Aristotle's Political Theory

First published Wed Jul 1, 1998; substantive revision Wed Jan 26, 2011

Aristotle (b. 384 – d. 322 BCE), was a Greek philosopher, logician, and scientist. Along with his teacher Plato, Aristotle is generally regarded as one of the most influential ancient thinkers in a number of philosophical fields, including political theory. Aristotle was born in Stagira in northern Greece, and his father was a court physician to the king of Macedon. As a young man he studied in Plato's Academy in Athens. After Plato's death he left Athens to conduct philosophical and biological research in Asia Minor and Lesbos, and he was then invited by King Philip II of Macedon to tutor his young son, Alexander the Great. Soon after Alexander succeeded his father, consolidated the conquest of the Greek city-states, and launched the invasion of the Persian Empire. Aristotle returned as a resident alien to Athens, and was a close friend of Antipater, the Macedonian viceroy. At this time (335–323 BCE) he wrote, or at least worked on, some of his major treatises, including the Politics. When Alexander died suddenly, Aristotle had to flee from Athens because of his Macedonian connections, and he died soon after. Aristotle's life seems to have influenced his political thought in various ways: his interest in biology seems to be expressed in the naturalism of his politics; his interest in comparative politics and his sympathies for democracy as well as monarchy may have been encouraged by his travels and experience of diverse political systems; he criticizes harshly, while borrowing extensively, from Plato's Republic, Statesman, and Laws; and his own Politics is intended to guide rulers and statesmen, reflecting the high political circles in which he moved.

1. Political Science in General

The modern word ‘political’ derives from the Greek politikos, ‘of, or pertaining to, the polis’. (The Greek term polis will be translated here as ‘city-state’. It is also translated as ‘city’ or ‘polis’, or simply anglicized as ‘polis’. City-states like Athens and Sparta were relatively small and cohesive units, in which political, religious, and cultural concerns were intertwined. The extent of their similarity to modern nation-states is controversial.) Aristotle's word for ‘politics’ is politikê, which is short for politikê epistêmê or ‘political science’. It belongs to one of the three main branches of science, which Aristotle distinguishes by their ends or objects. Contemplative science (including physics and metaphysics) is concerned with truth or knowledge for its own sake; practical science with good action; and productive science with making useful or beautiful objects (Top. VI.6.145a14–16, Met. VI.1.1025b24, XI.7.1064a16–19, EN VI.2.1139a26–8). Politics is a practical science, since it is concerned with the noble action or happiness of the citizens (although it resembles a productive science in that it seeks to create, preserve, and reform political systems). Aristotle thus understands politics as a normative or prescriptive discipline rather than as a purely empirical or descriptive inquiry.

In the Nicomachean Ethics Aristotle describes his subject matter as political science, which he characterizes as the most authoritative science. It prescribes which sciences are to be studied in the city-state, and the others -- such as military science, household management, and rhetoric — fall under its authority. Since it governs the other practical sciences, their ends serve as means to its end, which is nothing less than the human good. “Even if the end is the same for an individual and for a city-state, that of the city-state seems at any rate greater and more complete to attain and preserve. For although it is worthy to attain it for only an individual, it is nobler and more divine to do so for a nation or city-state” (EN I.2.1094b7-10). Aristotle's political science encompasses the two fields which modern philosophers distinguish as ethics and political philosophy. (See the entry on Aristotle's ethics.) Political philosophy in the narrow sense is roughly speaking the subject of his treatise called the Politics. For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:

Supplement: Characteristics and Problems of Aristotle's Politics

2. Aristotle's View of Politics

Political science studies the tasks of the politician or statesman (politikos), in much the way that medical science concerns the work of the physician (see Politics IV.1). It is, in fact, the body of knowledge that such practitioners, if truly expert, will also wield in pursuing their tasks. The most important task for the politician is, in the role of lawgiver (nomothetês), to frame the appropriate constitution for the city-state. This involves enduring laws, customs, and institutions (including a system of moral education) for the citizens. Once the constitution is in place, the politician needs to take the appropriate measures to maintain it, to introduce reforms when he finds them necessary, and to prevent developments which might subvert the political system. This is the province of legislative science, which Aristotle regards as more important than politics as exercised in everyday political activity such as the passing of decrees (see EN VI.8).

Aristotle frequently compares the politician to a craftsman. The analogy is imprecise because politics, in the strict sense of legislative science, is a form of practical knowledge, while a craft like architecture or medicine is a form of productive knowledge. However, the comparison is valid to the extent that the politician produces, operates, maintains a legal system according to universal principles (EN VI.8 and X.9). In order to appreciate this analogy it is helpful to observe that Aristotle explains the production of an artifact in terms of four causes: the material, formal, efficient, and final causes (Phys. II.3 and Met. A.2). For example, clay (material cause) is molded into a vase shape (formal cause) by a potter (efficient or moving cause) so that it can contain liquid (final cause). (For discussion of the four causes see the entry on Aristotle's physics.)

One can also explain the existence of the city-state in terms of the four causes. It is a kind of community (koinônia), that is, a collection of parts having some functions and interests in common (Pol. II.1.1261a18, III.1.1275b20). Hence, it is made up of parts, which Aristotle describes in various ways in different contexts: as households, or economic classes (e.g., the rich and the poor), or demes (i.e., local political units). But, ultimately, the city-state is composed of individual citizens (see III.1.1274a38–41), who, along with natural resources, are the “material” or “equipment” out of which the city-state is fashioned (see VII.14.1325b38-41).

The formal cause of the city-state is its constitution (politeia). Aristotle defines the constitution as “a certain ordering of the inhabitants of the city-state” (III.1.1274b32-41). He also speaks of the constitution of a community as “the form of the compound” and argues that whether the community is the same over time depends on whether it has the same constitution (III.3.1276b1–11). The constitution is not a written document, but an immanent organizing principle, analogous to the soul of an organism. Hence, the constitution is also “the way of life” of the citizens (IV.11.1295a40-b1, VII.8.1328b1-2). Here the citizens are that minority of the resident population who possess full political rights (III.1.1275b17–20).

The existence of the city-state also requires an efficient cause, namely, its ruler. On Aristotle's view, a community of any sort can possess order only if it has a ruling element or authority. This ruling principle is defined by the constitution, which sets criteria for political offices, particularly the sovereign office (III.6.1278b8–10; cf. IV.1.1289a15–18). However, on a deeper level, there must be an efficient cause to explain why a city-state acquires its constitution in the first place. Aristotle states that “the person who first established [the city-state] is the cause of very great benefits” (I.2.1253a30–1). This person was evidently the lawgiver (nomothetês), someone like Solon of Athens or Lycurgus of Sparta, who founded the constitution. Aristotle compares the lawgiver, or the politician more generally, to a craftsman (dêmiourgos) like a weaver or shipbuilder, who fashions material into a finished product (II.12.1273b32–3, VII.4.1325b40–1365a5).

The notion of final cause dominates Aristotle's Politics from the opening lines:

Since we see that every city-state is a sort of community and that every community is established for the sake of some good (for everyone does everything for the sake of what they believe to be good), it is clear that every community aims at some good, and the community which has the most authority of all and includes all the others aims highest, that is, at the good with the most authority. This is what is called the city-state or political community. [I.1.1252a1–7]

Soon after, he states that the city-state comes into being for the sake of life but exists for the sake of the good life (2.1252b29–30). The theme that the good life or happiness is the proper end of the city-state recurs throughout the Politics (III.6.1278b17-24, 9.1280b39; VII.2.1325a7–10).

To sum up, the city-state is a hylomorphic (i.e., matter-form) compound of a particular population (i.e., citizen-body) in a given territory (material cause) and a constitution (formal cause). The constitution itself is fashioned by the lawgiver and is governed by politicians, who are like craftsmen (efficient cause), and the constitution defines the aim of the city-state (final cause, IV.1.1289a17–18). For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:

Supplement: Presuppositions of Aristotle's Politics

It is in these terms that Aristotle understands the fundamental normative problem of politics: What constitutional form should the lawgiver establish and preserve in what material for the sake of what end?

3. General Theory of Constitutions and Citizenship

Aristotle states that “the politician and lawgiver is wholly occupied with the city-state, and the constitution is a certain way of organizing those who inhabit the city-state” (III.1.1274b36-8). His general theory of constitutions is set forth in Politics III. He begins with a definition of the citizen (politês), since the city-state is by nature a collective entity, a multitude of citizens. Citizens are distinguished from other inhabitants, such as resident aliens and slaves; and even children and seniors are not unqualified citizens (nor are most ordinary workers). After further analysis he defines the citizen as a person who has the right (exousia) to participate in deliberative or judicial office (1275b18–21). In Athens, for example, citizens had the right to attend the assembly, the council, and other bodies, or to sit on juries. The Athenian system differed from a modern representative democracy in that the citizens were more directly involved in governing. Although full citizenship tended to be restricted in the Greek city-states (with women, slaves, foreigners, and some others excluded), the citizens were more deeply enfranchised than in modern representative democracies because they were more directly involved in governing. This is reflected in Aristotle's definition of the citizen (without qualification). Further, he defines the city-state (in the unqualified sense) as a multitude of such citizens which is adequate for a self-sufficient life (1275b20-21).

Aristotle defines the constitution (politeia) as a way of organizing the offices of the city-state, particularly the sovereign office (III.6.1278b8–10; cf. IV.1.1289a15–18). The constitution thus defines the governing body, which takes different forms: for example, in a democracy it is the people, and in an oligarchy it is a select few (the wealthy or well born). Before attempting to distinguish and evaluate various constitutions Aristotle considers two questions. First, why does a city-state come into being? He recalls the thesis, defended in Politics I.2, that human beings are by nature political animals, who naturally want to live together. For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:

Supplement: Political Naturalism

He then adds that “the common advantage also brings them together insofar as they each attain the noble life. This is above all the end for all both in common and separately” (III.6.1278b19–24). Second, what are the different forms of rule by which one individual or group can rule over another? Aristotle distinguishes several types of rule, based on the nature of the soul of the ruler and of the subject. He first considers despotic rule, which is exemplified in the master-slave relationship. Aristotle thinks that this form of rule is justified in the case of natural slaves who (he asserts without evidence) lack a deliberative faculty and thus need a natural master to direct them (I.13.1260a12; slavery is defended at length in Politics I.4–8). Although a natural slave allegedly benefits from having a master, despotic rule is still primarily for the sake of the master and only incidentally for the slave (III.6.1278b32–7). (Aristotle provides no argument for this: if some persons are congenitally incapable of self-governance, why should they not be ruled primarily for their own sakes?) He next considers paternal and marital rule, which he also views as defensible: “the male is by nature more capable of leadership than the female, unless he is constituted in some way contrary to nature, and the elder and perfect [is by nature more capable of leadership] than the younger and imperfect” (I.12.1259a39-b4). Aristotle is persuasive when he argues that children need adult supervision because their rationality is “imperfect” (ateles) or immature. But he is unconvincing to modern readers when he alleges (without substantiation) that, although women have a deliberative faculty, it is “without authority” (akuron), so that females require male supervision (I.13.1260a13–14). (Aristotle's arguments about slaves and women appear so weak that some commentators take them to be ironic. However, what is obvious to a modern reader need not have been so to an ancient Greek, so that it is not necessary to suppose that Aristotle's discussion is ironic.) It is noteworthy, however, that paternal and marital rule are properly practiced for the sake of the ruled (for the sake of the child and of the wife respectively), just as arts like medicine or gymnastics are practiced for the sake of the patient (III.6.1278b37–1279a1). In this respect they resemble political rule, which is the form of rule appropriate when the ruler and the subject have equal and similar rational cacapacities. This is exemplified by naturally equal citizens who take turns at ruling for one another's advantage (1279a8–13). This sets the stage for the fundamental claim of Aristotle's constitutional theory: “constitutions which aim at the common advantage are correct and just without qualification, whereas those which aim only at the advantage of the rulers are deviant and unjust, because they involve despotic rule which is inappropriate for a community of free persons” (1279a17–21).

The distinction between correct and deviant constitutions is combined with the observation that the government may consist of one person, a few, or a multitude. Hence, there are six possible constitutional forms (Politics III.7):

  Correct Deviant
One Ruler Kingship Tyranny
Few Rulers Aristocracy Oligarchy
Many Rulers Polity Democracy

This six-fold classification (which is adapted from Plato's Statesman 302c-d) sets the stage for Aristotle's inquiry into the best constitution, although it is modified in various ways throughout the Politics. For example, he observes that the dominant class in oligarchy (literally rule of the oligoi, i.e., few) is typically the wealthy, whereas in democracy (literally rule of the dêmos, i.e., people) it is the poor, so that these economic classes should be included in the definition of these forms (see Politics III.8, IV.4, and VI.2 for alternative accounts). Also, polity is later characterized as a kind of “mixed” constitution typified by rule of the “middle” group of citizens, a moderately wealthy class between the rich and poor (Politics IV.11).

Aristotle's constitutional theory is based on his theory of justice, which is expounded in Nicomachean Ethics book V. Aristotle distinguishes two different but related senses of “justice” — universal and particular — both of which play an important role in his constitutional theory. Firstly, in the universal sense “justice” means “lawfuless” and is concerned with the common advantage and happiness of the political community (NE V.1.1129b11–19, cf. Pol. III.12.1282b16–17). The conception of universal justice undergirds the distinction between correct (just) and deviant (unjust) constitutions. But what exactly the “common advantage” (koinion sumpheron) entails is a matter of scholarly controversy. Some passages imply that justice involves the advantage of all the citizens; for example, every citizen of the best constitution has a just claim to private property and to an education (Pol. VII.9.1329a23–4, 13.1332a32–8). But Aristotle also allows that it might be “in a way” just to ostracize powerful citizens even when they have not been convicted of any crimes (III.13.1284b15–20). Whether Aristotle understands the common advantage as safeguarding the interests of each and every citizen has a bearing on whether he anticipates what moderns would understand as a theory of individual rights. (See Fred Miller and Richard Kraut for differing interpretations.)

Secondly, in the particular sense “justice” means “equality” or “fairness”, and this includes distributive justice, according to which different individuals have just claims to shares of some common asset such as property. Aristotle analyzes arguments for and against the different constitutions as different applications of the principle of distributive justice (III.9.1280a7–22). Everyone agrees, he says, that justice involves treating equal persons equally, and treating unequal persons unequally, but they do not agree on the standard by which individuals are deemed to be equally (or unequally) meritorious or deserving. He assumes his own analysis of distributive justice set forth in Nicomachean Ethics V.3: Justice requires that benefits be distributed to individuals in proportion to their merit or desert. The oligarchs mistakenly think that those who are superior in wealth should also have superior political rights, whereas the democrats hold that those who are equal in free birth should also have equal political rights. Both of these conceptions of political justice are mistaken in Aristotle's view, because they assume a false conception of the ultimate end of the city-state. The city-state is neither a business enterprise to maximize wealth (as the oligarchs suppose) nor an association to promote liberty and equality (as the democrats maintain). Instead, Aristotle argues, “the good life is the end of the city-state,” that is, a life consisting of noble actions (1280b39–1281a4). Hence, the correct conception of justice is aristocratic, assigning political rights to those who make a full contribution to the political community, that is, to those with virtue as well as property and freedom (1281a4–8). This is what Aristotle understands by an “aristocratic” constitution: literally, the rule of the aristoi, i.e., best persons. Aristotle explores the implications of this argument in the remainder of Politics III, considering the rival claims of the rule of law and the rule of a supremely virtuous individual. Here absolute kingship is a limiting case of aristocracy. Again, in books VII-VIII, Aristotle describes the ideal constitution in which the citizens are fully virtuous.

4. Study of Specific Constitutions

The purpose of political science is to guide “the good lawgiver and the true politician” (IV.1.1288b27). Like any complete science or craft, it must study a range of issues concerning its subject matter. For example, gymnastics (physical education) studies what sort of training is best or adapted to the body that is naturally the best, what sort of training is best for most bodies, and what capacity is appropriate for someone who does not want the condition or knowledge appropriate for athletic contests. Political science studies a comparable range of constitutions (1288b21–35): first, the constitution which is best without qualification, i.e., “most according to our prayers with no external impediment”; second, the constitution that is best under the circumstances “for it is probably impossible for many persons to attain the best constitution”; third, the constitution which serves the aim a given population happens to have, i.e., the one that is best “based on a hypothesis”: “for [the political scientist] ought to be able to study a given constitution, both how it might originally come to be, and, when it has come to be, in what manner it might be preserved for the longest time; I mean, for example, if a particular city happens neither to be governed by the best constitution, nor to be equipped even with necessary things, nor to be the [best] possible under existing circumstances, but to be a baser sort.” Hence, Aristotelian political science is not confined to the ideal system, but also investigates the second-best constitution or even inferior political systems, because this may be the closest approximation to full political justice which the lawgiver can attain under the circumstances.

Regarding the constitution that is ideal or “according to prayer,” Aristotle criticizes the views of his predecessors in Politics and then offers a rather sketchy blueprint of his own in Politics VII and VIII. Although his own political views were influenced by his teacher Plato, Aristotle is highly critical of the ideal constitution set forth in Plato's Republic on the grounds that it overvalues political unity, it embraces a system of communism that is impractical and inimical to human nature, and it neglects the happiness of the individual citizens (Politics II.1–5). In contrast, in Aristotle's “best constitution,” each and every citizen will possess moral virtue and the equipment to carry it out in practice, and thereby attain a life of excellence and complete happiness (see VII.13.1332a32–8). All of the citizens will hold political office and possess private property because “one should call the city-state happy not by looking at a part of it but at all the citizens.” (VII.9.1329a22–3). Moreover, there will be a common system of education for all the citizens, because they share the same end (Pol. VIII.1).

If (as is the case with most existing city-states) the population lacks the capacities and resources for complete happiness, however, the lawgiver must be content with fashioning a suitable constitution (Politics IV.11). The second-best system typically takes the form of a polity (in which citizens possess an inferior, more common grade of virtue) or mixed constitution (combining features of democracy, oligarchy, and, where possible, aristocracy, so that no group of citizens is in a position to abuse its rights). Aristotle argues that for city-states that fall short of the ideal, the best constitution is one controlled by a numerous middle class which stands between the rich and the poor. For those who possess the goods of fortune in moderation find it “easiest to obey the rule of reason” (Politics IV.11.1295b4–6). They are accordingly less apt than the rich or poor to act unjustly toward their fellow citizens. A constitution based on the middle class is the mean between the extremes of oligarchy (rule by the rich) and democracy (rule by the poor). “That the middle [constitution] is best is evident, for it is the freest from faction: where the middle class is numerous, there least occur factions and divisions among citizens” (IV.11.1296a7–9). The middle constitution is therefore both more stable and more just than oligarchy and democracy.

Although Aristotle classifies democracy as a deviant constitution (albeit the best of a bad lot), he argues that a case might be made for popular rule in Politics III.11, a discussion which has attracted the attention of modern democratic theorists. The central claim is that the many may turn out to be better than the virtuous few when they come together, even though the many may be inferior when considered individually. For if each individual has a portion of virtue and practical wisdom, they may pool these assets and turn out to be better rulers than even a very wise individual. This argument seems to anticipate modern arguments for “the wisdom of the multitude” such as Condorcet's “jury theorem.”

In addition, the political scientist must attend to existing constitutions even when they are bad. Aristotle notes that “to reform a constitution is no less a task [of politics] than it is to establish one from the beginning,” and in this way “the politician should also help existing constitutions” (IV.1.1289a1–7). The political scientist should also be cognizant of forces of political change which can undermine an existing regime. Aristotle criticizes his predecessors for excessive utopianism and neglect of the practical duties of a political theorist. However, he is no Machiavellian. The best constitution still serves as a regulative ideal by which to evaluate existing systems.

These topics occupy the remainder of the Politics. Books IV–VI are concerned with the existing constitutions: that is, the three deviant constitutions, as well as polity or the mixed constitution, the best attainable under most circumstances (IV.2.1289a26–38). The whole of book V investigates the causes and prevention of revolution or political change (metabolê). Books VII–VIII are devoted to the ideal constitution. As might be expected, Aristotle's attempt to carry out this program involves many difficulties, and scholars disagree about how the two series of books (IV–VI and VII–VIII) are related to each other: for example, which were written first, which were intended to be read first, and whether they are ultimately consistent with each other. For a further discussion of this topic, see the following supplementary document:

Supplement: Characteristics and Problems of Aristotle's Politics

Aristotle's Politics did not have an immediate impact because it defended the Greek city-state, which was already becoming obsolete in his own lifetime. (As mentioned above, the Greek city-states permanently lost their independence due to the conquest by the kings of Macedon.) For similar reasons much of his discussion of particular political institutions is not directly applicable to modern nation-states (apart from his objectionable defenses of slavery, female subservience, and disenfranchisement of the working classes). Even so, Aristotle's Politics has exerted a deep influence on political philosophy until the present day, because it contains deep and thought-provoking discussions of perennial concerns of political philosophy: the role of human nature in politics, the relation of the individual to the state, the place of morality in politics, the theory of political justice, the rule of law, the analysis and evaluation of constitutions, the relevance of ideals to practical politics, the causes and cures of political change and revolution, and the importance of a morally educated citizenry.

Glossary of Aristotelian Terms

  • action: praxis
  • citizen: politês
  • city-state: polis (also ‘city’ or ‘state’)
  • community: koinônia
  • constitution: politeia (also ‘regime’)
  • free: eleutheros
  • good: agathos
  • happiness: eudaimonia
  • happy: eudaimôn
  • justice: dikaiosunê
  • law: nomos
  • lawgiver: nomothetês
  • master: despotês
  • nature: phusis
  • noble: kalon (also ‘beautiful’ or ‘fine’)
  • political: politikos (of, or pertaining to, the polis)
  • political science: politikê epistêmê
  • politician: politikos (also ‘statesman’)
  • practical: praktikos
  • practical wisdom: phronêsis
  • revolution: metabolê (also ‘change’)
  • right: exousia (also ‘liberty’)
  • ruler: archôn
  • self-sufficient: autarkês
  • sovereign: kurios
  • virtue: aretê (also ‘excellence’)
  • without qualification: haplôs (also ‘absolute’)
  • without authority: akuron

Bibliography

Note on Citations. Passages in Aristotle are cited as follows: title of treatise (italics), book (Roman numeral), chapter (Arabic numeral), line reference. Line references are keyed to the 1831 edition of Immanuel Bekker which had two columns (“a” and “b”) on each page. Politics is abbreviated as Pol. and Nicomachean Ethics as NE. In this article, “Pol. I.2.1252b27”, for example, refers to Politics book I, chapter 2, page 1252, column b, line 27. Most translations include the Bekker page number with column letter in the margin followed by every fifth line number.

Passages in Plato are cited in a similar fashion, except the line references are to the Stephanus edition of 1578 in which pages were divided into five parts (“a” through “e”).

A. Greek Text of Aristotle's Politics

  • Dreizehnter, Alois. Aristoteles' Politik. Munich: Wilhelm Fink, 1970.
  • Ross, W. D. Aristotelis Politica. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1957.

B. English Translations of Aristotle's Politics

  • Barker, Ernest, revised by Richard Stalley. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Jowett, Benjamin, in The Complete Works of Aristotle, The Revised Oxford Translation, vol. 2, ed. Jonathan Barnes. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1984.
  • Lord, Carnes. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
  • Reeve, C. D. C. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1998.
  • Simpson, Peter L. P. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1996.
  • Sinclair, T. A., revised by Trevor J. Saunders. Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1983.

The Clarendon Aristotle Series (Oxford University Press) includes translation and commentary of the Politics in four volumes:

  • Trevor J. Saunders, Politics I-II (1995).
  • Richard Robinson with a supplementary essay by David Keyt, Politics III-IV (1995).
  • David Keyt, Politics V-VI (1999).
  • Richard Kraut, Politics VII-VIII (1997).

C. Anthologies

  • Barnes, Jonathan, Malcolm Schofield, and Richard Sorabji (eds.). Articles on Aristotle, vol. 2, Ethics and Politics. London: Duckworth, 1977.
  • Höffe, Otfried ( ed.). Aristoteles Politik. Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2001.
  • Keyt, David, and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.). A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991.
  • Kraut, Richard and Steven Skultety. Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays (eds.). Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005.
  • Lord, Carnes, and David O'Connor (eds.). Essays on the Foundations of Aristotelian Political Science. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1991.
  • Patzig, Günther (ed.). Aristoteles' Politik: Akten des XI. Symposium Aristotelicum. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990.

D. Single-authored Commentaries and Overviews

  • Aquinas, Thomas. Commentary on Aristotle's Politics. Trans. Richard J. Regan. Indianapolis Publishing Co.: Hackett, 2007.
  • Barker, Ernest. The Political Thought of Plato and Aristotle. London: Methuen, 1906; repr. New York: Russell & Russell, 1959
  • Bodéüs, Richard. The Political Dimensions of Aristotle's Ethics. Albany: SUNY Press, 1993.
  • Kraut, Richard. Aristotle: Political Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002.
  • Miller, Fred D., Jr. Nature, Justice, and Rights in Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Mulgan, Richard G. Aristotle's Political Theory. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Newman, W. L. The Politics of Aristotle, 4 vols. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1887–1902; repr. Salem, NH: Ayer, 1985.
  • Nichols, Mary. Citizens and Statesmen: A Study of Aristotle's Politics. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefied, 1992.
  • Roberts, Jean. Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Aristotle and the Politics. London and New York: Routledge, 2009.
  • Schütrumpf, Eckart. Aristoteles Politik, 4 vols. Berlin and Darmstadt: Akademie Verlag, 1999–2005.
  • Simpson, Peter. A Philosophical Commentary on the Politics of Aristotle. Chapel Hill: University of North Carolina Press, 1998.
  • Susemihl, Franz, and R. D. Hicks. The Politics of Aristotle. London: Macmillan, 1894. [Omits books IV-VI.]
  • Yack, Bernard. The Problems of a Political Animal: Community, Justice, and Conflict in Aristotelian Political Thought. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993.

E. Studies of Particular Topics

1. Biographical and Textual Studies

  • Barker, Ernest. “The Life of Aristotle and the Composition and Structure of the Politics.” Classical Review 45 (1931), 162–72.
  • Jaeger, Werner. Aristotle: Fundamentals of the History of His Development. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1948.
  • Kelsen, Hans. “Aristotle and the Hellenic-Macedonian Policy.” In Jonathan Barnes et al. (eds.) Articles on Aristotle, vol. 2, Ethics and Politics. London: Duckworth, 1977, pp. 170–94.
  • Lord, Carnes. “The Character and Composition of Aristotle's Politics.” Political Theory 9 (1981), 459–78.

2. Methodology and Foundations of Aristotle's Political Theory

  • Adkins, A. W. H. “The Connection between Aristotle's Ethics and Politics.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 75–93.
  • Depew, David J. “The Ethics of Aristotle's Politics.” In Ryan K. Balot (ed.) A Companion to Greek and Roman Political Thought. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 399-418.
  • Irwin, Terence H. “Moral Science and Political Theory in Aristotle.” History of Political Thought 6 (1985), pp. 150–68.
  • Kahn, Charles H. “The Normative Structure of Aristotle's Politics.” In Günther Patzig (ed.) Aristoteles' ‘Politik’. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990, pp. 369–84.
  • Ober, Joshua. “Aristotle's Political Sociology: Class, Status, and Order in the Politics.” In Carnes Lord and David O'Connor (eds.) Essays on the Foundations of Aristotelian Political Science. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1991.
  • Pellegrin, Pierre. “On the ‘Platonic’ Part of Aristotle's Politics.” In Willaim Wians (ed.) Aristotle's Philosophical Development. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1996, pp. 347–59.
  • Rowe, Christopher J. “Aims and Methods in Aristotle's Politics.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 57–74.
  • Salkever, Stephen G. “Aristotle's Social Science.” Political Theory 9 (1981), pp. 479–508. Repr. in Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 27–64.
  • –––. Finding the Mean: Theory and Practice in Aristotelian Political Philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990.
  • Smith, Nicholas D. and Robert Mayhew. “Aristotle on What the Political Scientist Needs to Know.” In K. I. Boudouris (ed.) Aristotelian Political Philosophy, vol. 1. Athens: International Center for Greek Philosophy and Culture, 1995, pp. 189–98.

3. Political Naturalism

  • Ambler, Wayne. “Aristotle's Understanding of the Naturalness of the City.” Review of Politics 47 (1985), 163–85.
  • Annas, Julia. “Aristotle on Human Nature and Political Virtue.” The Review of Metaphysics 49 (1996), 731–54.
  • Chappell, Timothy. “‘Naturalism’ in Aristotle's Political Philosophy.” In Ryan K. Balot (ed.) A Companion to Greek and Roman Political Thought. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 382–98.
  • Cooper, John M. “Political Animals and Civic Friendship.” In Günther Patzig (ed.) Aristoteles' ‘Politik’. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990, pp. 220–41. Repr. in Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 65–89.
  • DePew, David J. “Humans and Other Political Animals in Aristotle's Historia Animalium.” Phronesis 40 (1995), 156–76.
  • Everson, Stephen. “Aristotle on the Foundations of the State.” Political Studies 36 (1988), 89–101.
  • Keyt, David. “Three Basic Theorems in Aristotle's Politics.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 118–41.
  • Kullmann, Wolfgang. “Man as a Political Animal in Aristotle.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 94–117.
  • Miller, Fred D., Jr. “Aristotle: Naturalism.” In Christopher J. Rowe and Malcolm Schofield (eds.) The Cambridge History of Greek and Roman Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000, pp. 321–43.
  • Reeve, C. D. C. “The Naturalness of the Polis in Aristotle.” In Georgios Anagnostopoulos (ed.) A Companion to Aristotle. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 512-25.

4. Household: Women, Slaves, and Children

  • Booth, William James. “Politics and the Household: A Commentary on Aristotle's Politics Book One.” History of Political Thought 2 (1981), 203–26.
  • Brunt, P. A. “Aristotle and Slavery.” In Studies in Greek History and Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993, pp. 434–88.
  • Chambliss, J. J. “Aristotle's Conception of Children and the Poliscraft.” Educational Studies 13 (1982), 33–43.
  • Cole, Eve Browning. “Women, Slaves, and ‘Love of Toil’ in Aristotle's Moral Psychology.” In Bat-Ami Bar On (ed.) Engendering Origins: Critical Feminist Readings in Plato and Aristotle. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994, pp. 127–44.
  • Fortenbaugh, W. W. “Aristotle on Slaves and Women.” In Jonathan Barnes et al. (eds.) Articles on Aristotle, vol. 2, Ethics and Politics. London: Duckworth, 1977, pp. 135–9.
  • Freeland, Cynthia. Feminist Interpretations of Aristotle. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1998.
  • Garnsey, Peter. Ideas of Slavery from Aristotle to Augustine. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Lindsay, Thomas K. “Was Aristotle Racist, Sexist, and Anti-Democratic?: A Review Essay.” Review of Politics 56 (1994), 127–51.
  • Mayhew, Robert. The Female in Aristotle's Biology: Reason or Rationalization. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2004.
  • Modrak, Deborah. “Aristotle: Women, Deliberation, and Nature.” In Bat-Ami Bar On (ed.) Engendering Origins: Critical Feminist Readings in Plato and Aristotle. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994, pp. 207–21.
  • Mulgan, Robert G. “Aristotle and the Political Role of Women.” History of Political Thought 15 (1994), 179–202.
  • Saxenhouse, Arlene W. “Family, Polity, and Unity: Aristotle on Socrates' Community of Wives.” Polity 15 (1982), 202–19.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. “Ideology and Philosophy in Aristotle's Theory of Slavery.” In Günther Patzig (ed.) Aristoteles' ‘Politik’. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990, pp. 1–27. Repr. in Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 91–119.
  • Senack, Christine M. “Aristotle on the Woman's Soul.” In Bat-Ami Bar On (ed.) Engendering Origins: Critical Feminist Readings in Plato and Aristotle. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994, pp. 223–36.
  • Smith, Nicholas D. “Plato and Aristotle on the Nature of Women.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 21 (1983), 467–78.
  • –––. “Aristotle's Theory of Natural Slavery.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 142–55.
  • Spelman, E. V. “Aristotle and the Politicization of the Soul.” In Sandra Harding and M. B. Hintikka (eds) Discovering Reality: Feminist Perspectives on Epistemology, Metaphysics, Methodology, and Philosophy of Science. Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1983, pp. 17–30.
  • –––. “Who's Who in the Polis.” In Bat-Ami Bar On (ed.) Engendering Origins: Critical Feminist Readings in Plato and Aristotle. Albany: SUNY Press, 1994, pp. 99–125.

5. Political Economy

  • Dobbs, Darrell. “Aristotle's Anticommunism.” American Journal of Political Science 29 (1985), 29–46.
  • Finley, M. I. “Aristotle and Economic Analysis.” In Jonathan Barnes et al. (eds.) Articles on Aristotle, vol. 2, Ethics and Politics. London: Duckworth, 1977, pp. 140–58.
  • Irwin, Terence H. “Aristotle's Defense of Private Property.” In In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.). A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 200–25.
  • Judson, Lindsay. “Aristotle on Fair Exchange.” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 15 (1997), 147–75.
  • Mayhew, Robert. “Aristotle on Property.” The Review of Metaphysics 46 (1993), 802–31.
  • McNeill, D. “Alternative Interpretations of Aristotle on Exchange and Reciprocity.” Public Affairs Quarterly 4 (1990), 55–68.
  • Meikle, Scott. Aristotle's Economic Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Miller, Fred D. Jr. “Property Rights in Aristotle.” In Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays, Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 121–44.
  • –––. “Was Aristotle the First Economist?” Apeiron 31 (1998), 387–98.

6. Political Justice

  • Brunschwig, Jacques. “The Aristotelian Theory of Equity.” In Michael Frede and Gisela Striker (eds.) Rationality in Greek Thought. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 115–55.
  • Georgiadis, Constantine. “Equitable and Equity in Aristotle.” In Spiro Panagiotou (ed.) Justice, Law and Method in Plato and Aristotle. Edmonton: Academic Printing & Publishing, 1987, pp. 159–72.
  • Keyt, David. “Aristotle's Theory of Distributive Justice.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 238–78.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. “Nature, Function, and Capability: Aristotle on Political Distribution.” In Günther Patzig (ed.) Aristoteles' ‘Politik’. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990, pp. 153–87.
  • Roberts, Jean. “Justice and the Polis.” In Christopher J. Rowe and Malcolm Schofield (eds.) The Cambridge History of Greek and Roman Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000, pp. 344–65.
  • Young, Charles M. “Aristotle on Justice.” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 27 (1988), 233–49.

7. Citizenship and Political Rights

  • Allan, D. J. “Individual and State in the Ethics and Politics.” Entretiens sur l'Antiquité Classique IX, La ‘Politique’ d'Aristote. Geneva: Fondation Hardt, 1964, pp. 53–95.
  • Barnes, Jonathan. “Aristotle and Political Liberty.” In Günther Patzig (ed.) Aristoteles' ‘Politik’. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990, pp. 249–63. Repr. in Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 185–201.
  • Frede, Dorothea. “Citizenship in Aristotle's Politics.” In Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 167–84.
  • Irwin, Terence H. “The Good of Political Activity.” In Günther Patzig (ed.) Aristoteles' ‘Politik’. Göttingen: Vandenhoeck & Ruprecht, 1990, pp. 73–98.
  • Kraut, Richard. “Are There Natural Rights in Aristotle?” The Review of Metaphysics 49 (1996), 755–74.
  • Long, Roderick T. “Aristotle's Conception of Freedom.” The Review of Metaphysics 49 (1996), 775–802. Repr. in Richard O. Brooks and James Bernard Murphy (eds.) Aristotle and Modern Law. Aldershot Hants UK: Ashgate Publishing Co., 2003, pp. 384–410.
  • Miller, Fred D., Jr. “Aristotle and the Origins of Natural Rights.” The Review of Metaphysics 49 (1996), 873–907.
  • –––. “Aristotle's Theory of Political Rights.” In Richard O. Brooks and James Bernard Murphy (eds.) Aristotle and Modern Law. Aldershot Hants UK: Ashgate Publishing Co., 2003, pp. 309–50.
  • Morrison, Donald. “Aristotle's Definition of Citizenship: A Problem and Some Solutions.” History of Philosophy Quarterly 16 (1999), 143–65.
  • Mulgan, Robert G. “Aristotle and the Value of Political Participation.” Political Theory 18 (1990), 195–215.
  • Roberts, Jean. “Excellences of the Citizen and of the Individual.” In Georgios Anagnostopoulos (ed.) A Companion to Aristotle. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 555-65.
  • Schofield, Malcolm. “Sharing in the Constitution.” The Review of Metaphysics 49 (1996), 831–58. Repr. in Richard O. Brooks and James Bernard Murphy (eds.) Aristotle and Modern Law. Aldershot Hants UK: Ashgate Publishing Co., 2003, pp. 353–80.
  • Zuckert, Catherine H. “Aristotle on the Limits and Satisfactions of Political Life.” Interpretation 11 (1983), 185–206.

8. Constitutional Theory

  • Bates, Clifford A. Aristotle's “Best Regime”: Kingship, Democracy, and the Rule of Law. Baton Rouge: Louisiana State University Press, 2003.
  • Collins, Susan D. Aristotle and the Rediscovery of Citzenship. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.
  • Huxley, G. “On Aristotle's Best State.” In Paul Cartledge and F. D. Harvey (eds.) Crux: Essays Presented to G. E. M. de Ste. Croix. London: Duckworth, 1985, pp. 139–49.
  • Johnson, Curtis N. Aristotle's Theory of the State. New York: Macmillan, 1990.
  • Keyt, David. “Aristotle and Anarchism.” Reason Papers 18 (1993), 133–52. Repr. in Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety. Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 203–22.
  • Kraut, Richard. “Aristotle's Critique of False Utopias.” In Otfried Höffe, Otfried ( ed.) Aristoteles Politik. Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2001, pp. 59–73.
  • Lintott, Andrew. “Aristotle and Democracy.” The Classical Quarterly (New Series) 42 (1992), 114–28.
  • Mayhew, Robert. Aristotle's Criticism of Plato's Republic. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1997.
  • –––. “Rulers and Ruled.” In Georgios Anagnostopoulos (ed.) A Companion to Aristotle. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 526-39.
  • Miller, Fred D., Jr. “Aristotle on the Ideal Constitution.” In Georgios Anagnostopoulos (ed.) A Companion to Aristotle. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 540-54.
  • Mulgan, Richard. “Aristotle's Analysis of Oligarchy and Democracy.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 307–22.
  • –––. “Constitutions and the Purpose of the State.” In Otfried Höffe, Otfried ( ed.) Aristoteles Politik. Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2001, pp. 93–106.
  • Ober, Joshua. “Aristotle's Natural Democracy.” In Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 223–43.
  • Polansky, Ronald. “Aristotle on Political Change.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 322–45.
  • Rosler, Andres. Political Authority and Obligation in Aristotle. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
  • Rowe, C. J. “Reality and Utopia.” Elenchos 10 (1989), 317–36.
  • –––. “Aristotelian Constitutions.” In Christopher J. Rowe and Malcolm Schofield (eds.) The Cambridge History of Greek and Roman Political Thought. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000, pp. 366–89.
  • Strauss, Barry. “On Aristotle's Critique of Athenian Democracy.” In Carnes Lord and David O'Connor (eds.) Essays on the Foundations of Aristotelian Political Science. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1991, pp. 212–33.
  • Vander Waert, Paul A. “Kingship and Philosophy in Aristotle's Best Regime.” Phronesis 30 (1985), 249–73.
  • Waldron, Jeremy. “The Wisdom of the Multitude: Some Reflections on Book 3, Chapter 11 of Aristotle's Politics.” Political Theory 20 (1992), 613–41. Repr. in Richard Kraut and Steven Skultety (eds.) Aristotle's Politics: Critical Essays. Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2005, pp. 145–65.

9. Education

  • Burnyeat, Myles F. “Aristotle on Learning to Be Good.” In Amelie O. Rorty (ed.) Essays on Aristotle's Ethics. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1980, pp. 69–92.
  • Curren, Randall R. Aristotle on the Necessity of Public Education. Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 2000.
  • Depew, David J. “Politics, Music, and Contemplation in Aristotle's Ideal State.” In David Keyt and Fred D. Miller, Jr. (eds.) A Companion to Aristotle's Politics. Oxford: Blackwell, 1991, pp. 346–80.
  • Kraut, Richard. “Aristotle on Method and Moral Education.” In Jyl Gentzler (ed.) Method in Ancient Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998, pp. 171–90.
  • Lord, Carnes. Education and Culture in the Political Thought of Aristotle. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1982.
  • Lynch, John Patrick. Aristotle's School. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1972.
  • Stalley, Richard. “Education and the State.” In Georgios Anagnostopoulos (ed.) A Companion to Aristotle. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, pp. 566-76.

10. Law

  • Brooks, Richard O. and James B. Murphy (eds.). Aristotle and Modern Law. Aldershot Hants UK and Burlington VT: Ashgate, 2003.
  • Burns, Tony. “Aristotle and Natural Law.” History of Political Thought 19 (1998), 142–66.
  • Hamburger, Max. Morals and Law: The Growth of Aristotle's Legal Theory. New Haven CT: Yale University Press, 1951.
  • Miller, Fred D., Jr. “Aristotle's Philosophy of Law.” In Fred D. Miller, Jr. and Carrie-Ann Biondi (eds.) A History of the Philosophy of Law from the Ancient Greeks to the Scholastics [vol. 6 of A Treatise of Legal Philosophy and General Jurisprudence, ed. Enrico Pattaro]. Dordrecht: Springer, 2007, pp.79–110.
  • Schroeder, Donald N. “Aristotle on Law.” Polis 4 (1981), 17–31. Repr. in Richard O. Brooks and James Bernard Murphy (eds.) Aristotle and Modern Law. Aldershot Hants UK: Ashgate Publishing Co., 2003, pp. 37–51.

11. Aristotle and Contemporary Politics

  • Galston, William A. Justice and the Human Good. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980.
  • Goodman, Lenn E. and Robert Talise (eds.). Aristotle's Politics Today. Albany: State University of New York Press, 2003.
  • Mulgan, Robert G. “Was Aristotle an ‘Aristotelian Social Democrat’?” Ethics 111 (2000), 79–101.
  • Murphy, James Bernard. The Moral Economy of Labor: Aristotelian Themes in Economic Theory. New Haven CT: Yale University Press, 1993.
  • Nussbaum, Martha. “Aristotlian Social Democracy.” In R. Bruce Douglas, Gerald M. Mara, and Henry S. Richardson (eds) Liberalism and the Good. London: Routledge, 1990, pp. 203–52.
  • –––. “Capabilities and Human Rights.” Fordham Law Review 66 (1997), 273–300. Repr. in Richard O. Brooks and James Bernard Murphy (eds.) Aristotle and Modern Law. Aldershot Hants UK: Ashgate Publishing Co., 2003, pp. 413–40.
  • –––. “Aristotle, Politics, and Human Capabilities: A Response to Anthony, Arneson, Charlesworth, and Mulgan.” Ethics 111 (2000), 102–40.
  • Rasmussen, Douglas B. and Douglas J. Den Uyl. Norms of Liberty: A Perfectionist Basis for Non-Perfectionist Politics. University Park PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005.
  • Tessitore, Aristide (ed.). Aristotle and Modern Politics: The Persistence of Political Philosophy. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 2002.
  • Wallach, John C. “Contemporary Aristotelianism.” Political Theory 20 (1992), 613–41.

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