that they display excessive skepticism towards well-confirmed accounts, and are in many instances highly speculative. Those who reject the evidential value of these phenomena (including some believers in the afterlife) will argue that the evidence is insufficient to warrant the extraordinary claims that are made, that the naturalistic explanations work well overall, and that a full explanation of the most puzzling cases would require a detailed knowledge of the events and surrounding circumstances that in many cases is not available to us. Further careful research on individual cases may offer some hope of progress, but it seems unlikely that the fundamental disagreements can be resolved, especially when the different viewpoints are supported by diverse worldview commitments.
Leaving aside such empirical evidence, what general metaphysical considerations are relevant to belief in survival? Clearly, a commitment to metaphysical naturalism virtually precludes belief in survival, and a materialistic view of human beings tends in the same direction. In contrast, belief in mind-body dualism would offer support at least in the sense that survival seems more likely if dualism is true than it does on materialist assumptions. Still, dualism by no means guarantees survival; the old arguments from the simplicity and alleged indestructibility of souls have for good reason gone out of favor. (As Kant observed, a “simple” soul, which cannot be dissolved into its constituent parts, might still fade away gradually until it has completely disappeared.) What often is not sufficiently appreciated, however, is the close tie between theism and belief in an afterlife. The point is not merely that theistic religions incorporate belief in an afterlife and many persons accept the belief because of this religious teaching. The tie is closer than that, and it has considerable force in both directions.
Suppose, on the one hand, that the God of theism does in fact exist. God is said to be both all-powerful and perfectly good, and this goodness is supposed to be of a sort that is relevant to the welfare of human beings (and other rational creatures, if there are any). Indeed, it is actually said that God loves us. If this is so, then it is highly plausible, to say the least, that he would wish to provide his creatures with the opportunity for a greater, and longer-lasting, fulfillment than is possible within the brief scope of earthly existence. This is especially true, one would think, for those who, through no fault of their own, find their lives blighted by disease, or accident, or war, or any of the other natural or man-made disasters to which we are vulnerable. But even those who enjoy relatively good and satisfying lives are conscious of far, far more that could be accomplished and enjoyed, given more time and the vigor and energy to use it well.
This argument can also be reversed to telling effect. If there is no afterlife, no realm in which the sorrows of this life can be assuaged and its injustices remedied, then the problem of evil becomes impossible to solve in any rationally intelligible way. That is not to say, of course, that allowing for an afterlife makes the problem easy; that is far from being the case. But it does provide a way in which the injustices of this life can be compensated and its evils defeated, and thus may bring us at least to the beginning of a feasible solution. For the reasons given, one would be hard pressed to find very many theists (as opposed to deists) who do not also affirm belief in an afterlife.
The argument in the opposite direction might seem to be weaker. There are, after all, major non-theistic religious traditions that affirm an afterlife. Noteworthy in this connection are Jainism, Buddhism, and non-theistic varieties of Hinduism, all of which affirm an afterlife in the form of the doctrines of karma and reincarnation. However, these traditions face a major internal difficulty, which if recognized would tend to push them in the direction of theism. This difficulty is what Robin Collins has termed the “karma management problem.” He writes,
Traditionally Buddhists have believed that by and large the circumstances of one's rebirth are determined by one's karma — that is, one's deeds, whether good or bad in this and previous lives. This, however, seems to require that there exist something like a “program” that arranges your genes, the family conditions you are born into, and the like to correspond to the moral worth of your past deeds (Collins 1999, p. 206).
For theists, such as many Hindus, this minute arrangement of one's life circumstances to match one's karma can be viewed simply as the work of God. But if there is no God, what is this “karma program,” and how was it initiated? We know today, by means that were not available to the ancient Hindus and Buddhists, that “nature” — the nature that is known and studied in the natural sciences — simply doesn't work this way. The laws of nature are subtle and marvelously complex (though also, in their own way, “simple”), but it is abundantly clear that they do not work in such a way as to determine physical situations in accordance with the moral worth of persons, or in accordance with any moral considerations whatsoever. The laws of nature, we might say, are no respecters of persons — or of morality. Rather, they are impersonal in character, and in many cases are expressible in mathematical formulae that are far removed from the teleology that permeates human existence. So if there is a “karmic moral order” of the sort postulated by the Indian traditions, it must be something radically different from the order of nature that (so far as science can discern) governs the physical processes of the world. And yet the two orders must be intimately related, for it is precisely these physical processes which, in the end, are said to be disposed in accordance with one's karma. It is wholly implausible that two diverse systems of cosmic order such as this should arise from unrelated sources and come together accidentally; they must, then, have a common source. If the common source of the natural order and the karmic order is impersonal, we are still in need of some account of how and why it would be such as to produce these two quite different sorts of order in the cosmos. These questions, it would seem, are much more readily answered if we postulate a personal source of both the natural and the moral order — that is to say, a God who desired that there be created persons, and who wished to provide a stable natural order within which they could live and exercise their varied powers.
This is of course a mere sketch of an argument which would require much more space for its full development. Still, it is hoped that even such a brief sketch provides some support for the claim that the doctrines of karma and reincarnation point towards theism rather than away from it. To be sure, not everyone who affirms an afterlife views it in terms of karma and reincarnation. Fortunately, the general line of argument given is not dependent upon this particular view of the afterlife. On the contrary, all known views require that conditions in the afterlife — whether in this world or another — be governed by some sort of moral order. This is evident for views that conceive the afterlife in terms of rewards and punishments for deeds done in one's previous life. But even in modern perspectives that downplay reward and punishment, it is taken for granted that conditions in the afterlife are morally benign — that persons are enabled to continue their lives in circumstances that are at least morally tolerable, and at best dramatically life-enhancing. Seldom if ever is it suggested that the afterlife will be the scene of tragedy, cruelty and injustice such as are all too common in our present existence. That kind of afterlife might well be seen as hellish rather than heavenly, at least for the less fortunate participants. (And if we contemplate the possibility of an endless series of such lives, this may help to elicit some appreciation for the Hindu and Buddhist view that the “wheel of rebirth” is an evil from which we should wish to be delivered.) So the upshot is this: On all commonly held views of life after death there is a moral order governing the afterlife, whatever its precise details may be. And if this is so, we are confronted with the question of the nature and source of such an order, a question which invites, and may in the end require, a theistic answer.
The close connection between theism and an afterlife is further confirmed by Kant's arguments for the “postulates of practical reason.” To be sure, Kant gives different reasons for postulating God and for postulating an afterlife, and the ends to be served by these postulations are ostensibly different. In actuality, however, it is highly plausible that the two postulates are inseparable. We ought to postulate God, because only in this way is it possible that in the end happiness should be enjoyed by persons in proportion to their moral desert. But given the actual conditions of the present life, it is evident that this end can be secured, if at all, only in a future existence. We are told to postulate immortality, because only an endless life makes possible continued progress towards the goal of a coincidence of one's will with the requirements of the moral law. But for such continued progress to be at all likely to occur would seem to require some kind of morally benign conditions in the afterlife, and Kant implicitly assumes that such conditions will obtain. As noted above, the existence of a moral order in the afterlife is something that requires explanation, and a theistic explanation may well be the best available.
Pointing out the close connection between theism and life after death does not as such constitute an argument for or against either hypothesis. Rather, it invites philosophers to consider the two beliefs together as a package — to consider arguments for and against theism as arguments for and against an afterlife, and vice versa. One result of this is that the problem of evil can reasonably be considered as an objection to belief in an afterlife as well as to belief in the existence of God Another interesting consequence is that the “argument from desire” for an afterlife might after all turn out to be sound! Without question, many persons strongly desire that there should be an afterlife, and believe in one largely if not entirely for that reason. It is also beyond question that most philosophers would regard this as a classic case of wishful thinking. But this conclusion is too hasty; indeed, it commits the fallacy of begging the question. To be sure, if the universe is naturalistic, then the desire that many persons have for an afterlife does not constitute any kind of evidence that an afterlife exists. One might inquire about the causes of such a desire and, given its widespread occurrence, might wonder about its possible Darwinian survival value. But no evidential weight would attach to the desire on the assumption of naturalism.
Suppose, on the other hand, that theism (or some view close to theism) is true. On this supposition, human life is not the accidental product of mindless forces that have operated with no thought to it or to anything else. On the contrary human life (and the life of other rational creatures, if there are any) is the product of an evolutionary process which was itself designed to produce such beings, by a God who loves them and cares for them. If this is so then there is a strong case to be made that desires which are universal, or near-universal, among human beings are desires for which satisfaction is possible. The inference does not amount to a certainty; it is possible that humans have distorted God's purpose for them, and certainly human conceptions of the way in which certain desires could be satisfied may be wide of the mark. But the presumption must be that desires which are widespread or universal are aimed at some genuine and attainable good, however inadequate may be the conceptions of that good held by many individuals. And if this is so, persons who take the desire for an afterlife as a reason to believe in one are on the side of right reason in doing so. Only if one assumes from the outset that the universe is not human-friendly, can the charge of wishful thinking be sustained.
Without doubt, a great many persons who believe in life after death do so because of reasons that are internal to their own religious traditions. Hindus and Buddhists have their accounts of persons who remember in detail events of their previous lives. Jews will rely on the visions of Ezekiel and the traditions of the rabbis; Muslims on the prophecies of the Koran. Christians will think of the resurrection of Jesus. Whether any of these appeals has serious evidentiary force is a question that cannot be pursued within the scope of this article; they must all the same be included in any overall assessment of the rationality of belief in an afterlife.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Augustine, Keith, 2008. Hallucinatory Near-Death Experiences, extensive critical survey of the evidence concerning NDEs.
- Death, Afterlife and Eschatology, provides a compilation of referenced sources from around the world on the topics of death, afterlife, and eschatology.
- Near-Death Experience, a brief presentation of a skeptical view of NDEs.