Peter Auriol

First published Wed Nov 6, 2002; substantive revision Thu Sep 10, 2009

While the French Franciscan Peter Auriol (ca. 1280–1322) has not attracted as much attention as has his slightly younger contemporary William Ockham, nevertheless on many topics Auriol was probably just as influential among fourteenth century thinkers as was the Venerable Inceptor. Often explicitly rejecting the ideas of Thomas Aquinas, Henry of Ghent, and most importantly John Duns Scotus, Auriol created interesting, innovative, and frequently controversial positions over a whole range of philosophical and theological issues — not least in his theory of cognition — and many of his positions set the terms of debate for later thinkers like Gregory of Rimini and John Capreolus.

1. Life and Works

As with many of his contemporaries, we know very few dates with certainty in the life of Peter Auriol (a.k.a. Peter Auriole, Peter Aureol, Petrus Aureoli, the Doctor Facundus). On the basis of his later career it seems reasonable to suppose that Auriol was born around 1280, and we have evidence that he originated in the region near the city of Cahors in France. We know that Auriol joined the Franciscan order in the order's province of Aquitania, and we surmise that this took place sometime before 1300. From the structure of the contemporary Franciscan educational system we can deduce that he studied in Paris sometime in the first decade of the fourteenth century, but evidence that some scholars have presented that Auriol heard Scotus in Paris or was definitely in Paris in 1304 is inconclusive. Auriol's first written work, dealing with the issue of Franciscan poverty (Tractatus de paupertate et usu paupere), seems to have been composed in 1311 or at latest early 1312. In the latter year we know that Auriol was teaching in Bologna, presumably at the Franciscan convent in that city. It was here that he authored his Tractatus de principiis naturae (Treatise on the principles of nature), his only non-theological work. By the end of 1314, Auriol was in Toulouse, again apparently teaching at the Franciscan convent, and it seems that the two treatises that he authored in support of the Immaculate Conception of the Virgin Mary (and in opposition to Dominican critics of that view) stem from this time (Tractatus de conceptione Beatae Mariae Virginis and Repercussorium). In one or both of these cities, Auriol must have also been lecturing on the standard medieval theological textbook, the Sentences of Peter Lombard, and his massive commentary on the first book of the Sentences, his Scriptum super primum Sententiarum — more than 1100 folio pages in its early modern printing (Rome 1596) — was almost certainly substantially finished by the autumn of 1316 when Auriol arrived in Paris, sent by the Franciscan order to earn his doctorate. Auriol read the Sentences at Paris 1316–18. No less a figure than Pope John XXII, Auriol's mentor, wrote to the Chancellor of Paris in a letter dated July 14, 1318, asking that Auriol be granted the doctorate. The letter served its purpose, and by late 1318 he was the Franciscan regent master in theology there. Auriol served as regent master in Paris until 1320 or 1321, lecturing on the Bible (from which resulted several extant biblical commentaries), and holding at least one series of quodlibetal disputations. In 1321, he was elevated by John XXII to the position of Archbishop of Aix-en-Provence, but Auriol died soon after taking office, probably on January 22, 1322. (See, for more details, Teetaert 1935, and esp. Buytaert 1952).

As should be clear from the above, Auriol's extant works are predominantly theological in nature, having been composed in connection with his duties as a theological student and teacher. Nevertheless, especially his commentary on Peter Lombard's Sentences is a treasure trove of philosophical thought spanning a vast range of issues in metaphysics, epistemology and philosophy of mind, natural philosophy, and ethics; it is in addition his most important and influential work. We possess several versions of Auriol's Sentences commentary. Besides the Scriptum, which, as mentioned above, was mostly composed before Auriol arrived in Paris in the autumn of 1316, we have reportationes (student transcripts) of lectures that Auriol held on all four books of the Sentences, some of which have obviously been reworked to one degree or another by Auriol himself and some of which are still found only in medieval manuscripts. A version of his commentary on books II-IV was published in Rome in 1605 (along with Auriol's single Quodlibet of sixteen questions). In part because the project to critically edit all of Auriol's works has been initiated only recently, the complex relationship between these published texts and other versions, found only in manuscripts, as well as the relationship between the published Scriptum and the extant reportationes on book I of the Sentences, is not entirely clear. (See however, Nielsen 2002; Schabel 2000a, pp. 67–76; Schabel 2000b; Duba 2000; for more information on Auriol's works, see the bibliography on the Peter Auriol Homepage (Other Internet Resources).)

2. The Character of Auriol's Thought and Some Noteworthy Positions

Auriol's thought is relentlessly systematic; one finds certain basic ideas or devices that crop up time and again in extremely varied philosophical and theological contexts. Given this, it seems clear that at an early stage in his career Auriol settled on these basic ideas and devices as those best representing his fundamental convictions, and then applied them rigorously, so that his philosophy and theology emerge from them like spokes from a hub. As a consequence, Auriol's thought has the appearance of being extremely unified. 

Auriol also exhibits throughout his works a pronounced historical bent. That is to say, when dealing with nearly every philosophical or theological issue, he takes as his point of departure a detailed analysis of earlier and contemporary ideas on the matter at hand, offering for the most part accurate summaries of other positions and generally perceptive critiques. On the basis of this analysis of earlier positions, Auriol's own thought often takes shape as he proposes positions that have the goal of avoiding the pitfalls he sees in his predecessors' ideas. A recent study of Auriol's citation practice in his Scriptum (Schabel 2009) has shown that the top five university authors explicitly cited are, in reverse order: Durand of St. Pourcain, Hervaeus Natalis, Henry of Ghent, Thomas Aquinas, and John Duns Scotus. While these were the authors who clearly had the greatest impact on Auriol's thought, he responded throughout his works to many other theologians, including William of Ware, Godfrey of Fontaines, Bonaventure, Richard of Mediavilla (Middleton), Thomas Wylton, and Giles of Rome. Moreover, Auriol is clearly extremely well-versed in ancient and Arabic thought. (See e.g., Duba 2001.)

Finally, Auriol is well known for proposing unusual and sometimes radical solutions to traditional problems. This was one of the reasons why Auriol's thought was so provocative to his contemporaries and to readers right into the seventeenth century. Recent research has pointed to several areas of Auriol's thought as particularly innovative. Among these areas can be mentioned the following.

2.1 The Categories

Auriol maintained that only five of the ten Aristotelian categories actually exist in the extra-mental world (substance, quality, quantity, action, and passion), the other five (relation, place, time, position, and state/habit) being merely conceptual or mind-dependent, i.e. resulting from an intellect conceiving one of the actual categories to be other than it is in extra-mental reality. Thus, the conceptual categories exist only potentially, but not actually, in extra-mental reality; it is possible for the intellect, upon acquaintance with one of the actual categories in extra-mental reality, to form the concept of the corresponding conceptual category. This theory has been studied most thoroughly with regard to Auriol's ideas concerning the category of relation (cf. e.g., Henninger 1989, pp. 150–73; Brower 2008, section 3.1; Friedman 1997a, pp. 310–17). In this context, Auriol maintains that real relations are conceptual in nature, not existing in extra-mental reality, and hence dependent upon the activity of the mind; the three types of real relation originate from the intellect's acquaintance with respectively quantity (e.g., a relation of equality), quality (e.g., a relation of similarity), and action and passion (e.g., a relation of causality). Moreover, Auriol, in stark contrast to the medieval tradition before him, thinks of relations as being between two terms, and not in a subject towards a term. While the impact of Auriol's ideas on the categories has not been studied in any depth, nevertheless it is interesting that Gregory of Rimini devotes a great deal of his discussion of the category of relation to a thorough attack on Auriol's view (Henninger 1989, p. 173; for Auriol's more general views on the ontology of accidents as well as some reaction to those views, see Pasnau 2008).

2.2 The Concept of Being

Auriol modified Scotus' view on the univocity of the concept of being. While accepting Scotus' view that ‘being’ is univocal both between God and creatures and between substance and accidents, Auriol nevertheless heavily criticized Scotus for maintaining that being was contracted to the most general genera through various “qualitative differences” that themselves were not included under the concept of being; on Scotus' view, being itself became like a genus that was contracted through an outside difference. Auriol rejected this view on the grounds that this “outside difference” was an illusion; according to Auriol, nothing escapes the concept of being. Instead Auriol maintains that the concept of being is an indeterminate concept that grasps all beings at once and equally. This concept of being itself has no determinate content; instead it contains within itself implicitly all other concepts that the intellect could possibly form. Being, then, for Auriol is not contracted to its inferiors through any added difference, but merely through explicating what is already contained implicitly and indeterminately in the concept of being (Brown 1964; Brown 1965; Goris 2002; Pickavé 2004). As with many other topics, the history of the reception of Auriol's view on the univocity of the concept of being remains to be written, but the important fifteenth century Thomist, John Capreolus, copied half of his eleven page treatment of this issue verbatim from Auriol's Scriptum only to reject Auriol's view in favor of a more Thomistic one. (See Brown 1964, p. 6, esp. n. 10.)

2.3 Future Contingents and Divine Foreknowledge

Auriol developed influential theories on future contingents and divine foreknowledge. These take their starting point in two convictions that Auriol firmly holds. First, he maintains that immutability and necessity are mutually implicative, and thus, since God is immutable, if he were to know the future, the future would be necessary. (This same conviction led Auriol to reject, at least in some contexts, the use of the popular later-medieval distinction between God's absolute and ordained powers. For Auriol, there is no genuine possibility in God to will other than he does.) Second, Auriol took as a fundamental principle the existence of human free will. These two principles lead Auriol to theorize that God does know the future, but not as future; rather God knows the future indistantly, as abstracted from all time; it is therefore this special way of knowing the future that preserves human freedom and avoids divine necessitarianism. In accordance with this view, Auriol develops a three-valued logic, in which future-tensed propositions are neutral, admitting of neither truth nor falsity, thereby discarding the principle of bivalence (the principle claiming that any proposition can have only one of two truth values). Auriol's position on future contingents and divine foreknowledge had a great deal of impact in the later Middle Ages, since it often inspired refutations that nevertheless took into account the criticisms that Auriol had made of,  e.g., Thomas Aquinas, Henry of Ghent, and John Duns Scotus (Schabel 2000a). When Auriol's view actually found an adherent in Peter de Rivo at the University of Louvain (Leuven) in the period 1465–74, it occasioned a major debate involving in the end Pope Sixtus IV, who in 1474 officially condemned aspects of Auriol's view. Despite this condemnation, however, it appears that Auriol's critique of earlier scholastic views and some elements of his own theory on the topic influenced the humanist Pietro Pomponazzi around 1520, and perhaps as well the reformer Martin Luther (Schabel 2003).

2.4 Predestination and Free Will

In the related area of predestination, human free will is again a motive force behind Auriol's ideas. Believing that earlier explanations of the way God elected some to salvation and damned others to eternal punishment left all too little room for human free will, Auriol proposed a theory on which God offers his grace freely to all human beings. Salvation comes to those who passively accept this free offer of grace. Those whom God knows offer an obstacle to grace, i.e. those who actively reject it, God damns to eternal punishment. Thus, for Auriol, the central issue in predestination is how human beings choose to react to God's free offer of grace: they are judged on their reaction. Auriol believes that he has avoided any hint of Pelagianism -- where human beings can merit salvation on their own account -- because individuals do not do anything actively in order to earn their salvation on his theory; they are only required to passively accept grace by not offering an obstacle to it, and this passive acceptance is, according to Auriol, a negative cause of the person's salvation. Auriol's theory when first proposed was an extremely innovative way of explaining the mechanics of salvation, and it came in for scathing criticism from, among others, Gregory of Rimini; but, whether through direct influence or not, elements of Auriol's theory appear in the works of such thinkers as William Ockham, Robert Holcot, and, on the eve of the Reformation, Gabriel Biel  (Halverson 1998).

In the rest of this entry, we'll look at two areas in which Auriol provoked a significant response in part on account of his radical solutions, two areas that also illustrate the systematic and historical nature of his thought: his ideas on the relation between cognition and reality (including his conceptualism) and his ideas on intuitive and abstractive cognition.

3. Cognition and Reality: Conceptualism and the esse apparens

If there is one thing that is known about Peter Auriol, it is that he was a “conceptualist.” Indeed, Auriol has often been viewed as a forerunner of William Ockham precisely on account of his conceptualism. What is probably the very first monograph ever devoted to Auriol (Dreiling 1913) deals with his conceptualism. Thus, understanding Auriol's conceptualism is a good place to start when dealing with Auriol's thought.

In fact, Auriol is a conceptualist. By this it is merely meant that, for Auriol, only singulars (i.e. individuals) have real, extra-mental existence. As Auriol writes: “every thing, insofar as it exists, exists as a singular” (omnis res, eo quod est, singulariter est). Moreover, Auriol states explicitly that there is no principle of individuation — individuals just are individuals and their individuality needs no further explanation. This is one of the most basic of Auriol's metaphysical principles, and it necessarily entails that universality and universals are mental phenomena, fabricated in some way by the intellect. Thus, for Auriol, the individuality of singular things does not need explaining, but the formation of universal concepts on the basis of these individuals does need explaining. What is important for understanding Auriol's conceptualism, then, is explicating his theory of intellectual cognition: determining the process by which the intellect fabricates these universal concepts, determining what these universal concepts are, and what relation they have to really existing singulars in the world.

While only individuals have real, extra-mental existence, every individual by its very nature has several different ontological or quidditative aspects. Auriol calls these quidditative aspects rationes (a term that will remain untranslated in the rest of this entry). Thus, Auriol claims that, e.g., Socrates has the rationes substance, corporeality, sensitivity, rationality. Moreover, rationes of the same kind found in different individuals are “maximally similar” (simillimae). e.g., the corporeality found in Socrates is totally like the corporeality found in Plato, which is totally like the corporeality found in the donkey Brunellus. It should be noted that these rationes are non-universal characteristics, i.e. proper to one and only one individual. This is why Auriol emphasizes the maximal similarity of rationes of the same kind: they are not the same, just maximally alike. What is most important about these rationes in the present context is that they are the basic unit of intellectual acquaintance: every ratio of its very nature is able to serve as the basis for a concept, although the concept that results from the intellection of a ratio can be modified by the way that we conceive it (our modus concipiendi), a purely psychological difference with no immediate grounds in extra-mental reality. We might say that a ratio directs our intellect to form one certain concept, this core concept undergoing modification according to the way we conceive it. Our universal concepts, then, have in these rationes a direct basis in extra-mental individuals. (See, for more on this, Friedman 1999; for the term ‘maximally similar’ [as it is used in Ockham], see Panaccio 1992, pp. 258–67.) What universal concept we actually form, according to Auriol, depends on how closely our will makes the intellect focus on the information we receive from the object of cognition, and hence how strong an impression the object makes on the intellect: the more closely focused, the stronger the impression, the more specific the universal concept that is formed.

To understand further what universal concepts are, we need to know what Auriol thinks concepts in general are. Central to this is Auriol's theory of apparent existence or esse apparens, that, at all levels, our cognitive faculties, in the very process of cognizing, put the object of cognition into a special type of existence, termed by Auriol “apparent existence” (esse apparens). For Auriol, in line with the general medieval view, our cognitive apparatus is divided into a sensory part (including the five external senses, the common sense, which puts the sense data from the five external senses together, and the imagination, which stores, retrieves, and sometimes manipulates the sense data, as well as sends them on to the intellect) and an intellectual part (including the agent and the possible intellect). According to Auriol, in any cognitive act — whether sensory or intellectual — the cognitive power puts the object of cognition into this special type of existence, and the object of cognition in this special type of existence is the object as perceived. Thus concepts as well as sensations are simply cognized things themselves in a type of existence different from that which they have in extra-mental reality. Auriol employs at least two different approaches to argue for this view: one based on intellectual cognition, the other based on sensory cognition. (Auriol's trinitarian theology provides further arguments for this view; see Friedman 1997a, esp. Ch. 7.) We'll look at each of these in turn, in the process sketching what it was about the theory of esse apparens that made it quite radical and disturbing to Auriol's medieval readers. (For the sake of precision, esse apparens will go untranslated hereafter.)

Intellectual cognition (see Friedman 1999): Auriol's solution to the question of what a concept is takes its point of departure in the necessity of explaining three things at once: essential predication; intellectual acquaintance with extra-mental objects; and necessary, scientific knowledge. Auriol holds that the first of these explanatory requirements would not be fulfilled by any theory of concepts according to which the concept is a type of representation or token of the thing, if this representation has real -- albeit mental -- being. Examples that he gives of solutions of this sort are that a concept might be the intellectual act or an intelligible species or any type of accident terminating an act of the understanding. All of these representations have some real being of their own. According to Auriol, these types of representational theories of concepts would make explaining essential predication impossible, since, assuming any of them, when I predicated, e.g., animal of human being, I would make a false predication, inasmuch as the concept human being would not be the concept animal. The ultimate problem with theories of universals of this sort, according to Auriol, is that if they were correct, then universals would not be universals at all, but would be particulars with their own real being. Moreover, not only these same types of representational views of concepts, but also any theory that holds concepts to be Platonic Ideas, would hinder us in having intellectual acquaintance with extra-mental objects, Auriol's second explanatory requirement. On both these types of theories, our knowledge would extend only to these really existing entities. We would, according to Auriol, be intellectually blind to extra-mental reality. On the other hand, we could certainly have intellectual acquaintance with extra-mental objects, if our concepts were particular things in the extra-mental world as they exist extra-mentally — a final position Auriol criticizes — but we would be unable to have necessary, scientific knowledge, Auriol's third explanatory requirement. In fact, we would be unable to make universal judgments of any kind, since there would be nothing universal about our knowledge; instead of knowing that all mules are sterile, we would know only that this mule is sterile and that that mule is sterile.

Having considered all these views and found them wanting, Auriol offers his own alternative: the only way to explain at once essential predication, intellectual acquaintance with extra-mental objects, and necessary, scientific knowledge is to maintain that concepts are extra-mental particulars, but having a different type of existence (modus essendi) from the real existence they have extra-mentally. This special type of existence Auriol terms esse apparens, apparent being, but he uses many synonyms for it, including “intentional” or “objective” existence. (For other synonyms, see Tachau 1988, p. 90.) What characterizes this type of existence is that it is a particular extra-mental object, e.g., Socrates, but indistinguishably mixed together (indistinguibiliter immiscetur) with passive conception, i.e. the formation of a concept of Socrates. A concept of Socrates is Socrates as conceived.

For Auriol, Socrates and a concept grasping Socrates, then, are the same thing with differing types of existence. That they are “the same thing” Auriol means quite literally. He says that “a thing and its intention do not differ numerically with respect to anything absolute”; they are the same thing strictly speaking. What thing and intention differ by is a respect or a relation. And this is no ordinary respect “fixed to or superimposed upon that thing, as are other relations, rather it is utterly intrinsic and indistinguishably joined to it.” This intrinsic relation, Auriol tells us, is the appearance of the thing as an object of perception (apparere) to a perceiver (hence the term esse apparens). For Auriol, then, it is intrinsic to each and every thing to have two different types of being: real or extra-mental being on the one hand, and intentional or objective being on the other. Unlike real being, the thing's intentional being needs a perceiver in order to actualize it. This is only to say that it is through the act of conceiving that a thing is put into intentional being.

In fact — and here we return to conceptualism — on the basis of what Auriol has said, we can deduce that every particular thing, e.g. Socrates, has several potential intentional existences: one for each of Socrates' rationes, those basic units of intellectual acquaintance that direct the mind to form certain concepts of him. And, according to Auriol, all of these different concepts of Socrates are Socrates. On Auriol's account, this makes good sense: rationes are quidditative or essential aspects without which a particular thing would not be the particular thing that it in fact is. Thus, Socrates is not Socrates without being a rational animal, i.e. without having the rationes sensitivity and rationality. Socrates is every bit as much a human being as he is Socrates, and on Auriol's theory the concept ‘human being’ is every bit as much Socrates as is the concept ‘Socrates’. Thus upon intellectual acquaintance, Socrates (and in particular his ratio of rationality) directs us to form the concept ‘human being’, and that concept is Socrates, one of Socrates' several potential intentional existences.

In this way Auriol attempts to deal with the problems he saw in other theories of concepts. On the one hand, he attempts to get our knowledge grounded as firmly as possible on extra-mental things: a concept simply is the intellected extra-mental particular in a different type of being from that which it has extra-mentally, a type of being that is nevertheless intrinsic to the extra-mental particular; the concept offers no barrier whatsoever between conceiving mind and conceived object. At the same time, however, Auriol wants to preserve the universality of universal concepts and their use in essential predications and necessary, scientific knowledge, and he thinks that his theory of concepts does just that. Because rationes of the same kind found in different individuals are “maximally similar,” they all direct the mind to form the same concept. Thus the concept ‘human being’ arising from Socrates is the same as the concept ‘human being’ arising from Plato, since they are both based on the maximally similar ratio of rationality. Auriol is clear that a universal concept is all of its particulars, rose is all particular roses, animal is all particular animals. That is to say, animal is the concept and every really existing animal at the same time.

Sensory Cognition (Wood 1982, pp. 214–17, 220–23; Tachau 1988, pp. 89–100; Denery 1998, pp. 28–39): The intellect is not the only cognitive faculty that functions by putting the cognized thing into esse apparens: the sensitive faculties also work in this way according to Auriol. In fact, Auriol uses sensory cognition, and his claim that the senses form esse apparens, as further proof that the intellect does so as well. In a famous passage in Auriol's works (Scriptum, d. 3, q. 3, a.1, ed. Buytaert, vol. 2, pp. 696–99), one that was known to and criticized by William Ockham, Auriol creates an account of sensory cognition that takes its point of departure in a group of “experiences” that Auriol thinks prove that the senses cognize by actively placing the object sensed in esse apparens. Thus, if someone were on a ship moving down a river, it would appear to that person that the trees on the shore were moving; when a baton is twirled extremely rapidly, it appears to the viewer that a colored circle hovers in the air; a stick placed halfway into a bucket of water appears to be broken; if I press on my eye while looking at a candle, it will appear that I see two candles; upon looking directly at the sun, an afterimage appears. Auriol gives eight experiences like these, but for him all of them lead to the same conclusion: that in each of these cases, what appears to us (i.e. our erroneous perception) does not correspond directly to reality but is a result of the senses' putting the object into esse apparens. Take the case of the twirling baton: what is the circle that appears in the air? It can't be anything real existing in the baton itself, since the baton is straight. Nor, clearly, is the circle something real hovering in the air. Finally, the circle is not something in vision or in the eye, since we are seeing the circle and not our vision of it, and also since the circle appears to be in the air. For Auriol, the only possible explanation for the circle is that it appears to us because our sense of sight has actively put the baton into esse apparens. More generally, what we see in these cases is “only the appearance of the thing or the thing in esse apparens.” Sensory error, for Auriol, is explained by appealing to the fundamental activity of the senses. And Auriol insists that the senses are just as active in cases where they function correctly; this is because, since activity is a noble trait to have, if in erroneous visions our sense of sight actively places the thing seen in esse apparens, it will certainly do so in veridical visions. The difference between a veridical sensory experience and an erroneous one is that in a veridical one the way the object of cognition appears and the way it is in extra-mental reality coincide. So in veridical sensory experience we have no way to tell that the senses are placing the thing into esse apparens. Thus, these experiences of sensory error are of immense importance, since it is only through them that we can discern the necessary role that esse apparens and the activity of the senses play in all sensory cognition.

For Auriol, then, the senses necessarily put the cognized object into esse apparens or intentional being; this is a condition of our perceiving. Moreover, Auriol makes clear in this context that this esse apparens is not a representation of the thing with its own real being; rather it is the thing itself merely placed in another type of existence. The esse apparens of a sensed object is merely that object as sensed. (See on this particularly Denery 1998, pp. 34–39.) Obviously, this corresponds to the theory we have already seen Auriol holds concerning esse apparens in intellectual cognition, and Auriol makes the correspondence explicit. To go from sensory perception to intellectual perception, Auriol uses a common scholastic principle called by Philotheus Boehner “The Principle of Hierarchy” (Boehner 1949, p. 298): given two faculties, one lower and one higher (like sense and intellect), if the lower faculty can do something noble, then the higher faculty can certainly do the same. The activity of the senses, then, i.e. the fact that the senses put the object into esse apparens, since it is noble, shows that the intellect also puts its object into esse apparens. (Auriol's theory of sensory perception is complicated by the fact that Auriol seems to claim that some of the illusory sensory experiences he mentions exist outside the mind, e.g., that the colored circle is “in” the air and not “in” the mind. For approaches to this complication, see Pasnau 1997, pp. 69–76; Denery 1998, pp. 36–37).

Three general claims can be made on the basis of this examination of Auriol's ideas on cognition and reality. First, Auriol is a conceptualist, holding that universals are nothing more than concepts formed by the mind, although these universal concepts do have a direct basis in the particular thing cognized (the rationes). Second, a principle underlying Auriol's theory of cognition is that cognitive faculties are fundamentally active. All cognition takes place because a cognitive faculty places the object of cognition into esse apparens, which is merely the object of cognition in a different type of being than it has extra-mentally, the being of being perceived. Thus, Auriol is part of one pronounced strain of medieval thought (deriving from Augustine and ultimately from Plato) that rejects that the soul and its powers are passively affected by extra-mental objects. (See on this Tachau 1988, Friedman 2000.) Cognitive powers are, for Auriol, active. A third point, and one that has been noted in a great deal of the secondary literature (e.g., Tachau 1988; Denery 1998; Bolyard 2000; Friedman 2000) is that by appealing to erroneous visions to show that both sense and intellect produce esse apparens or make things appear, Auriol has given error a central place in his account of cognition. To put this in another way, Auriol does not have a real problem explaining how we can have erroneous perception and intellection (in contrast to many theories of knowledge); rather he needs to explain how we can have veridical ones and just as importantly how we can know when we are having veridical ones. This is roughly one of the functions that the distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition served for some medieval authors (in e.g., John Duns Scotus and William Ockham), although as we will see, Auriol does not use it in this way. Indeed it seems best to describe Auriol as a “reliabilist,” holding as a type of axiomatic principle that under normal circumstances our God-given cognitive faculties represent the world in an adequate manner. (See Bolyard 2000, p. 175; that Auriol is not the only medieval thinker with this reliabilist attitude, see e.g., Stump 1998, pp. 306–07.) No matter what Auriol thought, however, the skeptical implications of Auriol's theory of esse apparens did worry many of his medieval readers, and the theory elicited a critical response because some thought that it posed too sharp a break between cognition and reality. (For examples, see Wood 1982, Tachau 1988.)

4. Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition and the Limits of Human Cognitive Abilities

John Duns Scotus, who introduced the distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition, took the view that intuitive and abstractive cognition were distinct because they had different objects. Thus, for Scotus, we have an abstractive cognition of an object when it is not directly present to us, on account of there being some intervening representation; an intuitive cognition can only come about when the object of cognition is existing and directly present to us. For Scotus, then, intuitive cognition carries along with it the guarantee that the object of cognition exists; not so for abstractive cognition. (See Tachau 1988, esp. pp. 68–81; Dumont 1989.) It is well known that William Ockham took exception to this view, holding that we can, in certain extraordinary (i.e. supernatural) cases, have intuitive cognition of non-existent objects. Auriol too objects to Scotus' view.

For Auriol, in contrast to Scotus, intuitive cognition is possible whether the object of cognition is present or absent. Likewise, an abstractive cognition of an object that is actually present is possible. The distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition does not depend on the object at all; the very same object can be cognized in both an intuitive and an abstractive way. According to Auriol, whether we are having the one type of cognition or the other depends exclusively on the characteristics of the cognition that we are having, how the object appears to us. Auriol says explicitly that intuitive and abstractive cognition are in fact simply the two fundamentally different ways that the esse apparens created by the cognitive faculties can appear to us: “abstractive and intuitive cognition differ … for there are two modes of formal appearance … by which things appear objectively” (trans. Pasnau 2002, p. 201, n. 111). In order to illustrate this, Auriol claims that ocular cognition, i.e. the sense of sight, is fully intuitive, while imaginary cognition, i.e. cognizing something through the internal faculty of the imagination, is fully abstractive. This is the governing metaphor in Auriol's attempt to distinguish the two types of cognition: sight is intuitive, imagination is abstractive. Thus, describing sensory cognition, Auriol gives four traits that together enable us to determine whether any particular cognition is intuitive or abstractive. First, an intuitive cognition is characterized by being immediate or direct, as when we see an object before us. Not so abstractive or imaginary cognition; it is mediate, requiring some type of discursive process. Auriol gives the following example: an astronomer sitting in his room can predict an eclipse through calculation, and he can even imagine it on that basis, but this is something entirely different from seeing the eclipse directly. A second characteristic of ocular or intuitive cognition is the presentness of the object. The object of an intuitive cognition seems to be present (whether it actually is or not), whereas the object of an abstractive cognition does not have this appearance of presence. Take the astronomer again. He can imagine the eclipse, but in the very act of doing so he knows that the eclipse is not present before him. The third and fourth characteristics that Auriol mentions are roughly equivalent: an intuitive cognition carries with it the actualization and existence of its object; not so an imaginary, abstractive cognition. The astronomer can imagine an eclipse, and even imagine an eclipse taking place right now, but again, the very fact that he is imagining the eclipse bears with it the recognition that it is not in fact actualized and existing. Auriol sums up:

Therefore, it is rightly said that an intuitive cognition is a direct cognition as opposed to a discursive one, that it is present as opposed to the absent mode in which the imagination reaches even toward things that are present, and that it actualizes the object and posits its existence, since it makes the object's real existence and actual position appear, even if the object does not exist. And in contrast it is clear that an imaginary cognition lacks and abstracts from these four conditions. It extends to its object neither directly nor presently, nor by actualizing or positing existence, even if one imagines the object to exist and be actual and even if it is present. (trans. Pasnau 2002, pp. 206–07, n. 109).

(The most complete discussion of Auriol on intuitive and abstractive cognition is Boehner 1949; for the background and reception of Auriol's view, see particularly Tachau 1988; for a translation into English of Auriol's major text on intuitive and abstractive cognition, his Scriptum, Prologue (aka Prooemium), q. 2, see Pasnau 2002, pp. 178–218.)

Thus, what is central to Auriol's distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition is the character of the cognition as it appears to us. The distinction between them is phenomenologically determined. As mentioned above, in this way Auriol rejected Scotus' view that intuitive cognitions are only of objects present and existing. Auriol's rejection of Scotus' distinction between intuitive and abstractive cognition takes as one of its starting points several “experiences” that recall the experiences he employed to show that the senses put the object of sensitive cognition into esse apparens. For example, upon looking directly at the sun or any other luminous object, an afterimage appears; thus a vision of the sun remains in the eye even when the object itself is absent. In dreams, we can experience sights, sounds, and tactile sensations, in the real absence of the objects of sensation. Persons who are deceived by illusions often see things that are not really there. In all of these sensations the object appears to be actually present and existing, when it is not. Auriol concludes that we can have an intuitive sensory cognition of non-existent objects.

That was the characterization of intuitive sensory cognition as opposed to abstractive cognition. What about intellectual cognition? Auriol makes clear that the human intellect can have intuitive cognition. To show this he first appeals to the Principle of Hierarchy mentioned above: because the lower faculties, the senses, can have intuitive cognition, therefore it is certain that the higher faculty, intellect, can have intuitive cognition, since it is more noble than the abstractive cognition that we know the intellect does have. Moreover, on the basis of a famous passage from St. Paul's I Corinthians (13:12 “For now we see in a mirror dimly, but then face to face”), Auriol maintains that we are assured that the beatific vision of God is an intuitive intellectual cognition.

Although intuitive cognition is possible for an intellect, Auriol, in contrast to William Ockham, nevertheless denies that we experience intuitive cognition in this life. Because the intellect of the wayfarer (viator — the person in this life) is dependent upon the senses and their cognition of particulars, Auriol denies that we can have (or at least that we can know that we have) intellectual cognition with the direct and present, ocular-like cognition that is characteristic of intuitive cognition. Auriol says: “Thus each of these cognitions should be posited within intellect, although we do not experience intuitive cognition in this life because of its conjunction with sensory intuition” (trans. Pasnau 2002, pp. 210–11, n. 121.) Intuitive intellectual cognition is reserved for the angels and for the blessed in heaven, unencumbered by bodily senses. All of our intellectual cognition in this life is characterized by the discursivity and mediacy that is the mark of an abstractive cognition.

Above, it was mentioned that Auriol seems ultimately to be best described as a reliabilist; he does not question that, given normal conditions, our God-given cognitive faculties work as they should and that they are self-correcting. He does not seem to have been concerned about possible skeptical ramifications of his theory of esse apparens. But with this said, by denying that human beings in this life have intuitive intellectual cognition, he set the stage for somewhat strictly limiting human intellectual abilities in his philosophy.

This last point explains some interesting features of Auriol's attitude towards human knowledge. In particular, despite the fact that Auriol maintains that God could give a person in this life an abstractive cognition of the divine essence, and that this abstractive cognition would be able to serve as the basis for demonstrative knowledge of all articles of the Christian faith (Scriptum, Prologue, q. 2, ed. Buytaert, vol. 1, pp. 211–14; trans. Pasnau 2002, p. 213, n. 130 and p. 214, n. 133), nevertheless Auriol often exhibits a noticeable pessimism when it comes to human cognitive abilities. Thus, Auriol argues at length that in this life we are unable to decide such issues as whether the universe is eternal or created in time. (We know, of course, through Scripture that the world is not eternal, but we could never decisively prove this by means of unaided human reason.) Auriol argues that this is the case because we do not have direct intellectual cognition of, e.g., temporal instants; such cognition would allow us to resolve this problem. (See esp. Nielsen 1996, esp. pp. 223–26, 232–35, 239–41; see also Nielsen 1999.) Here we see that Auriol's rejection of intuitive intellectual cognition in this life lies at the heart of a somewhat pessimistic view of the reach of human reason: we do not have direct intuitive knowledge of the world (much less of God), only indirect abstractive knowledge, and this places fairly strict limitations on just what our intellect can achieve unaided. The disembodied soul of the blessed, having direct intuitive intellectual cognition, will fare much better.

Auriol's theory of human intellectual cognition of singulars also shows the influence of his rejection of intuitive intellectual cognition in this life. Auriol is explicit that universal concepts (formed through the Aristotelian process of abstraction) always appear to us as abstractive cognitions, since what is universal abstracts from any presentness and directness of the object of cognition (see e.g. Scriptum, Prologue, q. 2, ed. Buytaert, p. 206, n. 111, l. 87, Pasnau 2002, p. 207; cf. Friedman 1997b, pp. 310–14). There were, however, a number of members of the Franciscan order, including John Duns Scotus, who had claimed that singulars could be cognized as singular by the intellect. (See on this, e.g., Boler 1982.) Auriol rejects this Franciscan tradition; because true intuitive intellectual cognition is barred to us in this lifetime, we can have no direct intellectual cognition of singulars at all. Auriol maintains in his theory of intellectual cognition of singulars that we only form concepts of singulars through the mediation of the senses and by means of a discursive process. (By recognizing that the senses are now sensing a singular, the intellect can reason that a singular must now exist and be present, but we have no direct intellectual knowledge or concept of any singular.) Auriol explicitly claims, however, that angels and the blessed, lacking bodies and bodily senses, would have direct intellectual cognition of singulars, just as God does by seeing his own essence. (On Auriol's theory, see Friedman 2000.) A mild pessimism about human cognitive abilities is thus systemic in Auriol's thought, and has its most clear expression in his claim that we do not experience intuitive intellectual cognition in this life.


Primary Literature

  • Peter Auriol, Commentariorum in primum librum Sententiarum Pars Prima, Rome, 1596.
  • Peter Auriol, Scriptum super primum sententiarum, E.M. Buytaert (ed.), 2 volumes, St. Bonaventure, NY, 1952–56.

Secondary Literature

  • Boehner, P., 1949, ‘Notitia Intuitiva of Non Existents According to Peter Aureoli, O.F.M. (1322)’, Rivista di filosofia neo-scolastica, 41: 289-307; also published in Franciscan Studies, 8 (1948): 388–416.
  • Boler, J., 1982, ‘Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition’, in Norman Kretzmann, et al. (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 460–78.
  • Bolyard, C., 2000, ‘Knowing naturaliter: Auriol's propositional foundations’, Vivarium, 38(1): 162–76.
  • Brower, J. E., 2008, ‘Medieval Theories of Relations’, in The Stanford Encyclopedia Philosophy, Fall 2008 Edition, Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <>
  • Brown, S. F., 1964, ‘The Unity of the Concept of Being in Peter Aureoli's Scriptum and Commentarium’, Ph.D. dissertation, Université Catholique de Louvain.
  • Brown, S. F., 1965, ‘Avicenna and the Unity of the Concept of Being: The Interpretation of Henry of Ghent, Duns Scotus, Gerard of Bologna and Peter Aureoli’, Franciscan Studies, 25: 117–50.
  • Denery, D. G., 1998, ‘The Appearance of Reality: Peter Aureol and the Experience of Perceptual Error’, Franciscan Studies, 55: 27–52.
  • Dreiling, R., 1913, Der Konzeptualismus in der Universalienlehre des Petrus Aureoli, Münster i. W.
  • Duba, W., 2000, ‘The Immaculate Conception in the Works of Peter Auriol’, Vivarium, 38(1): 5–34.
  • Duba, W., 2001, ‘Aristotle's Metaphysics in Peter Auriol's Commentary on the Sentences’, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 12: 549–72.
  • Dumont, S. D., 1989, ‘Theology as a Science and Duns Scotus's Distinction between Intuitive and Abstractive Cognition’, Speculum, 64: 579–99.
  • Friedman, R. L., 1997a, ‘In principio erat Verbum: The Incorporation of Philosophical Psychology into Trinitarian Theology, 1250–1325’, Ph.D. Dissertation, The University of Iowa.
  • Friedman, R. L., 1997b, ‘Conceiving and Modifying Reality: Some Modist Roots of Peter Auriol's Theory of Concept Formation’, in C. Marmo (ed.), Vestigia, Imagines, Verba, Turnhout: Brepols, 305–21.
  • Friedman, R. L., 1999, ‘Peter Auriol on Intentions and Essential Predication’, in S. Ebbesen and R. L. Friedman (eds.), Medieval Analyses in Language and Cognition, Copenhagen, 415–430.
  • Friedman, R. L., 2000, ‘Peter Auriol on Intellectual Cognition of Singulars’, Vivarium, 38(1): 177–193.
  • Goris, W., 2002, ‘Implicit Knowledge – Being as First Known in Peter of Oriel’, Recherches de théologie et philosophie médiévales, 69(1): 33–65.
  • Halverson, J. L., 1998, Peter Aureol on Predestination. A Challenge to Late Medieval Thought, Leiden.
  • Henninger, M., 1989, Relations: Medieval Theories 1250–1325, Oxford.
  • Nielsen, L. O., 1996, ‘Dictates of Faith versus Dictates of Reason: Peter Auriole on Divine Power, Creation, and Human Rationality’, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 7: 213–41.
  • Nielsen, L. O., 1999, ‘The Intelligibility of Faith and the Nature of Theology: Peter Auriole's Theological Programme’, Studia Theologica, 53(1): 26–39.
  • Nielsen, L. O., 2002, ‘Peter Auriol's Way with Words: The Genesis of Peter Auriol's Commentaries on Peter Lombard's First and Fourth Books of the Sentences’, in G. Evans (ed.) Mediaeval Commentaries on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, Leiden, 149–219.
  • Panaccio, C., 1992, Les mots, les concepts, et les choses, Paris-Montreal.
  • Pasnau, R., 1997, Theories of Cognition in the Later Middle Ages, Cambridge.
  • Pasnau, R., 2002, The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, (Volume 3: Mind and Knowledge), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Pasnau, R., 2008, ‘Id Quo Cognoscimus’, in: S. Knuuttila and P. Kärkkäinen (eds.), Theories of Perception in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy, Dordrecht: Springer Science.
  • Pickavé, M., 2004, ‘Metaphysics as First Science: the Case of Peter Auriol’, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 15: 487–516.
  • Schabel, C., 2000a, Theology at Paris, 1316–1345. Peter Auriol and the Problem of Divine Foreknowledge and Future Contingents, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Schabel, C., 2000b, ‘Place, Space, and the Physics of Grace in Auriol's Sentences Commentary’, Vivarium, 38(1): 117–61.
  • Schabel, C., 2003, ‘Divine Foreknowledge and Human Freedom: Auriol, Pomponazzi, and Luther on “Scholastic Subtleties”’, in: R. L. Friedman and L. O. Nielsen (eds.), The Medieval Heritage in Early Modern Metaphysics and Modal Logic, 1400–1800, Dordrecht, 165–89.
  • Schabel, C., 2009, ‘Auriol's Rubrics: Citations of University Theologians in Peter Auriol's Scriptum in Primum Librum Sententiarum’, in S. F. Brown, T. Dewender, and T. Kobusch (eds.), Philosophical Debates at Paris in the Early Fourteenth Century, Leiden, 3–38.
  • Stump, E., 1998, ‘Aquinas's Account of the Mechanisms of Intellective Cognition’, Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 204: 287–307.
  • Tachau, K. H., 1988, Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham: Optics, Epistemology and the Foundation of Semantics, 1250–1345, Leiden.
  • Teetaert, A., 1935, ‘Pierre Auriol ou Oriol’, in Dictionnaire de théologie catholique, XII/2, Paris, cols. 1810–81.
  • Wood, R., 1982, ‘Adam Wodeham on Sensory Illusions’, Traditio, 38: 213–52.

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Related Entries

Duns Scotus, John | Gregory of Rimini | Ockham [Occam], William | relations: medieval theories of

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