George Berkeley

First published Fri Sep 10, 2004; substantive revision Wed Jan 19, 2011

George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne, was one of the great philosophers of the early modern period. He was a brilliant critic of his predecessors, particularly Descartes, Malebranche, and Locke. He was a talented metaphysician famous for defending idealism, that is, the view that reality consists exclusively of minds and their ideas. Berkeley's system, while it strikes many as counter-intuitive, is strong and flexible enough to counter most objections. His most-studied works, the Treatise Concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (Principles, for short) and Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (Dialogues), are beautifully written and dense with the sort of arguments that delight contemporary philosophers. He was also a wide-ranging thinker with interests in religion (which were fundamental to his philosophical motivations), the psychology of vision, mathematics, physics, morals, economics, and medicine. Although many of Berkeley's first readers greeted him with incomprehension, he influenced both Hume and Kant, and is much read (if little followed) in our own day.

1. Life and philosophical works

Berkeley was born in 1685 near Kilkenny, Ireland. After several years of schooling at Kilkenny College, he entered Trinity College, in Dublin, at age 15. He was made a fellow of Trinity College in 1707 (three years after graduating) and was ordained in the Anglican Church shortly thereafter. At Trinity, where the curriculum was notably modern, Berkeley encountered the new science and philosophy of the late seventeenth century, which was characterized by hostility towards Aristotelianism. Berkeley's philosophical notebooks (sometimes styled the Philosophical Commentaries), which he began in 1707, provide rich documentation of Berkeley's early philosophical evolution, enabling the reader to track the emergence of his immaterialist philosophy from a critical response to Descartes, Locke, Malebranche, Newton, Hobbes, and others.

Berkeley's first important published work, An Essay Towards a New Theory of Vision (1709), was an influential contribution to the psychology of vision and also developed doctrines relevant to his idealist project. In his mid-twenties, he published his most enduring works, the Treatise concerning the Principles of Human Knowledge (1710) and the Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713), whose central doctrines we will examine below.

In 1720, while completing a four-year tour of Europe as tutor to a young man, Berkeley composed De Motu, a tract on the philosophical foundations of mechanics which developed his views on philosophy of science and articulated an instrumentalist approach to Newtonian dynamics. After his continental tour, Berkeley returned to Ireland and resumed his position at Trinity until 1724, when he was appointed Dean of Derry. At this time, Berkeley began developing his scheme for founding a college in Bermuda. He was convinced that Europe was in spiritual decay and that the New World offered hope for a new golden age. Having secured a charter and promises of funding from the British Parliament, Berkeley set sail for America in 1728, with his new bride, Anne Forster. They spent three years in Newport, Rhode Island, awaiting the promised money, but Berkeley's political support had collapsed and they were forced to abandon the project and return to Britain in 1731. While in America, Berkeley composed Alciphron, a work of Christian apologetics directed against the “free-thinkers” whom he took to be enemies of established Anglicanism. Alciphron is also a significant philosophical work and a crucial source of Berkeley's views on language.

Shortly after returning to London, Berkeley composed the Theory of Vision, Vindicated and Explained, a defense of his earlier work on vision, and the Analyst, an acute and influential critique of the foundations of Newton's calculus. In 1734 he was made Bishop of Cloyne, and thus he returned to Ireland. It was here that Berkeley wrote his last, strangest, and best-selling (in his own lifetime) philosophical work. Siris (1744) has a three-fold aim: to establish the virtues of tar-water (a liquid prepared by letting pine tar stand in water) as a medical panacea, to provide scientific background supporting the efficacy of tar-water, and to lead the mind of the reader, via gradual steps, toward contemplation of God. Berkeley died in 1753, shortly after moving to Oxford to supervise the education of his son George, one of the three out of seven of his children to survive childhood.

2. Berkeley's critique of materialism in the Principles and Dialogues

In his two great works of metaphysics, Berkeley defends idealism by attacking the materialist alternative. What exactly is the doctrine that he's attacking? Readers should first note that “materialism” is here used to mean “the doctrine that material things exist”. This is in contrast with another use, more standard in contemporary discussions, according to which materialism is the doctrine that only material things exist. Berkeley contends that no material things exist, not just that some immaterial things exist. Thus, he attacks Cartesian and Lockean dualism, not just the considerably less popular (in Berkeley's time) view, held by Hobbes, that only material things exist. But what exactly is a material thing? Interestingly, part of Berkeley's attack on matter is to argue that this question cannot be satisfactorily answered by the materialists, that they cannot characterize their supposed material things. However, an answer that captures what exactly it is that Berkeley rejects is that material things are mind-independent things or substances. And a mind-independent thing is something whose existence is not dependent on thinking/perceiving things, and thus would exist whether or not any thinking things (minds) existed. Berkeley holds that there are no such mind-independent things, that, in the famous phrase, esse est percipi (aut percipere) — to be is to be perceived (or to perceive).

Berkeley charges that materialism promotes skepticism and atheism: skepticism because materialism implies that our senses mislead us as to the natures of these material things, which moreover need not exist at all, and atheism because a material world could be expected to run without the assistance of God. This double charge provides Berkeley's motivation for questioning materialism (one which he thinks should motivate others as well), though not, of course, a philosophical argument against materialism. Fortunately, the Principles and Dialogues overflow with such arguments. Below, we will examine some of the main elements of Berkeley's argumentative campaign against matter.

2.1 The attack on representationalist materialism

2.1.1 The core argument

The starting point of Berkeley's attack on the materialism of his contemporaries is a very short argument presented in Principles 4:

It is indeed an opinion strangely prevailing amongst men, that houses, mountains, rivers, and in a word all sensible objects have an existence natural or real, distinct from their being perceived by the understanding. But with how great an assurance and acquiescence soever this principle may be entertained in the world; yet whoever shall find in his heart to call it in question, may, if I mistake not, perceive it to involve a manifest contradiction. For what are the forementioned objects but the things we perceive by sense, and what do we perceive besides our own ideas or sensations; and is it not plainly repugnant that any one of these or any combination of them should exist unperceived?

Berkeley presents here the following argument (see Winkler 1989, 138):

(1) We perceive ordinary objects (houses, mountains, etc.).

(2) We perceive only ideas.


(3) Ordinary objects are ideas.

The argument is valid, and premise (1) looks hard to deny. What about premise (2)? Berkeley believes that this premise is accepted by all the modern philosophers. In the Principles, Berkeley is operating within the idea-theoretic tradition of the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. In particular, Berkeley believes that some version of this premise is accepted by his main targets, the influential philosophers Descartes and Locke.

However, Berkeley recognizes that these philosophers have an obvious response available to this argument. This response blocks Berkeley's inference to (3) by distinguishing two sorts of perception, mediate and immediate. Thus, premises (1) and (2) are replaced by the claims that (1′) we mediately perceive ordinary objects, while (2′) we immediately perceive only ideas. From these claims, of course, no idealist conclusion follows. The response reflects a representationalist theory of perception, according to which we indirectly (mediately) perceive material things, by directly (immediately) perceiving ideas, which are mind-dependent items. The ideas represent external material objects, and thereby allow us to perceive them.

Whether Descartes, Malebranche, and Locke were representationalists of this kind is a matter of some controversy (see e.g. Yolton 1984, Chappell 1994). However, Berkeley surely had good grounds for understanding his predecessors in this way: it reflects the most obvious interpretation of Locke's account of perception and Descartes' whole procedure in the Meditations tends to suggest this sort of view, given the meditator's situation as someone contemplating her own ideas, trying to determine whether something external corresponds to them.

2.1.2 The likeness principle

Berkeley devotes the succeeding sections of the Principles to undermining the representationalist response to his initial argument. In effect, he poses the question: What allows an idea to represent a material object? He assumes, again with good grounds, that the representationalist answer is going to involve resemblance:

But say you, though the ideas themselves do not exist without the mind, yet there may be things like them whereof they are copies or resemblances, which things exist without the mind, in an unthinking substance. I answer, an idea can be like nothing but an idea; a colour or figure can be like nothing but another colour or figure. (PHK 8)

Berkeley argues that this supposed resemblance is nonsensical; an idea can only be like another idea.

But why? The closest Berkeley ever comes to directly addressing this question is in his early philosophical notebooks, where he observes that “Two things cannot be said to be alike or unlike till they have been compar'd” (PC 377). Thus, because the mind can compare nothing but its own ideas, which by hypothesis are the only things immediately perceivable, the representationalist cannot assert a likeness between an idea and a non-ideal mind-independent material object. (For further discussion, see Winkler 1989, 145–9.)

If Berkeley's Likeness Principle, the thesis that an idea can only be like another idea, is granted, representationalist materialism is in serious trouble. For how are material objects now to be characterized? If material objects are supposed to be extended, solid, or colored, Berkeley will counter that these sensory qualities pertain to ideas, to that which is immediately perceived, and that the materialist cannot assert that material objects are like ideas in these ways. Many passages in the Principles and Dialogues drive home this point, arguing that matter is, if not an incoherent notion, at best a completely empty one.

2.1.3 Anti-abstractionism

One way in which Berkeley's anti-abstractionism comes into play is in reinforcing this point. Berkeley argues in the “Introduction” to the Principles[1] that we cannot form general ideas in the way that Locke often seems to suggest—by stripping particularizing qualities from an idea of a particular, creating a new, intrinsically general, abstract idea.[2] Berkeley then claims that notions the materialist might invoke in a last-ditch attempt to characterize matter, e.g. being or mere extension, are objectionably abstract and unavailable.[3]

2.1.4 What does materialism explain?

Berkeley is aware that the materialist has one important card left to play: Don't we need material objects in order to explain our ideas? And indeed, this seems intuitively gripping: Surely the best explanation of the fact that I have a chair idea every time I enter my office and that my colleague has a chair idea when she enters my office is that a single enduring material object causes all these various ideas. Again, however, Berkeley replies by effectively exploiting the weaknesses of his opponents' theories:

…though we give the materialists their external bodies, they by their own confession are never the nearer knowing how our ideas are produced: since they own themselves unable to comprehend in what manner body can act upon spirit, or how it is possible it should imprint any idea in the mind. Hence it is evident the production of ideas or sensations in our minds, can be no reason why we should suppose matter or corporeal substances, since that is acknowledged to remain equally inexplicable with, or without this supposition. (PHK 19)

Firstly, Berkeley contends, a representationalist must admit that we could have our ideas without there being any external objects causing them (PHK 18). (This is one way in which Berkeley sees materialism as leading to skepticism.) More devastatingly, however, he must admit that the existence of matter does not help to explain the occurrence of our ideas. After all, Locke himself diagnosed the difficulty:

Body as far as we can conceive being able only to strike and affect body; and Motion, according to the utmost reach of our Ideas, being able to produce nothing but Motion, so that when we allow it to produce pleasure or pain, or the Idea of a Colour, or Sound, we are fain to quit our Reason, go beyond our Ideas, and attribute it wholly to the good Pleasure of our Maker. (Locke 1975, 541;Essay 4.3.6)

And, when Descartes was pressed by Elizabeth as to how mind and body interact,[4] she rightly regarded his answers as unsatisfactory. The basic problem here is set by dualism: how can one substance causally affect another substance of a fundamentally different kind? In its Cartesian form, the difficulty is particularly severe: how can an extended thing, which affects other extended things only by mechanical impact, affect a mind, which is non-extended and non-spatial?

Berkeley's point is thus well taken. It is worth noting that, in addition to undermining the materialist's attempted inference to the best explanation, Berkeley's point also challenges any attempt to explain representation and mediate perception in terms of causation. That is, the materialist might try to claim that ideas represent material objects, not by resemblance, but in virtue of being caused by the objects. (Though neither Descartes nor Locke spells out such an account, there are grounds in each for attributing such an account to them. For Descartes see Wilson 1999, 73–76; for Locke see Chappell 1994, 53.) However, PHK 19 implies that the materialists are not in a position to render this account of representation philosophically satisfactory.

2.2 Contra direct realist materialism

As emphasized above, Berkeley's campaign against matter, as he presents it in the Principles, is directed against materialist representationalism and presupposes representationalism. In particular, Berkeley presupposes that all anyone ever directly or immediately perceives are ideas. As contemporary philosophers, we might wonder whether Berkeley has anything to say to a materialist who denies this representationalist premise and asserts instead that we ordinarily directly/immediately perceive material objects themselves. The answer is ‘yes’.

2.2.1 The master argument?

However, one place where one might naturally look for such an argument is not, in fact, as promising as might initially appear. In both the Principles (22–3) and the Dialogues (200), Berkeley gives a version of what has come to be called “The Master Argument”[5] because of the apparent strength with which he endorses it:

… I am content to put the whole upon this issue; if you can but conceive it possible for one extended moveable substance, or in general, for any one idea or any thing like an idea, to exist otherwise than in a mind perceiving it, I shall readily give up the cause…. But say you, surely there is nothing easier than to imagine trees, for instance, in a park, or books existing in a closet, and no body by to perceive them. I answer, you may so, there is no difficulty in it: but what is all this, I beseech you, more than framing in your mind certain ideas which you call books and trees, and at the same time omitting to frame the idea of any one that may perceive them? But do not you your self perceive or think of them all the while? This therefore is nothing to the purpose: it only shows you have the power of imagining or forming ideas in your mind; but it doth not shew that you can conceive it possible, the objects of your thought may exist without the mind: to make out this, it is necessary that you conceive them existing unconceived or unthought of, which is a manifest repugnancy. When we do our utmost to conceive the existence of external bodies, we are all the while only contemplating our own ideas. But the mind taking no notice of itself, is deluded to think it can and doth conceive bodies existing unthought of or without the mind; though at the same time they are apprehended by or exist in it self. (PHK 22–23)

The argument seems intended to establish that we cannot actually conceive of mind-independent objects, that is, objects existing unperceived and unthought of. Why not? Simply because in order to conceive of any such things, we must ourselves be conceiving, i.e., thinking, of them. However, as Pitcher (1977, 113) nicely observes, such an argument seems to conflate the representation (what we conceive with) and the represented (what we conceive of—the content of our thought). Once we make this distinction, we realize that although we must have some conception or representation in order to conceive of something, and that representation is in some sense thought of, it does not follow (contra Berkeley) that what we conceive of must be a thought-of object. That is, when we imagine a tree standing alone in a forest, we (arguably) conceive of an unthought-of object, though of course we must employ a thought in order to accomplish this feat.[6] Thus (as many commentators have observed), this argument fails.

A more charitable reading of the argument (see Winkler 1989, 184–7; Lennon 1988) makes Berkeley's point that we cannot represent unconceivedness, because we have never and could never experience it.[7] Because we cannot represent unconceivedness, we cannot conceive of mind-independent objects. While this is a rather more promising argument, it clearly presupposes representationalism, just as Berkeley's earlier Principles arguments did.[8] (This, however, is not necessarily a defect of the interpretation, since the Principles, as we saw above, is aimed against representationalism, and in the Dialogues the Master Argument crops up only after Hylas has been converted to representationalism (see below).)[9]

2.2.2 The First Dialogue and relativity arguments

Thus, if we seek a challenge to direct realist materialism, we must turn to the Three Dialogues, where the character Hylas (the would-be materialist) begins from a sort of naïve realism, according to which we perceive material objects themselves, directly. Against this position, Philonous (lover of spirit—Berkeley's spokesperson) attempts to argue that the sensible qualities—the qualities immediately perceived by sense—must be ideal, rather than belonging to material objects. (The following analysis of these first dialogue arguments is indebted to Margaret Wilson's account in “Berkeley on the Mind-Dependence of Colors,” Wilson 1999, 229–242.[10])

Philonous begins his first argument by contending that sensible qualities such as heat are not distinct from pleasure or pain. Pleasure and pain, Philonous argues, are allowed by all to be merely in the mind; therefore the same must be true for the sensible qualities. The most serious difficulties with this argument are (1) whether we should grant the “no distinction” premise in the case of the particular sensory qualities invoked by Berkeley (why not suppose that I can distinguish between the heat and the pain?) and (2) if we do, whether we should generalize to all sensory qualities as Berkeley would have us do.

Secondly, Philonous invokes relativity arguments to suggest that because sensory qualities are relative to the perceiver, e.g. what is hot to one hand may be cold to the other and what is sweet to one person may be bitter to another, they cannot belong to mind-independent material objects, for such objects could not bear contradictory qualities.

As Berkeley is well aware, one may reply to this sort of argument by claiming that only one of the incompatible qualities is truly a quality of the object and that the other apparent qualities result from misperception. But how then, Berkeley asks, are these “true” qualities to be identified and distinguished from the “false” ones (3D 184)? By noting the differences between animal perception and human perception, Berkeley suggests that it would be arbitrary anthropocentrism to claim that humans have special access to the true qualities of objects. Further, Berkeley uses the example of microscopes to undermine the prima facie plausible thought that the true visual qualities of objects are revealed by close examination. Thus, Berkeley provides a strong challenge to any direct realist attempt to specify standard conditions under which the true (mind-independent) qualities of objects are (directly) perceived by sense.

Under this pressure from Philonous, Hylas retreats (perhaps a bit quickly) from naïve realism to a more “philosophical” position. He first tries to make use of the primary/secondary quality distinction associated with mechanism and, again, locatable in the thought of Descartes and Locke. Thus, Hylas allows that color, taste, etc. may be mind-dependent (secondary) qualities, but contends that figure, solidity, motion and rest (the primary qualities) exist in mind-independent material bodies. The mechanist picture behind this proposal is that bodies are composed of particles with size, shape, motion/rest, and perhaps solidity, and that our sensory ideas arise from the action of such particles on our sense organs and, ultimately, on our minds. Berkeley opposes this sort of mechanism throughout his writings, believing that it engenders skepticism by dictating that bodies are utterly unlike our sensory experience of them. Here Philonous has a two-pronged reply: (1) The same sorts of relativity arguments that were made against secondary qualities can be made against primary ones. (2) We cannot abstract the primary qualities (e.g. shape) from secondary ones (e.g. color), and thus we cannot conceive of mechanist material bodies which are extended but not (in themselves) colored.[11]

When, after some further struggles, Hylas finally capitulates to Philonous' view that all of existence is mind-dependent, he does so unhappily and with great reluctance. Philonous needs to convince him (as Berkeley needed to convince his readers in both books) that a commonsensical philosophy could be built on an immaterialist foundation, that no one but a skeptic or atheist would ever miss matter. As a matter of historical fact, Berkeley persuaded few of his contemporaries, who for the most part regarded him as a purveyor of skeptical paradoxes (Bracken 1965). Nevertheless, we can and should appreciate the way in which Berkeley articulated a positive idealist philosophical system, which, if not in perfect accord with common sense, is in many respects superior to its competitors.

3. Berkeley's positive program: idealism and common sense

3.1 The basics of Berkeley's ontology

3.1.1 The status of ordinary objects

The basics of Berkeley's metaphysics are apparent from the first section of the main body of the Principles:

It is evident to any one who takes a survey of the objects of human knowledge, that they are either ideas actually imprinted on the senses, or else such as are perceived by attending to the passions and operations of the mind, or lastly ideas formed by help of memory and imagination, either compounding, dividing, or barely representing those originally perceived in the aforesaid ways. By sight I have the ideas of light and colours with their several degrees and variations. By touch I perceive, for example, hard and soft, heat and cold, motion and resistance, and of all these more and less either as to quantity or degree. Smelling furnishes me with odours; the palate with tastes, and hearing conveys sounds to the mind in all their variety of tone and composition. And as several of these are observed to accompany each other, they come to be marked by one name, and so to be reputed as one thing. Thus, for example, a certain colour, taste, smell, figure and consistence having been observed to go together, are accounted one distinct thing, signified by the name apple. Other collections of ideas constitute a stone, a tree, a book, and the like sensible things; which, as they are pleasing or disagreeable, excite the passions of love, hatred, joy, grief, and so forth.

As this passage illustrates, Berkeley does not deny the existence of ordinary objects such as stones, trees, books, and apples. On the contrary, as was indicated above, he holds that only an immaterialist account of such objects can avoid skepticism about their existence and nature. What such objects turn out to be, on his account, are bundles or collections of ideas. An apple is a combination of visual ideas (including the sensible qualities of color and visual shape), tangible ideas, ideas of taste, smell, etc.[12] The question of what does the combining is a philosophically interesting one which Berkeley does not address in detail. He does make clear that there are two sides to the process of bundling ideas into objects: (1) co-occurrence, an objective fact about what sorts of ideas tend to accompany each other in our experience, and (2) something we do when we decide to single out a set of co-occurring ideas and refer to it with a certain name (NTV 109).

Thus, although there is no material world for Berkeley, there is a physical world, a world of ordinary objects. This world is mind-dependent, for it is composed of ideas, whose existence consists in being perceived. For ideas, and so for the physical world, esse est percipi.

3.1.2 Spirits as active substances

Berkeley's ontology is not exhausted by the ideal, however. In addition to perceived things (ideas), he posits perceivers, i.e., minds or spirits, as he often terms them. Spirits, he emphasizes, are totally different in kind from ideas, for they are active where ideas are passive. This suggests that Berkeley has replaced one kind of dualism, of mind and matter, with another kind of dualism, of mind and idea. There is something to this point, given Berkeley's refusal to elaborate upon the relation between active minds and passive ideas. At Principles 49, he famously dismisses quibbling about how ideas inhere in the mind (are minds colored and extended when such sensible qualities “exist in” them?) with the declaration that “those qualities are in the mind only as they are perceived by it, that is, not by way of mode or attribute, but only by way of idea”. Berkeley's dualism, however, is a dualism within the realm of the mind-dependent.

3.1.3 God's existence

The last major item in Berkeley's ontology is God, himself a spirit, but an infinite one. Berkeley believes that once he has established idealism, he has a novel and convincing argument for God's existence as the cause of our sensory ideas. He argues by elimination: What could cause my sensory ideas? Candidate causes, supposing that Berkeley has already established that matter doesn't exist, are (1) other ideas, (2) myself, or (3) some other spirit. Berkeley eliminates the first option with the following argument (PHK 25):

(1) Ideas are manifestly passive—no power or activity is perceived in them.

(2) But because of the mind-dependent status of ideas, they cannot have any characteristics which they are not perceived to have.


(3) Ideas are passive, that is, they possess no causal power.

It should be noted that premise (2) is rather strong; Phillip Cummins (1990) identifies it as Berkeley's “manifest qualities thesis” and argues that it commits Berkeley to the view that ideas are radically and completely dependent on perceivers in the way that sensations of pleasure and pain are typically taken to be.[13]

The second option is eliminated with the observation that although I clearly can cause some ideas at will (e.g. ideas of imagination), sensory ideas are involuntary; they present themselves whether I wish to perceive them or not and I cannot control their content. The hidden assumption here is that any causing the mind does must be done by willing and such willing must be accessible to consciousness. Berkeley is hardly alone in presupposing this model of the mental; Descartes, for example, makes a similar set of assumptions.

This leaves us, then, with the third option: my sensory ideas must be caused by some other spirit. Berkeley thinks that when we consider the stunning complexity and systematicity of our sensory ideas, we must conclude that the spirit in question is wise and benevolent beyond measure, that, in short, he is God.

3.2 Replies to objections

With the basic ingredients of Berkeley's ontology in place, we can begin to consider how his system works by seeing how he responds to a number of intuitively compelling objections to it. Berkeley himself sees very well how necessary this is: Much of the Principles is structured as a series of objections and replies, and in the Three Dialogues, once Philonous has rendered Hylas a reluctant convert to idealism, he devotes the rest of the book to convincing him that this is a philosophy which coheres well with common sense, at least better than materialism ever did.

3.2.1 Real things vs. imaginary ones

Perhaps the most obvious objection to idealism is that it makes real things no different from imaginary ones—both seem fleeting figments of our own minds, rather than the solid objects of the materialists. Berkeley replies that the distinction between real things and chimeras retains its full force on his view. One way of making the distinction is suggested by his argument for the existence of God, examined above: Ideas which depend on our own finite human wills are not (constituents of) real things. Not being voluntary is thus a necessary condition for being a real thing, but it is clearly not sufficient, since hallucinations and dreams do not depend on our wills, but are nevertheless not real. Berkeley notes that the ideas that constitute real things exhibit a steadiness, vivacity, and distinctness that chimerical ideas do not. The most crucial feature that he points to, however, is order. The ideas imprinted by the author of nature as part of rerum natura occur in regular patterns, according to the laws of nature (“the set rules or established methods, wherein the mind we depend on excites in us the ideas of sense, are called the Laws of Nature” PHK 30). They are thus regular and coherent, that is, they constitute a coherent real world.

3.2.2 Hidden structures and internal mechanisms

The related notions of regularity and of the laws of nature are central to the workability of Berkeley's idealism. They allow him to respond to the following objection, put forward in PHK 60:

…it will be demanded to what purpose serves that curious organization of plants, and the admirable mechanism in the parts of animals; might not vegetables grow, and shoot forth leaves and blossoms, and animals perform all their motions, as well without as with all that variety of internal parts so elegantly contrived and put together, which being ideas have nothing powerful or operative in them, nor have any necessary connexion with the effects ascribed to them? […] And how comes it to pass, that whenever there is any fault in the going of a watch, there is some corresponding disorder to be found in the movements, which being mended by a skilful hand, all is right again? The like may be said of all the clockwork of Nature, great part whereof is so wonderfully fine and subtle, as scarce to be discerned by the best microscope. In short, it will be asked, how upon our principles any tolerable account can be given, or any final cause assigned of an innumerable multitude of bodies and machines framed with the most exquisite art, which in the common philosophy have very apposite uses assigned them, and serve to explain abundance of phenomena.

Berkeley's answer, for which he is indebted to Malebranche,[14] is that, although God could make a watch run (that is, produce in us ideas of a watch running) without the watch having any internal mechanism (that is, without it being the case that, were we to open the watch, we would have ideas of an internal mechanism), he cannot do so if he is to act in accordance with the laws of nature, which he has established for our benefit, to make the world regular and predictable. Thus, whenever we have ideas of a working watch, we will find that if we open it,[15] we will see (have ideas of) an appropriate internal mechanism. Likewise, when we have ideas of a living tulip, we will find that if we pull it apart, we will observe the usual internal structure of such plants, with the same transport tissues, reproductive parts, etc.

3.2.3 Scientific explanation

Implicit in the answer above is Berkeley's insightful account of scientific explanation and the aims of science. A bit of background is needed here to see why this issue posed a special challenge for Berkeley. One traditional understanding of science, derived from Aristotle, held that it aims at identifying the causes of things. Modern natural philosophers such as Descartes narrowed science's domain to efficient causes and thus held that science should reveal the efficient causes of natural things, processes, and events.[16] Berkeley considers this as the source of an objection at Principles 51:

Seventhly, it will upon this be demanded whether it does not seem absurd to take away natural causes, and ascribe every thing to the immediate operation of spirits? We must no longer say upon these principles that fire heats, or water cools, but that a spirit heats, and so forth. Would not a man be deservedly laughed at, who should talk after this manner? I answer, he would so; in such things we ought to think with the learned, and speak with the vulgar.

On Berkeley's account, the true cause of any phenomenon is a spirit, and most often it is the same spirit, namely, God.

But surely, one might object, it is a step backwards to abandon our scientific theories and simply note that God causes what happens in the physical world! Berkeley's first response here, that we should think with the learned but speak with the vulgar, advises us to continue to say that fire heats, that the heart pumps blood, etc. What makes this advice legitimate is that he can reconstrue such talk as being about regularities in our ideas. In Berkeley's view, the point of scientific inquiry is to reveal such regularities:

If therefore we consider the difference there is betwixt natural philosophers and other men, with regard to their knowledge of the phenomena, we shall find it consists, not in an exacter knowledge of the efficient cause that produces them, for that can be no other than the will of a spirit, but only in a greater largeness of comprehension, whereby analogies, harmonies, and agreements are discovered in the works of Nature, and the particular effects explained, that is, reduced to general rules, see Sect. 62, which rules grounded on the analogy, and uniformness observed in the production of natural effects, are most agreeable, and sought after by the mind; for that they extend our prospect beyond what is present, and near to us, and enable us to make very probable conjectures, touching things that may have happened at very great distances of time and place, as well as to predict things to come…. (PHK 105)

Natural philosophers thus consider signs, rather than causes (PHK 108), but their results are just as useful as they would be under a materialist system. Moreover, the regularities they discover provide the sort of explanation proper to science, by rendering the particular events they subsume unsurprising (PHK 104). The sort of explanation proper to science, then, is not causal explanation, but reduction to regularity.[17]

3.2.4 Unperceived objects—Principles vs. Dialogues

Regularity provides a foundation for one of Berkeley's responses to the objection summarized in the famous limerick:

There was a young man who said God,
must find it exceedingly odd
when he finds that the tree
continues to be
when noone's about in the Quad.[18]

The worry, of course, is that if to be is to be perceived (for non-spirits), then there are no trees in the Quad at 3 a.m. when no one is there to perceive them and there is no furniture in my office when I leave and close the door. Interestingly, in the Principles Berkeley seems relatively unperturbed by this natural objection to idealism. He claims that there is no problem for

…anyone that shall attend to what is meant by the term exist when applied to sensible things. The table I write on, I say, exists, that is, I see and feel it; and if I were out of my study I should say it existed, meaning thereby that if I was in my study I might perceive it, or that some other spirit actually does perceive it. (PHK 3)

So, when I say that my desk still exists after I leave my office, perhaps I just mean that I would perceive it if I were in my office, or, more broadly, that a finite mind would perceive the desk were it in the appropriate circumstances (in my office, with the lights on, with eyes open, etc.). This is to provide a sort of counterfactual analysis of the continued existence of unperceived objects. The truth of the counterfactuals in question is anchored in regularity: because God follows set patterns in the way he causes ideas, I would have a desk idea if I were in the office.

Unfortunately, this analysis has counterintuitive consequences when coupled with the esse est percipi doctrine (McCracken 1979, 286). If to be is, as Berkeley insists, to be perceived, then the unperceived desk does not exist, despite the fact that it would be perceived and thus would exist if someone opened the office door. Consequently, on this view the desk would not endure uninterrupted but would pop in and out of existence, though it would do so quite predictably. One way to respond to this worry would be to dismiss it—what does it matter if the desk ceases to exist when unperceived, as long as it exists whenever we need it? Berkeley shows signs of this sort of attitude in Principles 45–46, where he tries to argue that his materialist opponents and scholastic predecessors are in much the same boat.[19] This “who cares?” response to the problem of continued existence is fair enough as far as it goes, but it surely does conflict with common sense, so if Berkeley were to take this route he would have to moderate his claims about his system's ability to accommodate everything desired by the person on the street.

Another strategy, however, is suggested by Berkeley's reference in PHK 3 and 48 to “some other spirit,” a strategy summarized in a further limerick:

Dear Sir, your astonishment's odd
I'm always about in the Quad
And that's why the tree
continues to be
Since observed by, yours faithfully, God

If the other spirit in question is God, an omnipresent being, then perhaps his perception can be used to guarantee a completely continuous existence to every physical object. In the Three Dialogues, Berkeley very clearly invokes God in this context. Interestingly, whereas in the Principles, as we have seen above, he argued that God must exist in order to cause our ideas of sense, in the Dialogues (212, 214–5) he argues that our ideas must exist in God when not perceived by us.[20] If our ideas exist in God, then they presumably exist continuously. Indeed, they must exist continuously, since standard Christian doctrine dictates that God is unchanging.

Although this solves one problem for Berkeley, it creates several more. The first is that Berkeley's other commitments, religious and philosophical, dictate that God cannot literally have our ideas. Our ideas are sensory ideas and God is a being who “can suffer nothing, nor be affected with any painful sensation, or indeed any sensation at all” (3D 206). Nor can our sensory ideas be copies of God's nonsensory ones (McCracken 1979):

How can that which is sensible be like that which is insensible? Can a real thing in itself invisible be like a colour; or a real thing which is not audible, be like a sound? (3D 206)

A second problem is that God's ideas are eternal, whereas physical objects typically have finite duration. And, even worse, God has ideas of all possible objects (Pitcher 1977, 171–2), not just the ones which we would commonsensically wish to say exist.

A solution (proposed by McCracken) to these related problems is to tie the continued existence of ordinary objects to God's will, rather than to his understanding. McCracken's suggestion is that unperceived objects continue to exist as God's decrees. Such an account in terms of divine decrees or volitions looks promising: The tree continues to exist when unperceived just in case God has an appropriate volition or intention to cause a tree-idea in finite perceivers under the right circumstances. Furthermore, this solution has important textual support: In the Three Dialogues, Hylas challenges Philonous to account for the creation, given that all existence is mind-dependent, in his view, but everything must exist eternally in the mind of God. Philonous responds as follows:

May we not understand it [the creation] to have been entirely in respect of finite spirits; so that things, with regard to us, may properly be said to begin their existence, or be created, when God decreed they should become perceptible to intelligent creatures, in that order and manner which he then established, and we now call the laws of Nature? You may call this a relative, or hypothetical existence if you please. (3D 253)

Here Berkeley ties the actual existence of created physical beings to God's decrees, that is, to his will.

As with the counterfactual analysis of continued existence, however, this account also fails under pressure from the esse est percipi principle:

Hylas. Yes, Philonous, I grant the existence of a sensible thing consists in being perceivable, but not in being actually perceived.

Philonous. And what is perceivable but an idea? And can an idea exist without being actually perceived? These are points long since agreed between us. (3D 234)

Thus, if the only grounds of continued existence are volitions in God's mind, rather than perceived items (ideas), then ordinary objects do not exist continuously, but rather pop in and out of existence in a lawful fashion.

Fortunately, Kenneth Winkler has put forward an interpretation which goes a great distance towards resolving this difficulty. In effect, he proposes that we amend the “volitional” interpretation of the existence of objects with the hypothesis that Berkeley held “the denial of blind agency” (Winkler 1989, 207–224). This principle, which can be found in many authors of the period (including Locke), dictates that any volition must have an idea behind it, that is, must have a cognitive component that gives content to the volition, which would otherwise be empty or “blind”. While the principle is never explicitly invoked or argued for by Berkeley, in a number of passages he does note the interdependence of will and understanding. Winkler plausibly suggests that Berkeley may have found this principle so obvious as to need no arguing. With it in place, we have a guarantee that anything willed by God, e.g. that finite perceivers in appropriate circumstances should have elm tree ideas, also has a divine idea associated with it. Furthermore, we have a neat explanation of Berkeley's above-noted leap in the Dialogues from the claim that God must cause our ideas to the claim that our ideas must exist in God.

Of course, it remains true that God cannot have ideas that are, strictly speaking, the same as ours. This problem is closely related to another that confronts Berkeley: Can two people ever perceive the same thing? Common sense demands that two students can perceive the same tree, but Berkeley's metaphysics seems to dictate that they never truly perceive the same thing, since they each have their own numerically distinct ideas. One way to dissolve this difficulty is to recall that objects are bundles of ideas. Although two people cannot perceive/have the numerically same idea, they can perceive the same object, assuming that perceiving a component of the bundle suffices for perception of the bundle.[21] Another proposal (Baxter 1991) is to invoke Berkeley's doctrine that “same” has both a philosophical and a vulgar sense (3D 247) in order to declare that my tree-idea and your tree-idea are strictly distinct but loosely (vulgarly) the same. Either account might be applied in order to show either that God and I may perceive the same object, or that God and I may perceive, loosely speaking, the same thing.

From this discussion we may draw a criterion for the actual existence of ordinary objects, one which summarizes Berkeley's considered views:

An X exists at time t if and only if God has an idea that corresponds to a volition that if a finite mind at t is in appropriate circumstances (e.g. in a particular place, looking in the right direction, or looking through a microscope), then it will have an idea that we would be disposed to call a perception of an X.

This captures the idea that existence depends on God's perceptions, but only on the perceptions which correspond to or are included in his volitions about what we should perceive. It also captures the fact that the bundling of ideas into objects is done by us.[22]

3.2.5 The possibility of error

A further worry about Berkeley's system arises from the idea-bundle account of objects.[23] If there is no mind-independent object against which to measure my ideas, but rather my ideas help to constitute the object, then how can my ideas ever fail—how is error possible? Here is another way to raise the worry that I have in mind: We saw above that Berkeley's arguments against commonsense realism in the first Dialogue attempt to undermine (1) claims that heat, odor, taste are distinguishable from pleasure/pain and (2) the claim that objects have one true color, one true shape, one true taste, etc. If we then consider what this implies about Berkeleyian objects, we must conclude that Berkeley's cherry is red, purple, gray, tart, sweet, small, large, pleasant, and painful! It seems that Berkeley's desire to refute the mechanist representationalism which dictates that objects are utterly unlike our experience of them has lead him to push beyond common sense to the view that objects are exactly like our experience of them.[24] There is no denying that Berkeley is out of sync with common sense here. He does, however, have an account of error, as he shows us in the Dialogues:

Hylas. What say you to this? Since, according to you, men judge of the reality of things by their senses, how can a man be mistaken in thinking the moon a plain lucid surface, about a foot in diameter; or a square tower, seen at a distance, round; or an oar, with one end in the water, crooked?

Philonous. He is not mistaken with regard to the ideas he actually perceives; but in the inferences he makes from his present perceptions. Thus in the case of the oar, what he immediately perceives by sight is certainly crooked; and so far he is in the right. But if he thence conclude, that upon taking the oar out of the water he shall perceive the same crookedness; or that it would affect his touch, as crooked things are wont to do: in that he is mistaken. (3D 238)

Extrapolating from this, we may say that my gray idea of the cherry, formed in dim light, is not in itself wrong and forms a part of the bundle-object just as much as your red idea, formed in daylight. However, if I judge that the cherry would look gray in bright light, I'm in error. Furthermore, following Berkeley's directive to speak with the vulgar, I ought not to say (in ordinary circumstances) that “the cherry is gray,” since that will be taken to imply that the cherry would look gray to humans in daylight.

3.2.6 Spirits and causation

We have spent some time examining the difficulties Berkeley faces in the “idea/ordinary object” half of his ontology. Arguably, however, less tractable difficulties confront him in the realm of spirits. Early on, Berkeley attempts to forestall materialist skeptics who object that we have no idea of spirit by arguing for this position himself:

A spirit is one simple, undivided, active being: as it perceives ideas, it is called the understanding, and as it produces or otherwise operates about them, it is called the will. Hence there can be no idea formed of a soul or spirit: for all ideas whatever, being passive and inert, vide Sect. 25, they cannot represent unto us, by way of image or likeness, that which acts. A little attention will make it plain to any one, that to have an idea which shall be like that active principle of motion and change of ideas, is absolutely impossible. Such is the nature of spirit or that which acts, that it cannot be of it self perceived, but only by the effects which it produceth. (PHK 27)

Surely the materialist will be tempted to complain, however, that Berkeley's unperceivable spiritual substances, lurking behind the scenes and supporting that which we can perceive, sound a lot like the material substances which he so emphatically rejects.

Two very different responses are available to Berkeley on this issue, each of which he seems to have made at a different point in his philosophical development. One response would be to reject spiritual substance just as he rejected material substance. Spirits, then, might be understood in a Humean way, as bundles of ideas and volitions. Fascinatingly, something like this view is considered by Berkeley in his early philosophical notebooks (see PC 577ff). Why he abandons it is an interesting and difficult question;[25] it seems that one worry he has is how the understanding and the will are to be integrated and rendered one thing.

The second response would be to explain why spiritual substances are better posits than material ones. To this end, Berkeley emphasizes that we have a notion of spirit, which is just to say that we know what the word means. This purportedly contrasts with “matter,” which Berkeley thinks has no determinate content. Of course, the real question is: How does the term “spirit” come by any content, given that we have no idea of it? In the Principles, Berkeley declares only that we know spirit through our own case and that the content we assign to “spirit” is derived from the content each of us assigns to “I” (PHK 139–140). In the Dialogues, however, Berkeley shows a better appreciation of the force of the problem that confronts him:

[Hylas.] You say your own soul supplies you with some sort of an idea or image of God. But at the same time you acknowledge you have, properly speaking, no idea of your own soul. You even affirm that spirits are a sort of beings altogether different from ideas. Consequently that no idea can be like a spirit. We have therefore no idea of any spirit. You admit nevertheless that there is spiritual substance, although you have no idea of it; while you deny there can be such a thing as material substance, because you have no notion or idea of it. Is this fair dealing? To act consistently, you must either admit matter or reject spirit. (3D 232)

To the main point of Hylas' attack, Philonous replies that each of us has, in our own case, an immediate intuition of ourselves, that is, we know our own minds through reflection (3D 231–233). Berkeley's considered position, that we gain access to ourselves as thinking things through conscious awareness, is surely an intuitive one. Nevertheless, it is disappointing that he never gave an explicit response to the Humean challenge he entertained in his notebooks:

+   Mind is a congeries of Perceptions. Take away Perceptions & you take away the Mind put the Perceptions & you put the mind. (PC 580)

A closely related problem which confronts Berkeley is how to make sense of the causal powers that he ascribes to spirits. Here again, the notebooks suggest a surprisingly Humean view:

+   The simple idea call'd Power seems obscure or rather none at all. but onely the relation ‘twixt cause & Effect. Wn I ask whether A can move B. if A be an intelligent thing. I mean no more than whether the volition of A that B move be attended with the motion of B, if A be be senseless whether the impulse of A against B be follow'd by ye motion of B.       461[26]

S   What means Cause as distinguish'd from Occasion? nothing but a Being wch wills wn the Effect follows the volition. Those things that happen from without we are not the Cause of therefore there is some other Cause of them i.e., there is a being that wills these perceptions in us.       499

S   There is a difference betwixt Power & Volition. There may be volition without Power. But there can be no Power without Volition. Power implyeth volition & at the same time a Connotation of the Effects following the Volition.       699

461 suggests the Humean view that a cause is whatever is (regularly)[27] followed by an effect. 499 and 699 revise this doctrine by requiring that a cause not only (regularly) precede an effect but also be a volition. Berkeley's talk of occasion here reveals the immediate influence of Malebranche. Malebranche held that the only true cause is God and that apparent finite causes are only “occasional causes,” which is to say that they provide occasions for God to act on his general volitional policies. Occasional “causes” thus regularly precede their “effects” but are not truly responsible for producing them. In these notebook entries, however, Berkeley seems to be suggesting that all there is to causality is this regular consequence, with the first item being a volition. Such an account, unlike Malebranche's, would make my will and God's will causes in exactly the same thin sense.

Some commentators, most notably Winkler, suppose that Berkeley retains this view of causality in the published works. The main difficulty with this interpretation is that Berkeley more than once purports to inspect our idea of body, and the sensory qualities included therein, and to conclude from that inspection that bodies are passive (DM 22, PHK 25). This procedure would make little sense if bodies, according to Berkeley, fail to be causes by definition, simply because they are not minds with wills.[28] What is needed is an explanation of what Berkeley means by activity, which he clearly equates with causal power. Winkler (1989, 130–1) supplies such an account, according to which activity means direction towards an end. But this is to identify efficient causation with final causation, a controversial move at best which Berkeley would be making without comment or argument.

The alternative would be to suppose, as De Motu 33 suggests, that Berkeley holds that we gain a notion of activity, along with a notion of spirit as substance, through reflective awareness/internal consciousness:

[W]e feel it [mind] as a faculty of altering both our own state and that of other things, and that is properly called vital, and puts a wide distinction between soul and bodies. (DM 33)

On this interpretation, Berkeley would again have abandoned the radical Humean position entertained in his notebooks, as he clearly did on the question of the nature of spirit. One can only speculate as to whether his reasons would have been primarily philosophical, theological, or practical. Berkeley's writings, however, are not generally characterized by deference to authority, quite the contrary,[29] as he himself proclaims:

… one thing, I know, I am not guilty of. I do not pin my faith on the sleeve of any great man. I act not out of prejudice & prepossession. I do not adhere to any opinion because it is an old one, a receiv'd one, a fashionable one, or one that I have spent much time in the study and cultivation of. (PC 465)


Berkeley's Works

The standard edition of Berkeley's works is:

  • Berkeley, G. (1948–1957). The Works of George Berkeley, Bishop of Cloyne. A.A. Luce and T.E. Jessop (eds.). London: Thomas Nelson and Sons. 9 vols.

The following abbreviations are used to reference Berkeley's works:

PC “Philosophical Commentaries” Works 1:9–104
NTV An Essay Towards a New Theory of Vision Works 1:171–239
PHK Of the Principles of Human Knowledge: Part 1 Works 2:41–113
3D Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous Works 2:163–263
DM De Motu, or The Principle and Nature of Motion and the Cause of the Communication of Motions, trans. A.A. Luce Works 4:31–52

References to these works are by section numbers (or entry numbers, for PC), except for 3D, where they are by page number.

Other useful editions include:

  • Berkeley, G. (1944). Philosophical commentaries, generally called the Commonplace book [of] George Berkeley, bishop of Cloyne. A.A. Luce (ed.). London: Thomas Nelson and Sons.
  • Berkeley, G. (1975). Philosophical Works; Including the Works on Vision. M. Ayers (ed.). London: Dent.
  • Berkeley, G. (1987). George Berkeley's Manuscript Introduction. B. Belfrage (ed.). Oxford: Doxa.
  • Berkeley, G. (1992). De Motu and The Analyst: A Modern Edition with Introductions and Commentary. D. Jesseph (trans. and ed.). Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

A collection, useful to students, of primary texts constituting background to Berkeley or early critical reactions to Berkeley:

  • McCracken, C. J. and I. C. Tipton (eds.), (2000). Berkeley's Principles and Dialogues: Background Source Materials, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Bibliographical studies

  • Jessop, T. E. (1973). A bibliography of George Berkeley, by T.E. Jessop. With inventory of Berkeley's manuscript remains, by A.A. Luce. The Hague: M. Nijhoff.
  • Turbayne, C., Ed. (1982). Berkeley: Critical and Interpretive Essays. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press. [Contains a bibliography of George Berkeley 1963–1979.]

References cited

  • Atherton, M. (1987). “Berkeley's Anti-Abstractionism.” In Essays on the Philosophy of George Berkeley. E. Sosa (ed.). Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 85–102.
  • Atherton, M. (1990). Berkeley's Revolution in Vision. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Atherton, M., Ed. (1994). Women Philosophers of the Early Modern Period. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Atherton, M. (1995). “Berkeley Without God.” In Berkeley's Metaphysics: Structural, Interpretive, and Critical Essays. R. G. Muehlmann (ed.). University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 231–248.
  • Bennett, J. (1971). Locke, Berkeley, Hume: Central Themes. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bolton, M. B. (1987). “Berkeley's Objection to Abstract Ideas and Unconceived Objects.” In Essays on the Philosophy of George Berkeley. E. Sosa (ed.). Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
  • Bracken, H. M. (1965). The Early Reception of Berkeley's Immaterialism 1710–1733. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Campbell, J. (2002). “Berkeley's Puzzle.” In Conceivability and Possibility. T. S. Gendler and J. Hawthorne (eds.). Oxford: Oxford University Press, 127–143.
  • Chappell, V. (1994). “Locke's theory of ideas.” In The Cambridge Companion to Locke. V. Chappell (ed.). Cambridge> Cambridge University Press, 26–55.
  • Cummins, P. (1990). “Berkeley's Manifest Qualities Thesis.” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 28: 385–401.
  • Downing, L. (2005). “Berkeley's Natural Philosophy and Philosophy of Science.” In The Cambridge Companion to Berkeley. K. P. Winkler (ed.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Fleming, N. (1985). “The Tree in the Quad.” American Philosophical Quarterly, 22: 22–36.
  • Gallois, A. (1974). “Berkeley's Master Argument.” The Philosophical Review, 83: 55–69.
  • Jesseph, D. (1993). Berkeley's Philosophy of Mathematics. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Lennon, T. M. (1988). “Berkeley and the Ineffable.” Synthese, 75: 231–250.
  • Locke, J. (1975). An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Luce, A. A. (1963). The Dialectic of Immaterialism. London: Hodder & Stoughten.
  • Malebranche, N. (1980). The Search After Truth. Columbus: The Ohio State University Press.
  • McCracken, C. (1979). “What Does Berkeley's God See in the Quad?” Archiv fur Geschichte der Philosophie, 61: 280–92.
  • McCracken, C. J. (1995). “Godless Immaterialism: On Atherton's Berkeley.” In Berkeley's Metaphysics: Structural, Interpretive, and Critical Essays. R. G. Muehlmann (ed.). University Park: Pennsylvania State University Press, 249–260.
  • McKim, R. (1997–8). “Abstraction and Immaterialism: Recent Interpretations.” Berkeley Newsletter, 15: 1–13.
  • Muehlmann, R. G. (1992). Berkeley's Ontology. Indianapolis: Hackett.
  • Nadler, S. (1998). “Doctrines of Explanation in Late Scholasticism and in the Mechanical Philosophy.” In The Cambridge History of Seventeenth-Century Philosophy (Volume 1). D. Garber and M. Ayers (eds.). Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 513–552.
  • Pappas, G. S. (2000). Berkeley's Thought. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Pitcher, G. (1977). Berkeley. London: Routledge.
  • Saidel, E. (1993). “Making Sense of Berkeley's Challenge.” History of Philosophy Quarterly, 10 (4): 325–339.
  • Tipton, I. C. (1974). Berkeley: The Philosophy of Immaterialism. London: Methuen & Co Ltd.
  • Wilson, M. D. (1999). Ideas and mechanism: essays on early modern philosophy. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Winkler, K. P. (1989). Berkeley: An Interpretation. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Winkler, K. P. (2005). The Cambridge Companion to Berkeley. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Yolton, J. W. (1984). Perceptual Acquaintance from Descartes to Reid. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.

Additional Selected Secondary Literature

  • Berman, D. (1994). George Berkeley: Idealism and the Man. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bettcher, Talia Mae (2007). Berkeley's Philosophy of Spirit: Consciousness, Ontology and the Elusive Subject. London: Continuum.
  • Creery, W. E., Ed. (1991). George Berkeley: Critical Assessments. London: Routledge. 3 vols.
  • Daniel, Stephen H., Ed. (2007). Reexamining Berkeley' Philosophy. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Fogelin, R. J. (2001). Berkeley and the Principles of Human Knowledge. London: Routledge.
  • Foster, J. and H. Robinson, Eds. (1985). Essays on Berkeley: A Tercentennial Celebration. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Roberts, John Russell (2007). A Metaphysics for the Mob. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Stoneham, T. (2002). Berkeley's World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Urmson, J. O. (1982). Berkeley. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

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Other Internet Resources

  • International Berkeley Society
  • George Berkeley, maintained by David R. Wilkins, School of Mathematics, Trinity College, Dublin (especially useful on the Analyst controversy, but good general information also).
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Related Entries

Descartes, René | Hume, David | idealism | Locke, John | Malebranche, Nicolas

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