Notes to Aristotle's Metaphysics

1. This crucial idea is put forward at Posterior Analytics 71b32; Prior Analytics 68b35–7; Physics A.1, 184a16–20; Metaphysics Z.3, 1029b3–12; Topics Z.4, 141b2–142a12.)

2. This inverse tree-like structure was first noticed in the 3rd century C.E. by Porphyry: “Substance is itself a genus, under this is body, and under body is living body, under which is animal. Under animal is rational animal, under which is man. Under man are Socrates and Plato and individual (kata meros) men” (Isagoge 4, 21–25). This so-called “tree of Porphyry” later found its way, with illustrations, into medieval discussions of Aristotle.

3. Although Aristotle himself never puts it this way, one might think of each category itself as a genus. This is certainly what Porphyry thought (see note 2). See also Owen 1965b. Note, however, that if a category is a genus, it is a maximally general one—it cannot be a species of some higher genus. For the union of all the categories contains everything that there is—i.e., all of the beings—and Aristotle insists that being is not a genus (Posterior Analytics 92b14, Metaphysics B.3, 998b22).

4. That Aristotle uses eidos in these two different senses is now widely accepted, and may even be considered the orthodox view. Proponents include Ackrill 1972, Loux 1979 and 1991, Driscoll 1981, Code 1984, Gill 1989, Witt 1989c, Lewis 1991, and Wedin 2000. Other authors reject the distinction, including Irwin 1988 and Woods 1993. See esp. Woods 1993 for a full discussion of this issue.

Copyright © 2012 by
S. Marc Cohen <smcohen@u.washington.edu>

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