‘Abd al-Latif al-Baghdadi

First published Wed Sep 9, 2015

The Greek-Arabic sciences penetrated in the Islamic world during the 8th and 9th centuries AD due to the massive activity of the translators and al-Kindi’s vision of knowledge and also through the exegetical activity of the Aristotelian circle of Baghdad. From the end of the 10th, throughout the 11th, and up to the beginning of the 12th centuries, the production of original philosophical literature into Arabic and Persian became the main stream of the Arabic-Islamic philosophy, which was by then increasingly distant from the Greek sources in Arabic translation. Avicenna’s works fully attest this phenomenon, which prompted a 12th century purist trend well exemplified in the Muslim West by Averroes’ program of going back to Aristotle: a similar phenomenon occurred also in the Muslim East, with Muwaffaq al-Din Muhammad ‘Abd al-Latif ibn Yusuf al-Baghdadi .

‘Abd al-Latif was a philosopher and polymath who lived between the Second Crusade (1147–1149 AD) and the end of the Fifth Crusade (1217–1231 AD). He was born in Baghdad in 1162 and died there on 9 November 1231 after a pilgrimage of more than forty years during which he travelled throughout Iraq, Syria and Egypt looking for a good teacher in philosophy. He grew up in a Shafi‘i family with excellent links with the Nizamiyya madrasa and he received a solid education in Islamic sciences. Then he turned to natural sciences, medicine, philosophy and, critically, to alchemy. His spasmodic search for knowledge brought him to meet through their writings Avicenna, al-Ghazali and al-Suhrawardi. ‘Abd al-Latif had many generous patrons and was in touch with the most important men of his era including the Saladin and, in Cairo, Maimonides. Cairo represented for ‘Abd al-Latif the much-desired goal of his pilgrimage, the place where he finally met Aristotle and his philosophy as well as that of his commentators Themistius and Alexander, and where he finally encountered the work of the greatest Arabic Aristotelian commentator of the East, al-Farabi. For ‘Abd al-Latif, Cairo also meant the progressive abandonment of Avicenna’s philosophy, which he had held to be the only one possible during the earlier years of his education. ‘Abd al-Latif was a sharp critic, an independent thinker, and a prodigious writer on philosophy and medicine. His stated intellectual program was that to go back to the original Greek works in Arabic translation, and in particular to return to Aristotle in philosophy and to Hippocrates, via Galen, in medicine, but he was able to go back to these sources only through the lens of their reworkings by the philosophers before Avicenna, al-Kindi and al-Farabi.

Life and Works

1.1 Life

‘Abd al-Latif’s intellectual position comes across in his autobiography (sira). It seems to have formed part of a larger work no longer extant which he wrote for his son Sharaf al-Din Yusuf. The sira is contained in the Sources of Information on the Classes of Physicians by Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a (Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a, c. 1242 [1882-84], Kitab ‘Uyun al-anba’ fi tabaqat al-atibba’, A. Müller (ed.), al-Qahira: al-Matba‘at al-wahbiyya, 1882–1884: II. 201–213; Martini Bonadeo 2013), and even more in the Book of the Two Pieces of Advice (see Gutas 2011; Martini Bonadeo 2013; Joosse 2014). Other passages from ‘Abd al-Latif’s autobiography have been preserved by al-Dhahabi’s History of Islam (Von Somogyi 1937; Cahen 1970). Finally, further information on ‘Abd al-Latif can be found in the report of his journey in Egypt entitled Book of the Report and Account of the Things which I Witnessed and the Events Seen in the Land of Egypt, a compendium extracted from his own history of Egypt, lost to us (Zand, Videan, & Videan 1965).

He was born in Baghdad in 1162 from an upper class family originating from Mosul and spent his formative years in Baghdad until 1189. In the years of his youth in Baghdad he studied Islamic sciences and medicine with many renowned scholars of his time, including Kamal ad-Din ‘Abd al-Rahman al-Anbari (d.1181), a professor of fiqh (law), adab-literature, hadith (traditions) and Arabic grammar at the Nizamiyya madrasa, Wagih al-Wasiti (d.1215), a professor at the Zafariyya Mosque, Ibn Fadlan (d.1199), an outstanding legal scholar versed in the khilaf (divergence of the law) and dialectic, and leader of the Shafi‘is in Iraq, ‘Abd Allah ibn Ahmad ibn al-Khashshab (d.1171), master of hadith, grammarian, mathematician, expert in fara’id (hereditary law) and nasab (genealogy), Radi al-Dawla Abu Nasr (d.ca.1182), son of the well-known physician Amin al-Dawla Ibn al-Tilmidh, professor of medical subjects.

In his hometown ‘Abd al-Latif made his first steps in philosophy studying al-Ghazali’s Intentions of the Philosophers, the Measure of Science in the Art of Logic, the Criterion of Action on Ethics and the Touchstone of Reasoning in Logic. Then he turned to Avicenna’s books including the Salvation, the Cure, the Canon, and the Validation by Bahmanyar, a pupil of Avicenna. Finally still in Baghdad he studied Indian mathematics, Euclid’s geometry, and many books on alchemy by Jabir ibn Hayyan, but then he abandoned this discipline which he considered an irrational practice.

At the age of twenty-eight, in 1189, he left Baghdad and began a long period of travel in search for knowledge. First he was in Mosul for a year. There he heard people saying great things about al-Suhrawardi. He came across al-Suhrawardi’s treatises the Intimations, the Glimmer, and the Ascending Steps; but he did not find in them the knowledge that he was looking for. He left Mosul for Damascus where he joined the grammarian al-Kindi al-Baghdadi (d.1216) and he worked on a certain number of grammatical treatises. In Damascus he took more and more distance from the study and practice of alchemy. Then ‘Abd al-Latif went to Jerusalem and then to the Saladin near Acre. Here he came into contact with Saladin’s entourage: Baha’ al-Din ibn Shaddad (1145–1234), his biographer and the chief of the army and the city of Jerusalem, and ‘Imad al-Din al-Katib al-Isfahani (d.1201), the chronicler of Saladin’s deeds. With a safe-conduct document written by this latter ‘Abd al-Latif arrived in Cairo.

His aim in Egypt was to meet Yasin al-Simiya’i, a not well known alchemist, and Moses Maimonides, the famous Jewish philosopher, theologian, and doctor, born in Cordoba in 1135. ‘Abd al-Latif refused to work with the first for the senselessness of his teaching and found the latter excellent, but dominated by the desire to excel and to lend his services to men in command and of prominence. ‘Abd al-Latif’s encounter with the Peripatetic tradition took place in the vibrant cultural environment of Cairo where he met Abu al-Qasim al-Shari‘i, probably the renowned and famous master in the science of hadith Abu al-Qasim al-Busayri (d.1202), who had expert knowledge of the works of the “Ancients” and of those of Abu Nasr al-Farabi. In Cairo, for the first time ‘Abd al-Latif studied the books of the “Ancients”, namely Aristotle, Alexander of Aphrodisias, and Themistius, and on the basis of these he began to test the cogency of Avicenna’s doctrines. From this he came to hold the inferiority of the work of Avicenna. Nevertheless, ‘Abd al-Latif was intimately loath to renounce he who had been his master and the inspiration behind his research from his youth.

After 13 September 1192, the date of the armistice with the Franks, ‘Abd al-Latif moved to Jerusalem with the Saladin who appointed him as the administrator of the Umayyad mosque in Damascus. After the death of the Saladin (d.1193), the last years of ‘Abd al-Latif’s life took the form of a long series of journeys, no longer in search of knowledge, instruction, teachers and books, but all motivated by, or at the behest of, patrons: in Damascus al-Malik al-Afdal, Saladin’s eldest son; in Cairo al-Malik al-Aziz, in Jerusalem al-Malik al-Adil Sayf al-Din Abu Bakr ibn Ayyub, in Erzinjan al-Malik ‘Ala’ al-Din Da’ud ibn Bahram, in Aleppo Shihab al-Din Tughril. While he was in Aleppo he wanted to go on pilgrimage to Mecca, and he started his journey towards Baghdad to leave some of his works to the ‘Abbasid caliph al-Mustansir ibn al-Zahir (r. 1226–1242). Once he arrived in Baghdad ‘Abd al-Latif fell ill and died on 9 November, 1231. He was buried next to his father in the Wardiyya cemetery.

‘Abd al-Latif’s more famous students were: the hadith scholar al-Birzali (d.1239), the botanist Ibn al-Suri (d.1242), the judge al-Tifashi (d.1253), and the biographer Ibn Khallikan (d.1282).

1.2 Works

The oldest list of ‘Abd al-Latif’s works is that given by Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a at the end of the entry devoted to him in the Sources of Information on the Classes of Physicians (Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a, c. 1242 [1882-84]: II. 211.1–213.16). A second, later, list is found in Ibn Shakir al-Kutubi’s What was omitted in the Obituaries (Ibn Shakir al-Kutubi, before 1363 [1974], Fawat al-wafayat, I. ‘Abbas (ed.), Bayrut: Dar al-Sadir, 1974: II. 385.1–388.2).

The list presented by Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a numbers one hundred and seventy-three works, including brief essays and treatises. The subjects reflect the variety of ‘Abd al-Latif’s interests. Thirteen writings are listed which deal with the Arabic language, lexicography, and grammar, two with fiqh, nine with literary criticism, fifty-three with medicine, ten with zoology, three on the science of tawhid (unity of God), three on history, three on mathematics and related disciplines, two on magic and mineralogy, and twenty-seven on other themes. There are forty-eight works concerning philosophy: nineteen on logic—two of which are against Avicenna and the theory of conditional syllogisms—ten on physics, eight on metaphysics, and nine on politics. Two general works are also mentioned, divided into three sections: logic, physics, and metaphysics; one of these was in ten volumes and was completed by the author over a span of twenty years.

Ibn Shakir al-Kutubi’s list is shorter. It numbers fifteen discourses by ‘Abd al-Latif which are not mentioned by Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a and eighty-one works, all mentioned in the previous list, with the exception of one about antidotes.

The works which have come down to us—or at least those contained in manuscripts so far identified—concerning hadith, lexicography, and grammar are

  • the Compendium for the Language of Hadith (al-Radi 1977, 1979);
  • the Extract from the Book of the Essay on the Diadem in the Swords of the Prophet;
  • ‘Abd al-Latif’s commentary on the caliph al-Nasir’s collection of traditions entitled Rawh al-‘arifin;
  • the Extract from the Expressions of the Prophet and the Companions of the Prophet and his Followers.

About fiqh (law) there are

  • the Brief Study of the Laws in the Codes of Egypt;
  • the Commentary on the Collection by Abu Yahya ‘Abd al-Rahim ibn Nubata al-Fariqi.

About mathematics there is

  • the Book of That Which is Evident in Indian Mathematics.

On medicine some works survived:

  • the Commentary on the Prognostics according to Hippocrates (Joosse & Pormann 2012);
  • the Commentary on the Aphorisms of Hippocrates (Joosse & Pormann 2012);
  • the Commentary on Hunayn’s Medical Questions;
  • the Commentary on the Anatomy of Lutfallah al-Misri;
  • the Note on the Anatomy of the Commentary on the Revision;
  • the treatise On the Principles of Simple Medical Substances and their Natural Qualities.

Concerning philosophy, there are:

  • the Essay on the Senses and Two Questions on their Function (Ghalioungui & Abdou 1972);
  • the Questions on Natural History (Ghalioungui & Abdou 1972);
  • the Book on the Science of Metaphysics (Badawi 1955a,b; Neuwirth 1976, 1977–78).

Besides these works further eleven treatises have been preserved—among which is the already mentioned Book of the Two Pieces of Advice—in the miscellaneous manuscript Bursa, Hüseyin Çelebi 823 (Stern 1962):

  • ‘Abd al-Latif’s criticism of the notes written by Fakhr al-Din al-Razi on several passages from the Kulliyyat section of Avicenna’s Canon (fols 1v–19v and 28r–34r);
  • ‘Abd al-Latif’s criticism of the treatise on the Sura of Pure Intention by Fakhr al-Din al-Razi (fols 34r–38v and 20r–23r);
  • the treatise On the Quiddity of Space According to Ibn al-Haytham (fols 23v–27v and 39r–52r; see Rashed 2002, 4, 908-53) in which ‘Abd al-Latif’s attempt to refute Ibn al-Haytham’s geometrization of place and to restore Aristotle’s definition is a sort of defense of the primacy of philosophy compared to mathematics (El-Bizri 2007);
  • the treatise On Mixing (fols 52v–62r) concerning the combination of various elements in compound substances;
  • the Dispute Between an Alchemist and a Theoretical Philosopher (fols 100v–123v; Josse 2008, 2014);
  • the treatise On Minerals and the Confutation of Alchemy (fols 124r–132r);
  • the Excerpta from the works of the philosophers chosen by ‘Abd al-Latif (fols 132v–135v; Rashed 2004) which are related to Alexander of Aphrodisias’ Quaestiones (I 11a, II 28, III 9) and an Arabic Quaestio, work number 39 ascribed to Alexander of Aphrodisias in Ibn Abi Usaybi‘a’s list of Alexander’s works;
  • the Excerpta from medical works chosen by ‘Abd al-Latif (fols 138r–140v) in the form of a little handbook of pharmacology, which presents the therapeutic effects of thirty-one different plants;
  • the treatise On Diabetes (fols 140v–149r; Thies 1971; Degen 1977).

2. What Philosophical Research is

In the Book of the Two Pieces of Advice, a diatribe against false knowledge, ‘Abd al-Latif presents “two pieces of advice” for would-be physicians and would-be philosophers, an impassioned polemic against false physicians, and an equally harsh invective against false philosophers (see Gutas 2011; Martini Bonadeo 2013; Joosse 2014).

Those who, in his age, devote themselves to philosophy are bad philosophers for many different reasons: their lack of interest, the obscurity of philosophy and their lack of training and good teachers. But the main reason for the decline of the philosophical production of his age lies in the neglect into which the works of the Ancients have fallen. The pages of these works are by now being used by bookbinders and pharmacists as paper for packaging. No one—says ‘Abd al-Latif—wants to deny the contributions made by Avicenna to philosophical research. He has, in fact, provided new energy to philosophy, and he has been able in part to understand the books of the Ancients and to offer an introduction to them. Nevertheless, if one examines his works in more detail and compares them with those on similar themes by ancient authors and, in particular, with Aristotle or al-Farabi, their inferiority emerges. For this reason ‘Abd al-Latif proposes presenting the method followed by Plato and Aristotle in their respective philosophies. In doing that, he follows al-Farabi, summarizes and literally quotes al-Farabi’s Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle (Rosenthal & Walzer 1943; Mahdi 1961, 2001), where both Platonic dialogues and Aristotelian treatises are set out in such an order as to constitute a systematic and progressive investigation of all the areas of philosophical research.

For ‘Abd al-Latif, as for al-Farabi’s Plato, philosophical research begins with an investigation of what constitutes the perfection of man as man, which does not consist of a healthy physique, a pleasant face, noble descent, a large group of friends and lovers; nor does it consist in riches, glory, or power, since none of this is able to make man fully and truly happy. For man the attainment of happiness consists in a particular type of knowledge, the knowledge of the substances of all the beings and a certain lifestyle, the virtuous life. Knowledge of things according to their essence is not an end in itself, but is that which must characterize the virtuous lifestyle of the philosopher: in him, in fact, theoretical knowledge is the prolegomenon to action, ethics, and politics. For this reason ‘Abd al-Latif stresses that there is no difference between a man who lives in ignorance and the life of beasts because in ignorance man acts like a beast. A life in ignorance is a life without the search for truth and, hence, inhuman in itself.

In this perspective ‘Abd al-Latif introduces Plato’s political philosophy. Since the perfection of the soul is possible only in a city where justice reigns, Plato starts from analysis of what justice is and how it ought to be. Then Plato examines the cities which deviate from the good ways of life and from the philosophical virtues. In the virtuous city, man must be educated in the knowledge of the divine and natural beings and in following a virtuous way of life. Human perfection is achieved by the man who combines the theoretical, the political and the practical sciences. He will rule and will possess the ability to conduct a scientific investigation of justice and the other virtues and to form the character of the youth and the multitude. He will be able to correct wrong opinions and to cure every rank of his society with knowledge. The ruler will be the one who has achieved human perfection at its utmost.

Then ‘Abd al-Latif passes to present al-Farabi’s Aristotle who holds that the perfection of man sought by Plato is not self-evident or easy to explain by way of a demonstration which leads to certainty. He believes, therefore, that it is necessary to start with a prior consideration. There are four things which by nature are desired by man in so far as they are good: the soundness of the body, of the senses, of the ability to discern that which leads to the health of the body and the senses, and of the ability to obtain that which leads to their soundness. In the second place man desires to know the causes of the sensible things and also the causes of what he sees in his soul, and he discovers that the more he knows the more he feels pleasure. Thus according to Aristotle, the knowledge sought by man can be said to be of two types: the first is a useful knowledge sought for the soundness of the body, of the senses, and of the other two abilities, the second is desired and desirable in itself for the pleasure that a man experiences in apprehending them: for instance, the myths or the stories of nations.

‘Abd al-Latif goes on by explaining that in human knowledge there are three sorts of cognitions: those acquired by senses, frequently insufficient, those first necessary cognitions that originate with man, and those acquired by investigation and consideration. ‘Abd al-Latif asks himself what type of knowledge is most appropriate for man. Animals, too, in fact, have a body, senses, and the ability to discern how and with what to safeguard their health. They do not, however, possess the desire, provoked by wonder, to know the causes of what can be seen in the heavens and on earth.

This problem involves the following question: why should man ever desire to know the causes if the type of knowledge that they involve is not made for him? It is because man can grow in perfection by knowing the causes; indeed, knowing the causes is an act of the essence of man. Yet this statement opens up a series of problems. What is the essence of man, what is his ultimate perfection, what is the act whose realization leads to the final perfection of his essence? Nevertheless, given that man is part of the world, if one wishes to know the end of man and his activity he must first know the world in its totality. The four causes of the world in its totality and in each of its individual parts which must be sought are the what it is, the how it is, the what it is from, and the what is it for.

The investigation which deals with the world, in its totality and in each of its individual parts, is called natural investigation, while that which regards what man possesses by virtue and will is called the science of the things that depend on the will. Since that which is natural and innate in man precedes in time that which is in man by will and choice, the first type of investigation will precede the second even if both must arrive at a certain science. Besides these two types of research is the art of logic which forms the rational part of the soul, leads it to certainty, to study and to research; logic, moreover, guides and tests the validity of the other two fields of research.

‘Abd al-Latif reminds that in Aristotle’s science of nature the fundamental epistemological criterion holds that man must start from what is attested to by the senses, to then proceed to what is hidden, until he knows everything which he desires to know. For this reason, he goes on in the study of plants and then of animals. He catalogues their species, and explains the apparatus of organs which each animal species is provided with. Since organs alone are not sufficient to explain animal life, man feels the need to introduce a further principle, which is the soul. Nevertheless, the soul is not a principle sufficient to explain man, since the actions of man reveal themselves to be more powerful than the acts of the soul. The soul is not enough to explain the highest degree of substantiality reached by man: Aristotle found man with speech and speech proceeds from intellect or the intellectual principles and powers.

The human intellect is in potency and moves to act. All that which passes from potency to act necessitates an agent of the same species as the thing that must pass on to the act. The intellect as well, therefore, in order to pass from potency to act, needs an active intellect which is always in act and never in potency. When man’s intellect reaches its extreme perfection, it comes close in its substance to the substance of this active intellect. In its search for perfection, man’s intellect tends to imitate the model of this intellect, since it is that which makes man substantial in so far as he is man. This intellect is also man’s end because it is that which provides him with a principle and an example to follow in tending to perfection, which consists in approximating himself as far as it is possible to it. It is therefore his agent, his end, and his perfection. It is a principle in three different ways: as an agent, as an end, and as the perfection to which man tends. It is, however, a separate form with respect to man, a separate agent, and a separate end.

The result of the enquiry undertaken leads to the conclusion that human nature, the human soul, and the capabilities and the acts of these two, just like the capabilities of the practical intellect, are all finalized with respect to the perfection of the human intellect. Nature, the soul, and the human intellect are, however, insufficient to attain perfection and it is not possible to leave out of consideration the acts generated by volition and choice which depend on the practical intellect. For this reason, therefore, these acts must also become the object of investigation like all that which constitutes human will. Desire and the things, which depend on sense and discernment—which the other animals also possess—on the other hand, are neither human, nor useful for attaining theoretical perfection. According to this criterion it is necessary to re-examine completely all the scientific fields already established in the search for that which contributes to the attainment of perfection by man and that which, on the other hand, impedes this search.

Finally ‘Abd al-Latif mentions the Metaphysics saying that in Aristotle’s Metaphysics beings are investigated according to a different method from that used in the science of nature. Unlike his Farabian source, al-Farabi’s Philosophy of Plato and Aristotle, ‘Abd al-Latif begins to analyze the metaphysical science which has as its objects of inquiry the divine and noble things. He seems to mention the pseudo-Theology of Aristotle, the paraphrastic selection from Plotinus’ Enneads (IV to VI) translated by ‘Abd al-Masih ibn Nai‘ma al-Himsi and corrected by al-Kindi. He states that Aristotle in the Theology (Kitab bi-utulugiyya) said that God created the terrestrial world for man and also created in man the intellect and dispersed it in his soul so that it might be a weapon which strengthens man to make him able to live in the earth (i.e., practical intellect) and to investigate the creation of the heavens and the earth and the wonders which are found in the heavens and on the earth (i.e., theoretical intellect). And he says that God is provident and takes care of qualitatively better men and inspires them as a result of the mediation of the active intellect either through the way of meditation, or through the way of the effulgence of soul or through the way of revelation.

Of course since men are different there are different forms of assent to the truth: the absolute certainty of the man who follows the demonstrative way as indicated by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics and the persuasion produced by examples and images as indicated by Aristotle in the Rhetoric and the Poetics. Hence, philosophy comes into being in every man in the way that is possible for him.

For ‘Abd al-Latif, Plato and his disciple Aristotle pursue the same purpose and the same end in their philosophical speculation, that is to say, the perfection of man as man, which both identify in knowledge of the truth of things. Moreover, they describe a system so perfect in its organic constitution and completeness that the generations following them are left with nothing but the task of studying it in an attempt to understand their thought correctly. The exceptional nature of Plato and Aristotle’s philosophy, says ‘Abd al-Latif, has three causes: first, their philosophy is useful in motivating one to study, second, for a long time they had influence in this field, and third, the absolute primacy of their philosophy lies in their research into the causes from the more distant to the closest to the object. This method of inquiry does not need anything else and it is impossible to confute. It is therefore a great mistake to believe that the works of the Moderns are clearer, more useful, or qualitatively superior with respect to those of the Ancients.

3. Criticisms against the Moderns

Abd al-Latif constantly held authors defined by him as Moderns distinct from the Ancients and he unleashed a harsh polemic attack against the works of the former. His privileged targets were Avicenna and Fakhr al-Din al-Razi whom he considered, as far as it was possible, even worse than Avicenna. The writings of these authors in fact, if compared with those of the Ancients, reveal their low scientific level, are confused, and lack detailed analysis.

3.1 Against Avicenna

‘Abd al-Latif makes a series of criticisms on Avicenna’s philosophy (Martini Bonadeo 2013). In the first place, he explains that Avicenna did not manage to present an exhaustive philosophical system in which every field of philosophical research could receive adequate treatment. ‘Abd al-Latif criticizes Avicenna’s lack of reflection on the practical field. Even in his most famous summa, the Kitab al-Shifa’, Avicenna neglected the contents of Plato’s Republic, Aristotle’s Ethics, and his Politics. ‘Abd al-Latif explains this omission as a total lack of familiarity by Avicenna not only of practical philosophy, but also of philosophy in general.

In the second place, according to ‘Abd al-Latif, Avicenna seems to have distorted or not to have had any knowledge of the fundamental Aristotelian epistemological criterion according to which research must begin with that which is more easily knowable to us (cf. Aristotle, Physics I.1, 184a16–21; Nicomachean Ethics I.4, 1095b3–4). This is why, for example Avicenna mistakenly placed zoology after his treatment of the soul.

Next, ‘Abd al-Latif points out that Avicenna has produced numerous works, which have been copied from one another, as in the case of the Kitab al-Shifa’ and the Kitab al-Najat. He observes that Avicenna decided to introduce all his treatises with the discourse presented by Aristotle at the beginning of the Posterior Analytics (ll, 71a1–3) on every form of knowledge. But this is all that Avicenna knows of the Posterior Analytics. In fact, he has not dealt with what constitutes the end of logic, that is to say, the five logical arts which are the object of the Posterior Analytics, the Topics, the Sophistical Refutations, the Rhetoric, and the Poetics, and he has dwelt on an analysis of the contents of the Isagoge, Categories, De Interpretatione and Prior Analytics which, according to ‘Abd al-Latif, constitute a preparatory introduction to true logic. Even the Kitab al-Shifa’, which deals with logic at greater length, presents a confused discourse. ‘Abd al-Latif provides examples which strengthen his strong criticism. In the first place it is surprising to him that Avicenna has not clarified the category of “having” (ἔχειν; for its Arabic translations see Afnan 1964: 89–90). But, in fact, in the section on the categories (al-Maqulat) of the Kitab al-Shifa’, Avicenna devotes few words to his explanation of the meaning and the value of this category. He maintains that it is not a clear category and recognizes that he has not managed to understand it because he does not see how it can contain species. Moreover, ‘Abd al-Latif is amazed by the fact that Avicenna places the movement of the sky in the category of “Being-in-a-position” (κεῖσθαι), even though he himself has written a book on the De Caelo et mundo and on the Physics. The category of κεῖσθαι is explained by Avicenna both in the Kitab al-Shifa’ and the Kitab al-Najat as the manner of being of the body in as far as the fact that its parts constitute, one with another, a relation of inclination and parallelism in relation to the directions and the parts of the place, if the body is in a place, such as, for example standing up and sitting down. ‘Abd al-Latif’s third criticism is of Avicenna’s claim that he can define one of two relative terms without having recourse to the other. ‘Abd al-Latif stresses that in the Isagoge Avicenna defines genus separately and species separately and father separately and son separately. Then in his definition of father as a “living thing which creates from his sperm another living thing similar to him” Avicenna finds himself obliged to seek recourse to four distinct relations.

‘Abd al-Latif proceeds to criticize Avicenna’s theory of the syllogism and in particular his admission of the hypothetical syllogisms. Finally, ‘Abd al-Latif makes a series of further criticisms of Avicenna without, however, going into each of them in detail. Avicenna has enlarged the book of the Poetics with an amount of material which actually derives from the Rhetoric. Since Avicenna’s Kitab al-Shifa’, despite its numerous errors, has become the philosophical encyclopedia of reference among ‘Abd al-Latif’s contemporaries, he believes that Avicenna is the indirect cause of the vast spread of philosophical errors, such as the confusing, for example, the object proper to the Physics, that is, nature, with that of the Metaphysics.

3.2 Against Fakhr al-Din al-Razi

‘Abd al-Latif presents two sets of reasons why al-Razi‘s works, full of errors, should not be the object of people’s admiration. In the first place this writer does not possess a specific technical knowledge of the various sciences which he has decided to consider: his use of the medical terminology is inaccurate, for example, in his notes on Avicenna’s Canon. In the second place, since he lacks any didactic method, he simply raises continual sophisms. For these reasons, ‘Abd al-Latif maintains that he should not even try to take on the holy text of the Koran as he did in his commentary on sura 112 or on sura 95 and sura 87 (Gannagé 2011: 227–256; Stern 1962: 57–59).

4. Metaphysics

4.1 Metaphysics as Research into the Causes and First Philosophy

In the twenty-four chapters of his Book on the Science of Metaphysics ‘Abd al-Latif paraphrases and summarizes a sort of “library” of treatises on metaphysics (Zimmermann 1986) which were assimilated in the formative period of falsafa and imposed themselves to the point of becoming canonical. The editorial plan of the Book on the Science of Metaphysics follows the ordering of the metaphysical and divine science according to al-Farabi’s Enumeration of the Sciences. It consists in fact of three distinct parts which reflect al-Farabi’s tripartite division: in the first part, which includes the first four chapters, there is the study of beings and their accidents; the second part, which goes from chapter five to chapter twelve, deals with the principles of definition and demonstration; the third and last part, comprising chapters thirteen to twenty-four, is devoted to a description of the hierarchy of the immaterial and intelligible realities until it reaches the First Mover, the First Principle, the First Cause, the One, which is nothing but the one God of the Koran, the provident Creator, in a synthesis of Aristotelian metaphysics, Neoplatonic metaphysics, and Islamic monotheism (Neuwirth 1976).

‘Abd al-Latif devotes a full sixteen out of twenty-four chapters to a discussion of Aristotle’s Metaphysics, which he probably knew in more than one translation. The books of the Metaphysics he freely paraphrases are, in order, Alpha Elatton/Alpha Meizon, Beta, Delta, Gamma, Epsilon, Zeta, Eta, Theta, Iota, and Lambda (Neuwirth 1976, 1977–78; Martini Bonadeo 2010, 2013). Three whole chapters (13–15) are devoted to the latter one. ‘Abd al-Latif is strongly influenced by Themistius’ paraphrase (Brague 1999) in his reading of Lambda. The presentation of Lambda ends with an entire chapter (16) containing an epitome of Alexander Arabus’s treatise On the principles of the Universe (Badawi 1947; Genequand 2001; Endress 2002). ‘Abd al-Latif’s use of the Metaphysics reflects that of its first Arabic interpreters, in particular al-Kindi, who centered on the contents of books Alpha Elatton, Epsilon, and Lambda and was tied to the criterion of the doctrinal unity of Greek metaphysics: the natural theology of Lambda is only a premise for a characterization of the First Principle, which is of clear Neoplatonic origin (D’Ancona 1996).

This is particularly clear from the very beginning of the Book on the Science of Metaphysics. For ‘Abd al-Latif, in fact, there are different causes for different kinds of being and different sciences for different causes, but there is one first science leading all the others, for two different reasons. First, as al-Farabi taught, it is able to demonstrate the principles of the other sciences, because it is only this science, which investigates absolute beings and from them it provides an explanation of the principles of the particular sciences, comprised in it and below it. Second, this science includes speculation about the First Principle, which every other thing needs in its own existence. ‘Abd al-Latif claims that this First Principle is the absolute final cause and that the science of this cause is the wisdom (hikma) which precedes all other knowledge (Martini Bonadeo 2010).

The absolute final cause is described by ‘Abd al-Latif in a typical Avicennian phrase as the Pure Being (al-wujud al-mujarrad), the aim of everything, and the First mover immobile, eternal and everlasting, i.e., the First Principle whose knowledge is the end of our inquiry. The First Principle is also described as the True One (al-wahid al-haqq), one by essence, without any kind of multiplicity. The way to know this True One is to ascend from the things which have some degree of unity. So we say one army, one city, that Zayd is one, that the celestial sphere is one, and that the world is one. Then we proceed through souls and intellects, and through the things which in this ascent loose multiplicity and acquire unity until we reach the Absolute One (al-wahid al-mutlaq), the architectural principle of everything and the supreme intelligible which makes the world be, preserves its existence, and orders it. The First Cause is for ‘Abd al-Latif that cause which has within it all things in purely Neoplatonic vein. It is not surprising therefore that in paraphrasing chapter 10 of Lambda he speaks of emanation from the First Principle.

The characteristics of the Neoplatonic One are thus grafted onto the Aristotelian characterization of the First Principle. The point of fusion lies in the doctrine of the self-reflection of divine thought, which for ‘Abd al-Latif, who is influenced by the exegesis of Themistius, is not a reason for composition and multiplicity within the First Principle, as it was for Plotinus. If the thinking principle, the act of thinking and the object of thought coincide in the First Principle, which by now is called God, there is in It no multiplicity.

4.2 Providence

The exposition of Lambda is followed by three chapters which discuss the theme of Providence (πρόνοια) of the First Principle. ‘Abd al-Latif’s main source is Alexander of Aphrodisias’ De Providentia (Ruland 1976, 1979; Zimmermann 1986; Thillet 2003). ‘Abd al-Latif therefore mutually harmonizes two solutions which are in reality quite different from one another, not to say alternative: that put forward by Alexander regarding the problem of divine providence—the First Principle thinks and knows primarily only itself, but it eternally knows the events of the world too, subject to becoming, in so far as it exercises its own direction over them through the celestial order—and that of Themistius, which ‘Abd al-Latif had already made his own in the course of his paraphrase of Lambda, whereby God knows that which is different from him without for this reason coming out of himself, since he contains in him all the ideas of all things, and is the norm and the condition of the intelligibility of the world.

‘Abd al-Latif maintains that the action of God’s providence expresses itself both in the superior and in the inferior world; but if in the first case the relationship between divine providence and the superior world is immediate, in the second case it is mediated by the superior world. The relationship between divine providence and those who receive it, however, cannot be thought of as a causal relationship, since in this case “the noble would come into being because of the ignoble and the earlier because of the later” (Rosenthal 1975: 156), which is shameful, nor can this relationship be thought as purely accidental. Both situations are unsuitable for the First Principle, which cannot therefore exercise providence as its primary action, but cannot either be considered as that from which providence derives accidentally. ‘Abd al-Latif then affirms that the existence and the order of things derive from the existence of God, who is absolute good and returns to the image of fire which warms everything: God concedes to all existing things as much good as they, for their proximity to him, are able to receive. The bodies of the sublunary world are able to enjoy the potency which emanates from God and so they tend to move towards him. Among the existing things of the sublunary world, man has been given the capacity for reason, due to which he can carry out those actions that lead him to acquire the happiness appropriate to him. The same rational capacity allows him to know divine things and, in virtue of this knowledge, man is superior to all other things that come to being and pass away. At times, however, he uses this rational capacity to obtain, not the good and virtues, but vices. This can happen because providence allows man the capacity to be able to acquire virtues, but the success of this enterprise lies in the will and in the choice made by man himself.

Following the lead of Alexander’s treatise On Providence, ‘Abd al-Latif introduces the problem of evil and places his examination of those aspects of the doctrine of providence that regard man and his actions within the framework of a discussion more of a cosmological nature. For this reason, though he favours Themistius’ solution whereby God knows all things in that he contains within him the ideas of all things, which he holds to be closest to the dogma of the Koran, ‘Abd al-Latif has recourse to Alexander concerning the problems of evil, man’s free will, and divine justice.

4.3 Intellect and First Cause

‘Abd al-Latif then proceeds in his treatise by epitomizing the Book of the Exposition of the Pure Good, that is to say, the Liber de causis of the Latin Middle Ages, and proposition 54, on the difference between eternity and time (Endress 1973; Jolivet 1979: 55–75; Zimmermann 1994: 9–51) from Proclus’ Elements of Theology. ‘Abd al-Latif reproduces all the propositions of the Liber de causis, except numbers 4, 10, 18, and 20, and follows the same order in which they are set out (Badawi 1955b; Anawati 1956: 73–110; Taylor 1984: 236–248). He stresses the primacy of the most universal cause, which is, therefore, further from its effect with respect to the causes nearer to the effect and hence apparently more important.

The First Cause transcends any possibility of our knowledge. If knowing the true nature of things in fact means knowing their causes, since by definition the First Cause has no causes that precede it, it is unknowable in its true nature. It can only be known by approximation, through a description of the secondary causes. A long section, which describes intellect, follows this theory of the transcendent ineffability of the First Cause which precludes any proper predication. The intellect is with eternity, above time, and is not subject to division, because everything which is divisible is divisible in magnitude, in number, or in motion, but all these kinds of division are under time. It is one, in so far as it is the first thing which originated from the First Cause, but it is multiple with respect to the multiplicity of the gifts that come to it from the First Cause. The intellect knows what is above it—the gifts that come to it from the First Cause—and what is below it—the things of which it is the cause. But intellect knows its cause and its effect through its substance, that is to say that it perceives things intellectually. It grasps intellectually either the intellectual things or the sensible ones. The First Cause, which is the Pure Good, pours all that is good into the intellect and into all that which exists through the mediation of the intellect. There is, however, a certain fluctuation in ‘Abd al-Latif’s attempt to establish a perfect conformity between the First Cause as presented in the Liber de causis and the First Principle presented in his chapters devoted to the paraphrase of Metaphysics Lambda. According to ‘Abd al-Latif God precedes the intellect in ruling things: he orders the intellect to govern. But, having stated that the self-subsistent substance is not generated from something else, ‘Abd al-Latif maintains that intellect does not need anything other than itself in its conceptualizing and formation (tasawwuri-hi wa taswiri-hi), that it is perfect and complete eternally, and that it is the cause of itself.

4.4 Metaphysical Science as of Science of Sovereignty

At this point ‘Abd al-Latif introduces the description of the Science of Sovereignty (‘ilm al-rububiyya) which echoes that of the first chapter in the Theology of Aristotle: it is not a physical science that limits itself to ascend from effects to causes, but a science which, when it comes close to causes, is able to go back to consider the effects in greater depth approaching the divine knowledge of things.

Moreover, ‘Abd al-Latif summarizes in the contents, but not in the order, a selection of twenty propositions of Proclus (1–3, 5, 62, 86, 15–17, 21, 54, 76, 78, 91, 79, 80, 167, and 72–74: see Zimmermann 1986), four quaestiones of Alexander of Aphrodisias (Van Ess 1966; Fazzo & Wiesner 1993) and the adaptation of John Philoponus’ De aeternitate mundi contra Proclum IX,8 and IX,11 (Hasnawi 1994), entitled What Alexander of Aphrodisias Extracted from the Book of Aristotle Called Theology, Namely the Doctrine of Divine Sovereignty (Endress 1973). In doing that ‘Abd al-Latif sets for himself three objectives. In the first place, he wants to stress the crucial aspects of the doctrine of the First Cause understood as One, presented in the previous chapters. In the second place, he discusses the relationship between the One and the many, and, not by chance, he does so after a series of chapters (16–20) devoted to the relationship between the First Cause and the world. As for these two objectives, he stresses the basic features of the First Cause: it is One and it gives unity to that which is multiple; it is One in itself and the True One without composition; it is the cause of all that which is multiple in that, although it is by essence One, its causal action propagates in a multiplicity of effects; it is above eternity and time; it is life that does not end, light that does not extinguish, it is Pure Being, it is the first agent, it is ineffable and nothing can be properly predicated of it, it is unknowable, the apex of the hierarchy of being which is composed of the intellect, intelligible realities, the Soul, the souls, and, finally, the corporeal realities of nature. Then he turns to the providence of the First Cause with regard to its effects: this providence exists, is mediated by the spheres and preserves the species on earth. The divine power acts upon the sublunary world by contact, and, starting from the first sphere of fire, the divine power is in matter according to the receptivity of the various matters.

‘Abd al-Latif ends his presentation of the metaphysical science by summarizing the text of the pseudo-Theology from chapter 2 to chapter 10 (chapter nine is not included), more or less literally (Badawi 1955a). Through the pseudo-Theology—as we have seen before, an item of the Arabic Plotinus—‘Abd al-Latif was exposed to a Neoplatonic doctrine on the causality of the Platonic ideas which took into account the Aristotelian themes of the immobile causality of the First Mover and the coincidence of the nature of what is the supreme intelligent and what is the supreme intelligible. ‘Abd al-Latif writes about the First Principle, True One, and Creator, which is known only through imperfect images and which is infinite in its essence, the process of emanation and the hierarchy from the First Principle to the word of coming to be, the nature and movement of the celestial bodies which move out of the desire to imitate the perfection of the First Unmoved Mover and to assimilate themselves to the Pure Good to the extent to which they are capable; the movement of the first sphere and the life in the world of coming to be; the ontological anteriority of the First Cause with respect to the proximate causes, the ascent of human soul from sensible to intellectual knowledge up to the First Principle, which is true intellect, true being, true perfection, true science and true substance. At the end he deals with the limits of our senses and of the human intellect in understanding the First Cause and the others separate beings: our intellect is weak in understanding concepts such as movement, time, matter, privation, and possibility, and it can attain them only through analogies and long meditation. Moreover, for our intellect the First Principle is the condition of knowing without being known by us, as the sun is the condition of our vision even though we cannot bear the direct sight of it. The Book on the Science of Metaphysics ends with the announcement of a treatise on political philosophy to follow, entitled The Conditions of the Perfect State and its Consequences: if people are educated to grew up in virtues, it will be possible to realize al-madina al-fadila, the Farabian perfect state.

This overview of the reception and use of the Greek and Arabic sources by ‘Abd al-Latif al-Baghdadi in his Book on the Science of Metaphysics proves that, in the framework of al-Farabi’s awareness of the manifold nature of metaphysics—ontology, knowledge of causes, universal science, and divine science or theology—the return to the Ancients, and to Aristotle, declared by ‘Abd al-Latif to be necessary in his biography, was certainly not a return to the Aristotle of the Greek sources, linguistic access to which had by that time been lost for a couple of centuries. Rather it was a return to the Aristotle of his own tradition: that strongly Neoplatonized Aristotle of the origins of the Kindian falsafa. ‘Abd al-Latif’s treatise on metaphysics is in fact deeply rooted in the whole set of Greek works on first philosophy that had been translated or paraphrased into Arabic under the impulse and direction of al-Kindi: in al-Kindi as in ‘Abd al-Latif’s project where the knowledge of the causes comes to coincide with a natural theology that investigates the First Principle, the De Providentia of Alexander of Aphrodisias, Proclus’ Elements of Theology, and the last three of Plotinus’ Enneads constitute a natural development of book Lambda of the Metaphysics.

5. Good and bad Epistemologies and Practices

‘Abd al-Latif’s attitude towards contemporary medicine and the practice of alchemy helps us understand his consideration for the epistemology of the sciences, which must be based on universal grounds as that of the Ancients, and it explains once more the primacy ‘Abd al-Latif assigns to the philosophy of the Greeks which he considered the right way of thinking and therefore of acting.

5.1 Medical Epistemology

‘Abd al-Latif in the first part of his above mentioned autobiographical work (Joosse 2011, 2014) focuses on the epistemological status of the art of medicine using different comparisons which seem to be in contradiction: medicine is like both mathematics and the art of archery (Joosse & Pormann 2008). Medicine is an art concerned with universals. For this reason it does not make errors. Mathematics is also a science which considers abstract concepts, but even in this theoretical science approximation occurs (the examples are that of the impossibility of squaring a circle and the approximation in writing an irrational number). Concerning the physicians, they are like the expert in the art of archery “who hits the mark in most cases” (Joosse 2014: 66), but they can make mistakes because they are concerned with particulars. Good physicians, even if they do not hit the target, do not miss it entirely. For ‘Abd al-Latif his contemporaries are like those whose arrows which do not hit the targets, but on the contrary, fall in the opposite direction (Joosse & Pormann 2010).

The pitiful state of contemporary medicine, in contrast to the medicine of the Ancients Hippocrates, Dioscorides and Galen, is caused first of all because the contemporaries do not follow a medical epistemology. ‘Abd al-Latif observes that, even in antiquity, medical sects had existed which taught false medicine. ‘Abd al-Latif recalls, in particular, the Empirical and Methodist sects which were in opposition to the Dogmatic or Rationalist one, according to the classic tripartite division of medical schools which were known to Arabic authors due precisely to the Arabic translation of many introductory works by Galen and pseudo-Galen. The Empirical sect of Sceptical inspiration, in fact, was neither concerned to study the anatomical structure of the human body nor the internal secrets of illnesses. It rejected any possible analogy between the dead body and the living body. It denied any general theory. The medicine which it taught, therefore, translated itself into a medical practice totally alien to the anatomic-physiological basis of symptoms and was wholly linked to clinical phenomena and the classification of symptoms and medicines. The Methodist sect of Stoic and Epicurean inspiration, for which human life was the natural place for moral and physical suffering, held that the human body was formed of atoms which could not be perceived by the senses and which were in continual movement through pores and channels. According to this sect, illness came about in the case of an alteration in the quality and the movement of the corpuscles or in the case of an excessive tightening or relaxing of the pores through which the atoms moved. Therapy, therefore, was reduced to baths designed to provoke sweat in cases of the tightening of the pores and astringents and tonics in the case of dilation, in order to return to an intermediate perviousness. ‘Abd al-Latif holds that the above sects are far removed from the medicine practiced by the Dogmatic doctors of Platonic and Aristotelian inspiration who considered anatomy and physiology to be the basic sciences and for whom the detailed study of the internal causes of an illness was primary and necessary. Nevertheless, the criteria followed by the Empirical and the Methodist sects were thus far scientific: the physicians followed a theory and did not proceed by pure and simple supposition, as most contemporary physicians did (Joosse & Pormann 2010).

In ‘Abd al-Latif’s opinion, the medicine of his age must rediscover and apply Greek medicine with its principles, descriptions of diseases, and therapies. Greek theoretical medicine is concerned with universals and is founded on the ground of universal principles which are valid everywhere. In this respect, according to him, Greek medicine is far superior to his contemporaries’ practice and must be learned by the physicians of his age according to the principle of accumulation of knowledge which also guides ‘Abd al-Latif’s philosophical project.

5.2 Against Alchemy

‘Abd al-Latif was profoundly averse to alchemy, which was much in vogue in his time (Wiedeman 1907; Joosse 2008, 2014: 29–62). It can in no way be placed in the system of the sciences. It is a complete fraud: the false alchemists are all engaged in the production of elixirs or the “Philosophers’ stone”. They believe

in the substantial transmutation of metals and thought that the “differentia specifica” of metals could be produced during an artificial process, which in the end would always lead to the transformation of lead and other base metals into precious metals gold and silver. (Joosse 2008: 304)

Alchemy and its false presumptions must be distinguished from scientific knowledge, such as mathematics, mineralogy, chemistry, zoology, and botany. Proof of this is that the Ancients never spoke of it: Pythagoras has not devoted a treatise to it, Plato and Aristotle never speak of it, and thus neither do the Greek commentators after them. There is not a single word on alchemy in all of Galen’s voluminous works, nor in that of John Philoponus. In the Islamic age al-Jahiz, Hunayn ibn Ishaq, his son Ishaq, his grandson Hunayn, Abu Bishr Matta, and Abu al-Faraj ibn al-Tayyib keep all silent on the subject. The father of this false science would seem to have been Jabir ibn Hayyan who has turned generations of students after him astray. Al-Farabi, the greatest Islamic philosopher, mentions elixirs (al-iksir) in a highly negative way only once. Even Avicenna, in his treatise on alchemy does not give this art a rational basis. Alchemy is guilty of having waylaid generations of scholars.

‘Abd al-Latif’s life and works testifies the crucial role played by many Muslim men of learning and science, who attended the milieus of the Islamic schools between the 12th and 13th centuries, in the transmission of the Greek philosophical and medical knowledge, still perceived as essential to the training of the learned Muslim.


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