Mary Astell

First published Fri Jul 1, 2005; substantive revision Tue Aug 12, 2008

Mary Astell (1666–1731) was an English philosopher. She was born in Newcastle, and lived her adult life in London. Her patrons were Lady Ann Coventry, Lady Elizabeth Hastings, and Catherine Jones, and among those in her intellectual circle were Lady Mary Chudleigh, Judith Drake, Elizabeth Elstob, Lady Mary Wortley Montagu, and John Norris. In addition to a number of pamphlets, she wrote the following books:

  • A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Parts I and II. Wherein a Method is offer'd for the Improvement of their Minds (1694, 1697)
  • Letters Concerning the Love of God Between the Author of the Proposal to the Ladies and Mr. John Norris: Wherein his late Discourse, shewing That it ought to be intire and exclusive of all other Loves, is further cleared and justified (1695)
  • Some Reflections upon Marriage, Occasion'd by the Duke and Duchess of Mazarine's Case; which is also considered (1700)
  • The Christian Religion, As Profess'd by a Daughter Of the Church of England (1705)

Today she is best known for her theories on the education of women and her critiques of Norris and John Locke.


1. Metaphysics

Mary Astell designed her metaphysics around an account of God and his creation. She was a dualist, maintaining that the two kinds of beings—minds and bodies—come in various degrees of finitude and corruptibility: God is the infinite and incorruptible mind; human minds and corporeal particles are finite, naturally incorruptible beings; and human bodies and physical objects are finite, naturally corruptible beings.

1.1 God

According to Astell, God is the “First Intelligence,” the being whose nature is to be infinite in all perfections. Among his perfections, Astell often lists wisdom, goodness, justice, holiness, intelligence, presence, power, and self-existence. In keeping with rationalist views of the period, Astell maintains that the correct understanding of metaphysics turns on the correct understanding of God. For this reason, much of her work is dedicated to demonstrating not only what God is, but also how a correct understanding of him can be attained.

Her earliest such account is in A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, where she demonstrates the existence, perfection, and necessary creative power of God. She begins by giving an example of the correct method for attaining knowledge, one similar to those developed by Descartes in Discourse on the Method and Arnauld and Nicole in Logic or the Art of Thinking (see section 2.3 of this entry). Her proof of God's existence includes an account of simple and composed ideas; clear and distinct perceptions, and obscure and confused perceptions; adequate and inadequate ideas; proofs by intuition and proofs by comparison of ideas; God's perfections and our ideas of God's perfections; and the relation between ideas and terms (Astell 2002, 176–182). In Christian Religion, she frames other arguments for God's existence in terms of what we can and cannot doubt; God's perfections and our ideas of God's perfections; causality; and the beauty of the created universe (Astell 1705, 7–10 [sections 7–10]).

At times, Astell privileges some of God's perfections over others. In Christian Religion, when stating her ontological argument for God's existence, she notes that “I find that the notion I have of GOD, contains those and all other perfections. Among which Self-existence is most remarkable, as being the original and basis of all the rest” (Astell 1705, 8 [section 7]). This claim is about the order of ideas: her idea of God's self-existence allows her to understand his other perfections. A few lines later, she makes the analogous claim about the order of reality: “And Self-existence is such a Perfection as necessarily includes all other perfections” (Astell 1705, 8 [section 8]).

Broad (2002a, 103) reveals evidence that Astell privileges God's wisdom and goodness over his omnipotence. There are two ways that philosophers of the period thought about God's attributes of wisdom, power, and goodness. Some held “intellectualist” theories, according to which God exercises his will in accordance with the true nature of things; others held  “voluntarist” theories, according to which God exercises his will to create both things and the truth of things. In showing that Astell maintains an intellectualist theology, Broad refers to a number of passages, one of which is the following:

This is then the sum of the matter; GOD who is Infinite in all Perfections, in Justice and Holiness, as well as in Goodness and Mercy, always does what is best and most becoming His Perfections, and cannot act but according to the Essential Nature and Reason of things; nor is it possible that our Wishes or Actions shou'd make any alteration in the immutable Rectitude of His Conduct. (Astell 1705, 95 [section 105]; see also Astell 2002, 205; Astell 1705, 416 [section 407])

1.2 Individuation among Beings

Throughout her texts, Astell is concerned with giving an account of how created beings are individuated from each other. Ultimately, she maintains that there are four kinds of created beings: minds, bodies, mind–body unions, and the particles that compose bodies.

About finite minds considered on their own, Astell differs quite radically from Descartes. In Discourse on the Method, Descartes remarks that all minds have the same ability to reason (AT 2; CSM 111). According to Astell, on the other hand, God creates minds with intrinsic differences. She gives a number of reasons for this view. One has to do with the relationships that God wants minds to have with each other: humans form community only if their minds have different intellectual capacities. Another concerns the relationship between created minds and God: minds were made to contemplate and enjoy God, and God needs their adoration and love. But each mind is limited and, thus, can only love God by adoring a limited amount of his works. So God creates many minds, each with an ability to understand a certain collection of truths, and in this way all of his creation is attended to (Astell 2002, 144–146, 154–155).

Though Astell discusses minds as if they are sometimes isolated from bodies, she maintains that human beings are mind–body unions. She notes that we cannot comprehend the connection between the mind and body: “We know and feel the Union between our Soul and Body, but who amongst us sees so clearly, as to find out with Certitude and Exactness, the secret ties which unite two such different Substances, or how they are able to act upon each other?” (Astell 2002, 148) The union between the mind and body is mysterious; though we “know and feel” it, we don't have perfect knowledge of it or of how the mind and body interact causally. In Christian Religion, Astell presents this same position by way of a parallel between, on the one hand, our lack of knowledge of the mind–body union, and, on the other hand, our lack of knowledge about the relation between God and humans: “Again, tho' I do not understand the Philosophy of the Union between the Divine and Human Nature; (neither do I comprehend the Vital Union between my Soul and Body, nor how and in what manner they are joyn'd, tho' I am sure that so it is) …” (Astell 1705, 51 [section 62]).

About how mind–body unions differ from each other with respect to their abilities to reason, Astell sometimes implies that experience, construed in a Lockean framework, may be the cause:

For as the Diligent-hand maketh Rich, whil'st the Slothful and Prodigal come to nothing, so the Use of our Powers improves and Encreases them, and the most Observing and Considerate is the Wisest Person: For she lays up in her Mind as in a Store-house, ready to produce on all Occasions, a Clear and Simple Idea of every Object that has at any time presented itself. And perhaps the difference between one Womans Reason and anothers may consist only in this, that the one has amass'd a greater number of such Ideas than the other, and dispos'd them more Orderly in her Understanding so that they are at hand, ready to be apply'd to those Complex Ideas whose Agreement or Disagreement cannot be found out by the means of some of ‘em. (Astell 2002, 175–176)

Her more common view, however, is a rationalist one, according to which bodies impede minds from having perfect ideas: “For did we consider what we Are, that Humane Nature consists in the Union of a Rational Soul with a Mortal Body, that the Body very often Clogs the Mind in its noblest Operations, especially when indulg'd” (Astell 2002, 210). She also presents this view in the following passage:

The Primary Cause of this is that Limitation which all Created Minds are Subject to, which Limitation appears more visible in some than in others, either because some Minds are endow'd by their Creator with a larger Capacity than the rest, or if you are not inclin'd to think so, then by reason of the Indisposition of the Bodily Organs, which cramps and contracts the Operations of the Mind. (Astell 2002, 159)

Here Astell, like other rationalists, valorizes the mind over the body. The following passage illustrates another way Astell emphasizes this point:

For I question not but that we shoul'd be convinc'd that the Body is the Instrument of the Mind and no more, that it is of such a much Inferiour Nature, and therefore ought to be kept in such a Case as to be ready on all occasions to serve the Mind. That the true and proper Pleasure of Human Nature consists in the exercise of that Dominion which the Soul has over the Body, in governing every Passion and Motion according to Right Reason, by which we most truly pursue the real good of both, it being a mistake as well of our Duty as our Happiness to consider either part of us singly, so as to neglect what is due to the other. For if we disregard the Body wholly, we pretend to live like Angels whilst we are but Mortals; and if we prefer or equal it to the Mind we degenerate into Brutes. (Astell 2002, 210–211)

Whereas the body has merely an “instrumental” role with respect to the mind, the mind has “dominion” over the body, and a governing role over the passions. Humans should correctly employ their minds and bodies so that they do not degenerate into brutes, or conduct their lives as if they were angels.

Astell's account of the mind–body union allows her to argue against the popular view of the period about women, according to which women do not demonstrate the same kinds of intellectual abilities as do men because women are inherently more closely united to their bodies than are men (Broad 2002a, 109). Equip with the rationalist account of the mind–body union, Astell can show that the uniformity of women's inabilities is rooted not in their natures, but arises because of social practices. Thus the difference between the abilities of women and men should be explained not metaphysically, but epistemologically. For this reason, I will leave a discussion of this issue to section 2.3 of this entry.

In addition to developing an account of the mind–body union, Astell also maintains that the mind and body are “really distinct.” As she had a social reason for developing her account of the mind–body union—namely, to argue against the popular account of women's nature—she also had a social reason for constructing arguments about the real distinction between the mind and body: by showing that the mind, unlike the body, is immortal, she can illustrate to people, especially those who believe in the existence of God, how God's existence is important to them (Astell 1705, CR 246–247 [section 256]).

In presenting this account of the real distinction between the mind and body in Christian Religion, Astell demonstrates first that the mind is immaterial and then that it is immortal. She maintains that the mind is immaterial in that it has no parts, and so is indivisible. Given that it is indivisible, it is incorruptible, and so immortal (Astell 1705, 247 [section 257]). Having ruled out the natural annihilation of minds, Astell turns to the question of whether God would supernaturally annihilate them. She argues that he would not, for God does nothing in vain, thus he would not create something only to annihilate it (Astell 1705, 248–249 [section 257–258]).

Within her discussion about the immortality of minds, Astell contrasts minds with bodies, and different kinds of bodies with each other. Unlike minds, human bodies and other physical objects have parts, and so are corruptible. Such bodies differ from the particles that make them up, which do not corrupt:

Because, tho' this System of Bones, Flesh, and Skin, &. which I call my body, shall within Threescore Years; and this Wood which is now upon the Fire, shall in an Hour or two; and all other Material Beings shall in their proper Seasons be no more; yet not the least Particle doth totally perish. (Astell 1705, 247–248 [section 257])

Here Astell embraces a view according to which physical objects and human bodies are not “beings” in the same sense that particles of bodies are. In the next passages, she also reveals a phenomenalist view about the individuality of physical objects: their “being” is based on appearances, not anything intrinsic:

So that a Being is Mortal and Corruptible, or ceases to Be, when those parts of which it consists, and whose particular Composition and Figure is that which denominates it this or that Being, and which distinguishes it from all other Beings, are no longer thus or United, but ceasing to appear under their first Texture and Figure, are therefore very properly said to Be no more. (Astell 1705, 248 [section 257])

In the next passages, Astell presents a proof of the real distinction between the mind and body. Her argument is similar to Descartes's insofar as she maintains that the nature of the mind is thought and the nature of the body is extension (Astell 1705, 249–252 [sections 259–261]). (See Atherton, 1993, for a discussion of Astell's account of thought as the nature of the mind.) In the sections that follow these, she uses her account of the real distinction between the mind and body to formulate a critique of Locke's view about the possibility of thinking matter. Bryson (1988), Squadrito (1987; 1991), Taylor (2001), O'Neill (1998a, 528–529), and Broad (2002a, 151–153) discuss these arguments in detail.

1.3 The Relation between God and His Creatures

In Letters Concerning the Love of God, Astell and John Norris debate occasionalist and Cambridge Platonist accounts of the relation between God and his creation. (See Wilson, 2004, for a detailed discussion of this text.) The central issue at stake is the claim made by Norris in Practical Discourses upon Several Divine Subjects (1693) that we should love God because he alone is the source of our sensation, and so the source of our pleasure, and so the source of our good. Astell objects: our reason for loving God should not depend on the occasionalist tenet about God's direct causal role in the universe. The issues in their discussion are the extent of God's causal role in creation, the causal powers of physical objects, the workings of human sense perception, the mind–body union, and the ways humans can and should love God and his creation.

Astell and Norris agree on an account of human love, holding that as bodies have motion so minds have love. A remnant of this parallel is still with us in the twenty-first century, for we say metaphorically that we are “moved” when we experience a shift in our emotions toward a kind of tenderness. Broad notes that Astell and Norris also agree that there are two basic kinds of love and that they are differentiated in part with respect to the objects on which the love is focused. On the one hand, creatures deserve “benevolence,” which is marked by its disinterestedness and motivated by altruism and charity; created things, after all, lack the casual power to ultimately satisfy the desires of other created beings. On the other hand, God merits “desire,” which is a love of something as our good. Ultimately, he is the only one who has the causal power to ultimately satisfy our desires. God does not need our benevolence, for he cannot lack anything that we could give him (Broad 2002a, 119–120).

Astell and Norris's shared views on love relate to their views on causality. Occasionalists and Cambridge Platonists developed accounts of causality in order to remedy a purported problem with Descartes's ontology. According to Descartes, God created two different kinds of substances—mental and corporeal—that, on the one hand, are “really distinct” from each other in virtue of their essences, and, on the other hand, are sometimes united to form mind–body unions. When so united, minds and bodies interact with each other, for instance during sensation. The purported problem is this: how can two substances that have completely different essences—essences that render them “really distinct” substances—interact with each other?

With an eye toward resolving this problem, Cambridge Platonists retained an account of the interaction between the mind and body, and presented a quite different interpretation of the number and nature of substances that exist. Henry More, for example, maintained that, in addition to the souls of God and living creatures, there is the “Spirit of Nature,” which is the causal agent that allows human minds and bodies to interact.

The occasionalist philosophers resolved the problem another way: they agreed with Descartes that the mind and body are really distinct because of their quite different natures, but they denied that there is any interaction between them. Instead, they maintained that God orchestrates a harmonious correlation between events of the mind and events of the body, and he is the efficient (and so direct) cause of human sensations.

Throughout Letters, Norris defends his occasionalism against Astell's critiques, which were based on Cambridge Platonist views about the nature of the mind–body union. In the appendix—written after Norris convinced Astell to allow him to publish the letters as a volume—Astell presents two final criticisms of Norris's account. First, occasionalism makes much of God's creation vain: if God is the efficient cause of all of our sense perceptions, then his creation of material objects is superfluous, for they play no direct role in our sense perceptions (Astell, Norris 1695, 278–80). Second, occasionalism offends God's majesty, for according to it he repeatedly interferes in creation in order to move bodies and create mental events. (Astell, Norris 1695, 278). See O'Neill (2007) for a history of these arguments in St. Thomas' critiques of medieval Islamic occasionalists.

Astell's own view about the causation of sensation involves an account of a “sensible congruity” between features of external bodies and powers of the soul that are employed in sensations. For discussions of her account, as well as arguments about whether its roots are in Descartes, Malebranche, or Norris, see Acworth (1979, 174, 178), Taylor (2001, 511–2), Broad (2002a, 109), and O'Neill (2007).

2. Epistemology

Astell develops three themes common to rationalism: an emphasis of the mind over the body; a theory of innate ideas as the origin of knowledge; and a methodology that leads the novice from confusion to clarity. In the section above on metaphysics, I addressed Astell's emphasis of the mind over body. In this section I will reconstruct her accounts of mind, ideas, knowledge, belief, and method.

2.1. Mind and Ideas

Astell holds that the mind has two faculties: the understanding and the will. The understanding is the capacity to receive and compare ideas, and the will is the power of preferring and directing thoughts and motions (Astell 2002, 205). Each faculty has a proper object: the proper object of the understanding is truth, which has “being from Eternity in the Divine Ideas” (Astell 2002, 137); the proper object of the will is the good, which is God's will (Astell 2002, 206). When the understanding is healthy, it has knowledge (Astell 2002, 130); when the will is healthy, it is regular—that is, it is guided by the understanding (Astell 2002,205, 209). The task of the understanding is to govern the will (Astell 2002, 130).

Astell holds a nativism according to which there are not merely innate ideas, but also innate inclinations. She explains that the innate ideas are “rudiments of knowledge” (Astell 2002, 128) that are “inseparable” from the understanding and are the sources of our other ideas (Astell 2002, 205). In addition, she states that we are born with inclinations that are “inseparable” from the will (Astell 2002, 205). She explains that our innate ideas make us rational creatures. Irrational creatures, on the other hand, act according to the will of God and by mechanism. But equipped with reason, humans are voluntary agents: we choose our actions according to principles in the understanding, and we determine our wills (Astell 2002, 128). (For a further discussion of these passages, see Atherton 1993, 29–35, and Sowaal 2007, 228–31.)

Astell provides two accounts of ideas, one general and one strict. In doing so, she presents her views on knowledge and clear and distinct perceptions. Here is the general account of idea:

By Ideas we sometimes understand in general all that which is the immediate Object of the Mind, whatever it Perceives; and in this large Sense it may take in all Thought, all that we are any ways capable of Discerning: So when we have no Idea of a thing, 'tis as much as to say we know nothing of the matter. (Astell 2002, 168)

In the general sense ideas—the immediate objects of the mind—are required for knowledge. Here is the strict account of idea:

Again, it is more strictly taken for that which represents to the Mind some object distinct from it, whether Clearly or Confusedly; when this is its import, our Knowledge is said to be as Clear as our Ideas are. For that Idea which represents a thing so Clearly, that by an Attent and Simple View we may discern its Properties and Modifications, at least so far as they can be Known, is never false; for our Certainty and Evidence depends on it, if we Know not Truly what is thus represented to our Minds we know nothing. (Astell 2002, 168)

Ideas in the strict sense represent what is distinct from the idea. As such, ideas must be clear in order for them to afford knowledge. In the following passage, Astell employs Descartes's account of clear and distinct perceptions from Principles of Philosophy, Part I, section 45 (AT VIIIA 21–2; CSM I 207):

That (to use the words of a Celebrated Author) may be said to be “Clear which is Present and Manifest to an attentive Mind;” so as we say we see Objects Clearly, when being present to our Eyes they sufficiently Act on 'em, and our Eyes are dispos'd to regard 'em. And that Distinct, which is so Clear, Particular, and Different from all other things, that it contains not any thing in it self which appears not manifestly to him who considers it as he ought. (Astell 2002, 172)

Astell differs from Descartes, however, in maintaining that we have clear but not distinct (or perfect) ideas of God and souls. She holds that though we can know some of the attributes of these substances, we cannot know their true natures (Astell 2002, 173).

For Astell, though ideas can be confused, they are not the sources of error. Rather, Astell locates falsity and error in judgments, and often in language (Astell 2002, 169, 171). She holds that judgment involves the comparison of two ideas and that sometimes we lack an “intermediate idea” (a “middle term”) in order to make a judgment (Astell 2002, 146–7, 172–3).

On this view, we can avoid error in judgment when we are careful in separating and uniting ideas; we can avoid equivocation in language when we only use words that have distinct ideas attached to them. To do this kind of work, we need to first examine ideas about morality and religion, separating what we find through metaphysical reflection from what we have adopted by custom. Ultimately all reasonings and deductions should begin from ideas that are clear and are “as distinct as the nature of the subject will permit” (Astell 2002, 169–72).

2.2. Knowledge and Belief

Astell does not hold a “traditional” account of knowledge as true, justified belief. Rather, on her view knowledge and belief are ideas that are distinguished by origin, clarity, distinctness, and the means by which they are affirmed. What follows is a reconstruction of her discussion of these issues in Serious Proposal (Astell 2002, 146–153).

Given the finitude of the human mind, it is limited with respect to its reach, and it is diverse in its modes of thinking. Astell states the following about the reach of the mind:

Truth in general is the Object of the Understanding, but all Truths are not equally Evident, because of the Limitation of the Humane Mind, which tho' it can gradually take in many Truths, yet cannot any more than our sight attend to many things at once…. (Astell 2002, 146)

About the modes of thinking, she writes:

Tho the Human Intellect has a large extent, yet being limited as we have already said, this Limitation is the Cause of those different Modes of Thinking, which for distinction sake we call Faith, Science and Opinion. (Astell 2002, 149)

In addition to faith, science, and opinion, Astell also discusses moral certainty and sensation. She notes that sensation is not so much a mode of knowledge as it is a kind of being conscious (Astell 2002, 152).

Astell's account of the modes of thinking is related to her view about how we come to hold truths, of which there are two ways. The first is marked by passivity: some truths are delivered to us. They can be delivered to us by our own understandings, that is, by intuition; or they can be delivered to us by authority. When truths are delivered by intuition, we have ideas that are clear and distinct, self-evident, indubitable, compel the will, and serve as first principles. When they are delivered by authority they are dubitable, confused, and lack self-evidence. The second way we come to hold truths is marked by activity: such truths are drawn by demonstration from other truths.

Science is our mode of thinking when we intuit a truth and when we hold that truth because we have derived it (by reasoning and deduction) from an intuition. In the latter case, we hold “objects of science.” In both cases, we have “knowledge.”

Faith is our mode of thinking when we hold a truth given to us by authority and when we derive additional truths from such truths. In both cases we hold “objects of faith” and we have “belief.”

“Moral certainty” is our mode of thinking when we draw ideas by demonstration from premises that are a mix of knowledge and belief; “opinion” is our mode of thinking when we hold ideas drawn either by bad argument or by an argument in which confused ideas serve as premises.

Ideas attained through intuition are the highest form of knowledge. These ideas are clear and distinct, self-evident, and indubitable; further, these ideas compel the will. The “objects of science” that are derived by demonstration from intuitions have a very high epistemic status and command a firm assent. Though Astell maintains that all beliefs are dubitable, as they lack self-evidence as well as clarity and distinctness, she holds that objects of faith can share the elevated epistemic status maintained by intuitions and objects of science:

The Objects of Faith are as Certain and as truly Intelligible in themselves as those of Science, as has been said already, only we become persuaded of the Truth of them by another Method, we do not See them so clearly and distinctly as to be unable to disbelieve them. Faith has a mixture of the Will that it may be rewardable, for who will thank us for giving our Assent where it was impossible to withhold it? Faith then may be said to be the sort of Knowledge capable of Reward, and Men are Infidels not for want of Conviction, but thro an unwillingness to Believe. (Astell 2002, 151)

For Astell, the will, which is involved whenever we hold a truth, is moved in different ways depending on the situation and the kind of truth involved. When we hold a self-evident truth, our wills are compelled by the clarity and distinctness of the idea: we “see” the truth so clearly and distinctly that we cannot doubt it; that is, we cannot but assent to it. On the other hand, when a truth is delivered to us from an authority, and we do not have a clear and distinct perception of the truth, then our wills are not compelled by the idea. In such cases, if we are to affirm the idea, we must move our wills ourselves. What is striking about Astell's view is that she maintains that we are as certain when we move our wills to affirm objects of faith as when our wills are compelled to affirm intuitions and objects of science.

However, this is not to say that we should intentionally move our wills to affirm truths about which we can have clear and distinct ideas when we do not currently have such clear and distinct ideas. That is, those truths that are candidates for knowledge (intuitions or objects of science) should known and not merely believed. This is especially true with respect to what she calls “the ideas of the philosophers”:

[H]ow many of us daily make that a matter of Faith which indeed belongs to Science, by adhering blindly to the Dictates of some famous Philosopher in Physical Truths, the Principles of which we have as much right to examine, and to make deductions from 'em as he had? (Astell 2002, 152)

This connects to Astell's view on wisdom: “to Know what is to be Known, and to Believe what is to be Believ'd is the property of a Wise person” (Astell 2002, 152). It also provides one of the theoretical bases for Astell's views on education.

2.3. Method

One thread running throughout rationalism is the coupling of an analysis of what prevents the novice from having knowledge with the development of a method to lead the novice from confusion to knowledge (see Nelson 2005). For example, Plato explains how the body confuses the soul, and he illustrates how the dialectic can lead his interlocutor to grasp the forms. Descartes agrees with Plato about the body's confusion of the soul, adding that scholastic teachings lead to further confusion, especially in that they reinforce childhood prejudice, which is rooted in an overemphasis on the senses. His famous method of doubt is one instantiation of his general account of method, encapsulated in the four rules he presents in Part II of Discourse on the Method (AT VI 18–9; CSM I 20). In Discourse on the Method and Meditations on First Philosophy, the meditator utilizes the method of doubt so she can move from confusion and obscurity to clarity and distinctness.

Astell, too, provides an explanation of the novice's initial confusion and offers a method that can be employed to resolve the condition. Astell's position on these issues is especially interesting in that she examines the female novice, theorizing an explanation of what is specific about her initial confusion and constructing a method tailored specifically for her.

As Astell sees it, the problem that faces the female novice is that she has a diseased mind as the result of social conditioning. This diseased mind manifests in part as a particular skeptical predicament: she has a radical doubt about her nature, for she believes God made her with a degraded reason. That is, she adopts the prejudice that she is incapable of improvement because she is naturally proud and vain (Astell 2002, 58, 62). Gripped with this skeptical predicament, she has no desire to improve her mind, and she lacks an ability to understand her perfections, which would otherwise guide her in living a virtuous life (Astell 2002, 80–1, 200, 202, 228).

Another way Astell frames the problem facing women is in terms of an account of the passions. She maintains that women, like men, are born with both generosity and a striving for perfection. Though Astell does not say what she means by the term ‘generosity’, I will assume she is using the term in the Cartesian sense. Descartes writes:

The first consists in his knowing that nothing truly belongs to him but this freedom to dispose his volitions, and that he ought to be praised or blamed for no other reason than his using this freedom well or badly. The second consists in his feeling within himself a firm and constant resolution to use it well—that is, never to lack the will to undertake and carry out whatever he judges to be best. To do that is to pursue virtue in a perfect manner. (AT 11 445–6; CSM I 364)

Roughly, a person has generosity when she realizes that she is merely her will and she has the resolution to use it well. For Descartes, generosity is both a passion and a virtue. It is the keystone passion in that when one has it, one does not have vices. This is so because vices rest on a misunderstanding of what one is and what one's goods are.

Astell explains that because women are not provided with rich metaphysical educations they do not develop the knowledge of what they truly are (their wills), nor do they develop the resolution to use their wills well. Instead, they focus on creating physical perfection and also on the praises that accompany it. Thus they develop vanity and pride, the “feminine vices” (Astell 2002, 62–64). Ultimately, women's salvation is at stake:

And since our Happiness in the next World, depends so far on those dispositions which we carry along with us out of this, that without a right habitude and temper of mind we are not capable of Felicity; and seeing our Beatitude consists in the contemplation of the divine Truth and Beauty, as well as in the fruition of his Goodness, can Ignorance be a fit preparative for Heaven? Is't likely that she whose Understanding has been busied about nothing but froth and trifles, shou'd be capable of delighting her self in noble and sublime Truths? (Astell 2002, 80–81)

Astell's overall project with respect to education is designed to address this problem of salvation. If a woman does not learn to separate her mind from her body while on earth—that is, if she does not learn to perfect her rational capacities by forming clear and distinct perceptions, thereby polishing her innate ideas and ordering them correctly—she will not be able to separate her mind from her body when she dies, and so her soul will not reach heaven. In this way Astell's rationalist education remedies a very practical problem of the individuation of the body and soul at death. This elucidates the kind of education Astell promotes: it is not preparation for a career as a doctor, lawyer, curate, or scientist, nor is it the precursor to what we today call a “liberal education”; instead it is an education that teaches women how to cultivate intellectual enjoyment and perfection, and ultimately generosity and virtue.

Astell recognizes that women need to employ a method to aid them in this metaphysical education. Women, especially those of the gentry, have been raised to be idle and to concern themselves with frivolous things. When they seek to better themselves, they do not know how and are quickly discouraged: “they want [lack] the method of doing it; they know not how to look into their Souls, or if they do, they find so many disorders to be rectified, so many wants to be supplied, that frightened with the difficulty of the world they lay aside the thoughts of undertaking it” (Astell 2002, 124). Astell suggests to women six rules that will aid them in their metaphysical reflections (Astell 2002, 176–9).

Rule 1: “Acquaint our selves thoroughly with the State of the Question, have a Distinct Notion of our Subject whatever it be, and of the Terms we make use of, knowing precisely what it is we drive at.”
Rule 2: “Cut off all needless Ideas and whatever has not a necessary Connexion to the matter under consideration.”
Rule 3: “To conduct our Thoughts by Order, beginning with the most Simple and easie Objects, and ascending by Degrees to the Knowledge of more Compos'd.”
Rule 4: “Not to leave out part of our Subject unexamin'd.”
Rule 5: “Always keep our Subject Directly in our Eye, and Closely pursue it thro all, our Progress.”
Rule 6: “To judge no further than we Perceive, and not to take anything for Truth, which we do not evidently Know to be so.”

Like many of Astell's views and distinctions, these rules are ripe for comparison with Descartes's, as well as with those presented by Arnauld and Nicole. Indeed, these rules are part of Astell's version of Arnauld and Nicole's Port-Royal Logic, which she designs specifically for women so that they can escape their everyday skepticism; only once they resolve their skeptical predicaments can they begin to embark on a project of reflection involving philosophical skepticism, as Descartes presents it in Discourse on the Method and Meditations on First Philosophy (see Sowaal 2007).

The method encapsulated in these six rules is to be employed when a meditator addresses a particular subject of inquiry. But even prior to such reflections, Astell recognizes that the female meditator must first disengage from the skeptical predicament. Women should learn to maintain beliefs because they are self-evident, not because they once held them. To do so, Astell suggests a number of strategies. One is reflecting on how the former prejudices led to mischief, promoted error, and hindered the free range of thought. Further, one should reflect on how the prejudices provided a means for skepticism to take root. For example, when one holds a belief, one often draws further conclusions from it. But when one finds that the conclusion is false, one often questions the whole group of claims, concluding that nothing can be known (Astell 2002, 133–4). Here Astell's treatment is largely Cartesian.

However, Astell departs from a Cartesian project when she presents another strategy the female meditator can use to release herself from the skeptical predicament, one that involves reflection on teleological arguments about the design of God's creation (Astell 2002, 153–4, 168). These arguments are designed to help the novice realize that God would not have created her so that she is naturally defective, (naturally proud, vain, and unimprovable). Such reflection will lead the novice to search for the perfections God has bestowed upon her and the role they play in her life, as well as in her community and creation as a whole. Through these considerations, she will be drawn to the conclusion that she is a rational being who can and ought to improve her rationality in order to fulfill God's plan for creation.

Ultimately the female novice will benefit from metaphysical reflection on what truly exists—God, mind, and body—for such reflection will result in her correctly understanding what she is and how she stands in relation to God. A central aspect of this will be her new comprehension of the understanding, the will, and the origin of error. She will come to grasp that the limitation of the understanding is not a defect, it is natural and necessary; thus, while ignorance cannot be avoided, error can. She will realize that the understanding is passive and that judgment—and therefore error—belongs to the will. She will learn to suspend her judgment until she has clarity and to direct her will to a good end (Astell 2002, 159). With this new understanding of her will and her new resolution to develop better habits in employing her will, her generosity (which formerly degraded into pride, vanity) will be restored, as will her virtue.

Bibliography

Primary Sources

  • Arnauld, A. and Nicole, P., 1996, Logic or the Art of Thinking: Containing, besides rules, several new observations appropriate for forming judgment, J. V. Buroker (tr. and ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Astell, M., 1705, The Christian Religion, As Profess'd by a Daughter of the Church of England. In a Letter to the Right Honourable, T.L. C.I., London: R. Wilkin.
  • –––, 1996. Astell: Political Writings, P. Springborg (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002. A Serious Proposal to the Ladies. Parts I and II, P. Springborg (ed.), Ontario: Broadview Literary Texts.
  • Astell, M. and Norris, J., 1695, Letters Concerning the Love of God, Between the Author of the Proposal to the Ladies and Mr. John Norris: Wherein his late Discourse, shewing That it ought to be intire and exclusive of all other Loves, is further cleared and justified, London: J. Norris.
  • Descartes, R., 1985, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, J. Cottingham, R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch (eds. and trs.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, vol. i (abbreviated as ‘CSM’ and cited by page number).
  • –––, 1996. Oeuvres de Descartes, C. Adam and P. Tannery (eds.), Paris: Librairie Philosophique J. Vrin, vol. vi (abbreviated as ‘AT’ and cited by page number).
  • Locke, J., 1975, An Essay Concerning Human Understanding, P. H. Niddich (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Norris, J., 1693, Practical Discourses Upon several Divine Subjects, London: S. Manship.

Secondary Sources

  • Acworth, R., 1979, The Philosophy of John Norris of Bemerton (1657–1712), Hildesheim/New York: Georg Olms Verlag.
  • Atherton, M., 1993, “Cartesian Reason and Gendered Reason”, in A Mind of One's Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity, L.M. Antony and C. Witt (eds.), Boulder and Oxford: Westview Press, pp. 19–34.
  • Broad, J., 2002a, Women Philosophers of the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Bryson, C.B., 1988, “Mary Astell: Defended of the ‘Disembodied Mind’”, Hypatia 13(4): 40–62.
  • Nelson, A., 2005, “The Rationalist Impulse”, in A Companion to Rationalism, A. Nelson (ed.), Malden, MA: Blackwell, pp. 3–11.
  • O'Neill, E., 1998, “Astell, Mary (1666–1731)”, in Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, vol. 1, Craig (ed.), New York: Routledge, pp. 527–30.
  • –––, 2007, “Mary Astell on the Causation of Sensation”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 145–64.
  • Sowaal, A., 2007, “Mary Astell's Serious Proposal: Mind, Method, and Custom”, Philosophy Compass 2(2): 227–43.
  • Squadrito, K.M., 1987, “Mary Astell's Critique of Locke's View of Thinking Matter”, Journal of History of Philosophy 25: 433–439.
  • –––, 1991, “Mary Astell”, A History of Women Philosophers. Vol. III: 1600–1800, M.E. Waithe (ed). Dordrecht [Netherlands]; Boston: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • Taylor, E.D., 2001, “Mary Astell's Ironic Assault on John Locke's Theory of Thinking Matter”, Journal of the History of Ideas 62(3): 505–522.
  • Wilson, C., 2004, “Love of God and Love of Creatures”, History of Philosophy Quarterly 21(3): 281–298.

Other Important Works

  • Broad, J., 2002b, “Mary Astell (1666–1731)”, in British Philosophers 1500–1899, P.B. Dematteis and P.S. Fosl (eds.), Dictionary of Literary Biography 252, pp. 3–10.
  • –––, 2007, “Astell, Cartesian Ethics, and the Critique of Custom”, in Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, W. Kolbrener and M. Michelson (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 165–179.
  • Carroll, B. A., 1990, “The Politics of ‘Originality’: Women and the Class System of the Intellect,”, Journal of Women's History, 2(2): 136–63.
  • Duran, J., 2000, “Mary Astell: A Pre-Humean Christian Empiricist and Feminist”, in Presenting Women Philosophers, C. Tougas and S. Ebenreck (eds), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 147–154.
  • Ellenzwig, S., 2003, “The Love of God and the Radical Enlightenment: Mary Astell's Brush with Spinoza”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 63(3): 379–87.
  • Ezell, M. J. M., 1993, Writing Women's Literary History, Baltimore: The Johns Hopkins University Press.
  • Hill, B., 1986, The First English Feminist: “Reflections upon Marriage” and Other Writings by Mary Astell, Aldershot, Hants: Grower Publishing.
  • Kinnaird, J. K., 1979, “Mary Astell and the Conservative Contribution to English Feminism”, Journal of British Studies, 19(1): 53–75.
  • Kolbrener W. and M. Michelson, 2007, Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith, Aldershot: Ashgate. [Reprint of the introduction is available online.]
  • O'Donnell, S., 1978, “Mr. Locke and the Ladies: The Indelible Words on the Tabula Rasa”, Studies in Eighteenth Century Culture 8: 151–64.
  • O'Neill, E., 1998b, “Disappearing Ink: Early Modern Women Philosophers and their Fate in History,” in Philosophy in a Feminist Voice: Critiques and Reconstructions, J. A. Kournay (ed), Princeton: Princeton University Press, pp. 17–62.
  • –––, 1999, “Women Cartesians, ‘Feminine Philosophy’, and Historical Exclusion”, in Feminist Interpretations of René Descartes, S. Bordo (ed), University Park, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 232–57.
  • –––, 2005, “Early Modern Women Philosophers and the History of Philosophy,” Hypatia 20(3): 185–97.
  • Perry, R, 1986, The Celebrated Mary Astell: An Early English Feminist, Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––,1990, “Mary Astell and the Feminist Critique of Possessive Individualism”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 23(4): 444–57.
  • –––, 1985, “Radical Doubt and the Liberation of Women”, Eighteenth-Century Studies, 18(4): 472–93.
  • Smith, F., 1916, Mary Astell, Columbia: Columbia University Press.
  • Smith, H. L., 1982, Reason's Disciples: Seventeenth-Century English Feminists, Urbana: University of Illinois Press.
  • Spender, D., 1982, Women of Ideas and What Men Have Done to Them: From Aphra Behn to Adrienne Rich, London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Springborg, P., 2002, “Introduction”, A Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Parts I and II, Ontario: Broadview Literary Texts.
  • –––, 2005, Mary Astell: Theorist of Freedom from Domination, Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.
  • Taylor E. D., “Introduction Mary Astell and John Norris: A Correspondence”, in Mary Astell And John Norris: Letters Concerning The Love Of God, E. D. Taylor and M. New (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate, pp. 1–41. [Reprint available online.]
  • Thickstun, M. O., 1991, “‘This was a Woman that taught’: Feminist Scriptural Exegesis in the Seventeenth Century”, Studies in Eighteenth-Century Culture 21: 149–58.
  • Waters, K., 2002, “Sources of Political Authority: John Locke and Mary Astell”, in Introduction, Women and Men Political Theorists: Enlightened Conversations, Malden, Massachusetts: Blackwell, pp. 5–19.
  • Weiss, P., 2004, “Mary Astell: Including Women's Voices in Political Theory”, Hypatia 19(3): 63–84.
  • –––, 1996, “Wollstonecraft and Rousseau: The Gendered Fate of Political Theorists”, in Feminist Interpretations of Mary Wollstonecraft, (Series: Re-Reading the Canon) M. J. Falco (ed), University Park, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania State University Press, pp. 15–32.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
sep man icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
sep man icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

  • Chapter 1 from Mary Astell: Reason, Gender, Faith (Ashgate, 2007)
  • Intoduction to E. Derek Taylor's and Melvyn New's edition of Astell's letters: Mary Astell and John Norris: Letters Concerning the Love of God (Ashgate, 2005).
  • Selections from Astell's works, at Luminarium

Related Entries

Cambridge Platonists | Descartes, René | Locke, John | Norris, John | occasionalism

Copyright © 2008 by
Alice Sowaal <asowaal@sfsu.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free