Notes to Isaiah Berlin

1. Late nineteenth-century German neo-Kantians had regarded philosophy as the ‘scientia scientiarum’, the science of the sciences. That is, science was concerned with enquiring into, and establishing, how it is possible to know or understand anything else: its goal was to understand understanding, to know what knowledge is and how it can be achieved.

2. Berlin remained vague about where these concepts and categories came from, and perhaps only once made at all explicit what the distinction was between these two types of element in the structure of our thought. Given his overall outlook, and hints scattered through his writings, it seems likely that he believed they come mainly from culture, education, ordinary experience and common social practices, as well as philosophical theories. Some might be 'inbuilt' to the extent that they are influenced by certain basic needs or tendencies intrinsic to human beings, or (like Kant's examples of space and time) are required to make sense of the world and human existence in ways comprehensible to our brains, given the manner in which these are able to function. But Berlin believed that only a few of the concepts and categories that we use are like this; many are cultural or theoretical artefacts, subject to deliberate alteration or change in response to experience. Examples of basic concepts that have been transient include a teleological conception of nature—that is, the view that everything that exists in the world exists for a purpose, and is defined by the purpose that it pursues—and a conception of human beings as wholly different from animals, as opposed to a view that sees them as (particularly well-developed) animals.

As for the difference between concepts and categories, a passage in Historical Inevitability (2002b, 144, note 1) appears to show that categories (Berlin's examples here are 'the three dimensions and infinite extent of ordinary perceptual space, the irreversibility of temporal processes, the multiplicity and countability of material objects') are more capacious, unspecific and abstract than concepts. However, the boundary between the two is left open, and it is unclear at what point it is crossed in the sequence of increasingly specific and variable examples Berlin gives: colours, shapes, (gustatory) tastes, 'the uniformities on which the sciences are based', 'the categories of value', 'moral standards', 'rules of etiquette', subjective preferences of taste. Concepts are thus perhaps related to categories somewhat as species to genus, though Berlin does not put it in exactly these terms, and the evidence for his view does not point to any precise, or consistent, position.

Berlin did not offer a definitive statement or theory about concepts and categories, not only because to do so involved doing the sort of philosophical work from which he shrank, but also because he thought that different concepts and categories differed in their origins, function, necessity, malleability etc. For him, such concepts and categories were simply facts about the way we think, which were philosophically significant, but best approached in historical or psychological terms, rather than as Kantian transcendental ideas (that is, ideas which are wholly prior to experience, and are necessary conditions for any kind of knowledge).

3. Berlin believed that philosophers make two kinds of contribution to the consideration of philosophical questions. The first is to reformulate these questions by suggesting a new outlook on the world that liberates the intellect from the state of intellectual quasi-cramp that has caused the problem. The second, critical rather than creative, contribution is to provide a violent shock to dogmatic assumptions about the solutions to philosophical questions, thus creating new problems and inspiring further thought (1996, 59). For a philosopher to do this required considerable force of character, and a certain amount of exaggeration and simplification, as well as self-confidence and persistence. Later in life Berlin described himself as a historian of ideas rather than as a philosopher, despite the fact that his account of the nature of philosophy emphasised philosophy's historical dimension. This reflected his (high) standards—which he did not believe himself to meet—for considering someone a genuine or significant philosopher.

4. The topics that dominated Berlin's early work on philosophy were the doctrines of verification and phenomenalism, derived from the Vienna Circle by way of A. J. Ayer. In the 1930s Berlin and his philosophical peers at Oxford were occupied primarily with the philosophy of knowledge: How do, or can, we know things, and what does it mean when we say we know something? They argued that these questions were tied up with the use of language, and the evaluation of the meaning of statements with questions such as ‘How do we know what a statement means, or if it has any meaning at all?’ Verificationism held that the meaning of a statement was to be found in the way in which it could be verified; if it couldn't be verified—that is, shown to be true, or proven false—it had no meaning as a statement of fact, but was merely an expression of personal taste, or meaningless. Phenomenalism held that all our knowledge comes from our sense impressions: we can know only sense data, i.e. the deliverances of perceptual experience. Anything not founded on sensory experience is nonsense.

Berlin regarded these doctrines as beneficial in clearing away confusions and exposing errors. But, while he believed that the world of human experience is all that we can know, he rejected verifiability as the only, or the most plausible, criterion for judging beliefs or hypotheses, and maintained throughout his life that many statements that could not be directly verified by empirical observation were nevertheless clearly meaningful. He therefore warned his colleagues that the principle of verification would lead to untenable consequences, and would, if not abandoned or considerably revised, breed new fallacies in the place of those it had dispelled. Berlin argued that there are conceptual truths, such as relationships of degree, similarity or contrast, which are universal, and which inform our experience, but are not subject to empirical test. These fundamental properties of qualities and relations are brute facts which we cannot deny or think without, but which we can also not verify by inspection.

Berlin's approach in these early years was shaped by the emphasis on the analysis of the meaning of words then being championed by his friend J. L. Austin. As Berlin explained at the time, ‘Words are examined by philosophers for the purpose of discovering whether, as they are used in successful communication, they tend to exhibit or obscure some characteristic by which one type of fact differs from another, or alternatively suggest falsely the existence of distinctions which direct inspection of experience fails to reveal. This is done because inattention to either tends to lead to systematic confusion and error, not necessarily in the use of words, which, being conventional and intended for common practice and not the convenience of philosophers, is rightly not altered by their criticisms, but in the accurate discrimination and description of irreducible types of experience’ (1937, 100–2).

5. The term derives from the Ionian philosophers, the founders of Western philosophy, such as Thales, who offered different theories about the composition of the universe; a hallmark of these theories was the attempt to discover a single substance out of which everything else is composed.

6. The distinction between the human or cultural sciences—history, philosophy, law and the various social sciences, such as sociology, economics, anthropology etc.—had become a major issue in nineteenth-century German philosophy. It continued to play an important part in Germany in the earlier twentieth century, and also became a significant issue in the English-speaking world, due both to the influence of the Vienna Circle and to the emergence of the social sciences as an increasingly self-confident and respected field of study. Berlin's work, even though it invoked earlier figures such as G. B. Vico and J. G. Herder, closely resembled, and was influenced by, attempts by such thinkers as Heinrich Rickert, Wilhelm Dilthey and Max Weber to explain the nature of the human sciences.

7. Berlin acknowledged that there were certain human sciences that sought to emulate the aims of the natural sciences, by trying to discover regularities in human behaviour, and refining them into explanatory laws. Berlin was dubious regarding such disciplines—economics, sociology, psychology among them—but acknowledged that such scientific studies of human behaviour had some value. He maintained, though, that history remained fundamentally different from the natural sciences in its aims and techniques. Other human sciences may seek to abstract from a large number of stable similarities and recurrences in human behaviour across many different cases, in order to construct useful, applicable ideal models to help better understand such behaviour. But history is different: it is concerned with exploring and understanding individual cases as individual, that is, unique, non-recurrent, changing and unstable. It is richer in description and less rigorous in explanation. Other human sciences necessarily abstract: their descriptive power is extensive rather than intensive, their descriptions thinner. The subject-matter of history, on the other hand, involves a thick texture of criss-crossing, constantly changing and melting conscious and unconscious beliefs and assumptions (1978b, 139). History is an ‘amalgam, a rich brew composed of apparently disparate ingredients’. In looking for satisfactory and satisfying historical accounts, we look for ‘something full enough and concrete enough to meet our conception of public life [...] seen from as many points of view and at as many levels as possible, including as many components, factors, aspects as the widest and deepest knowledge, the greatest analytical power, insight, imagination can present’. Historical explanation is arrangement of the discovered facts in patterns which satisfy us because they accord with life—the variety of human experience and activity—as we know it and can imagine it (1978b, 131–2). The historian seeks to capture the unique pattern and peculiar characteristics of a particular subject: to paint a portrait, rather than take an X-ray image.

8. Berlin took up the problem of free will and determinism, and the related topic of the role of individual choice and agency in history, both indirectly, through an examination of Leo Tolstoy's philosophy of history (originally published 1951, republished with additions as The Hedgehog and the Fox 1953 and in 2008), and in (Historical Inevitability, 1954; republished in 2002b). These questions had, however, likely preoccupied him since his work on Marx in the mid-1930s, when he would have encountered them in the form of Plekhanov's defence of historical determinism. Plekhanov's work served as a challenge to Berlin's belief in the historical importance of individuals, and his conception of morality, based as it was on the human capacity for choice.

9. The influence on Berlin of Soviet Communism is obvious here; but while this was the main inspiration and target for his attack, his critique could also be, and was, applied to Nazism, and even to the more complacent and inhumane policies of capitalist Western democracies.

10. Apart from one essay on ancient Greek individualism (in 2002b), he devoted scant attention to the history of the ideas in the ancient world. As for the Middle Ages, while Berlin could admit that the period might have been superior to what followed in some respects—greater public order, intellectual security, social cohesion etc.—he regarded it as by and large an intellectually blank period, because of the very stability and conservatism of its intellectual life. Berlin's interest in Renaissance thought was greater, though it yielded only one essay — an original examination of ‘The Originality of Machiavelli’ (1972; republished in Berlin 1979).

11. Berlin's writings on the history of ideas can be classified in several different ways. One is geographical, yielding as a first category works on Russian intellectual and cultural history, particularly of the nineteenth century; here belong his several essays on Herzen, his two studies of Tolstoy, his pieces on Turgenev, Belinsky and Plekhanov, as well as those on Russian populism and the theme of artistic commitment in Russian thought (most of them included in 2008). The other geographical category covers the history of ideas in Western Europe, primarily focusing on Germany, but also encompassing France and Italy (with glances at England and Switzerland). (A third category may be made of Berlin's several essays on modern, secular Jewish thinkers.) It is also natural to divide his historical essays into portraits of individuals (in addition to those already named, Vico, Herder, Hamann, Rousseau, Kant, Maistre, Saint-Simon, Fichte, Hegel, Hess, Marx, Mill, Sorel, Verdi, Meinecke and others) and examinations of larger epochs, movements and themes—most notably the Enlightenment and the Counter-Enlightenment, the romantic movement and nineteenth-century socialism.

12. Berlin derived this interpretation of the Enlightenment's assumptions and inconsistencies from Plekhanov's works on the history of materialism.

13. Berlin focused, in his accounts of the Enlightenment, on the radical, materialist, naturalist, proto-Utilitarian element among the philosophes — Holbach, Helvétius, La Mettrie—and the more mild-mannered Condorcet, though he acknowledged, and sought to encompass, other figures—Montesquieu, Voltaire, Hume, Kant (the last two seen, however, as forerunners of the Enlightenment's critics, however unintentionally), and sometimes Rousseau.

14. These included the ultramontane Catholic reactionary Joseph de Maistre (whom he portrayed as a precursor of Fascism and the author of a disturbingly compelling, dark and savage vision of human life as essentially characterised by conflict); the Italian antiquarian and critic of scientism Giambattista Vico; and pre-romantic German enemies of Enlightenment rationalism and universalism such as Hamann and Herder.

15. Berlin used the terms ‘values’, ‘ideals’ and ‘goals’ more or less—but not quite—interchangeably. Values, for Berlin, are ideas about what it is good to be and do—about what sort of life, what sort of character, what sort of actions, what state of being it is desirable to aspire to.

16. Most prominent among these other pluralist thinkers have been Stuart Hampshire, Bernard Williams, Michael Walzer, Thomas Nagel, John Gray, Steven Lukes, John Kekes, Joseph Raz, William Galston and George Crowder; Robert Nozick, John Rawls, Richard Rorty and Charles Taylor have at times advanced positions which in some ways resemble pluralism, but are difficult to categorise in relation to it.

17. Berlin did not respond to Leo Strauss's direct and powerful attack; he did respond to Arnaldo Momigliano's criticism, which made the pluralism = relativism accusation through an examination of Berlin's interpretations of Vico and Herder; and he was anxious to draw a sharp distinction between relativism and pluralism in his later work. Nevertheless, the charge continues to be made by critics, and rejected by supporters, of Berlin's pluralism.

18. One of the best-known forms of relativism is cultural relativism—the view that all values emerge from particular cultures, and are valid within and for those cultures, but not necessarily for others. Berlin sometimes appears to say this; he also seems sometimes to endorse, and sometimes to disavow, a major assumption underlying most versions of cultural relativism, namely, a holistic conception of culture. This regards cultures as unified and wholly separate entities, webs in which each belief is bound together with every other belief, and within which members cannot disentangle their beliefs one from another, rejecting some, retaining others, judging each critically and separately. It remains controversial whether Berlin's view of culture was holistic, and, if so, to what extent and in what way; but it has been maintained—most notably and persistently by Steven Lukes—that pluralism can be rescued from the shoals of relativism if the pluralist rejects a holistic conception of culture, which, Lukes maintains, is fundamentally mistaken (Lukes 1994, 1995, 1998, 2001). Lukes's critique of holism, and his de-coupling of pluralism from holism, are plausible; it does not however necessarily follow that not accepting holism allows the pluralist to believe consistently in universal standards or values (conflicting though these may be) transcending all cultures. The rejection of a holistic view of culture does remove a major obstacle to a belief that certain values transcend cultural differences, in suggesting that cultures aren't wholly self-contained, closed-off and non-connecting. However, the occurrence of variety, conflict and dissent within cultures, and the recurrence of certain beliefs in different cultures, need not, in themselves, suggest the existence of a universal human nature or universal values underlying cultural variety.

19. Gray has sometimes presented his critique of liberalism as a critique only of a certain sort of liberalism, or strain within the liberal tradition, and has opposed to this another, better, more pluralistic liberalism (see Gray 2002); at other times, he has presented his critique as a more wholesale indictment of liberalism as such (see e.g. Gray 1993, 1995, 1998).

Gray's arguments can be summarised in vastly simplified form as three main propositions about liberalism. The first of these is that liberalism is absolutist and monistic: it is based on assigning an absolute moral/political priority to liberty as the paramount political value. If values really are incommensurable, then this is unallowable. The second is that liberalism is one value-system or way of life among many. If pluralism is conceived of in terms of ways of life, value-systems, cultures etc., rather than individual values, then the conclusion would be that liberalism is just one of these many valid but conflicting ways of life, with no claim to privilege. Therefore, liberals living in liberal societies are free to be liberal and pursue liberal values; but they have no right to impose their views on others, or regard themselves as superior or their way of doing things as preferable. Finally, Gray charges that liberalism by its nature has historically been a universalist doctrine—that is, that it has denied this last proposition, and indeed claimed to be superior to other forms of life, for all people, everywhere, at all times. Therefore, if pluralism is accepted, and liberals accept liberalism as just one form of life among many, then one of the central goals of traditional liberalism must be abandoned.

20. Galston has argued that pluralism and liberalism are compatible if neither is seen as a fully comprehensive or encompassing doctrine, and has sought to suggest what a politics that is both truly pluralist and truly liberal would look like. Crowder, in probably the most systematic and careful discussion of the topic to date, has sought to show that Gray's account of value pluralism incorporates a number of assumptions and conclusions that make his position closer to relativism than to a truly objective value pluralism; that genuine value pluralism is wholly consistent with a belief in a core or minimum of universal human values, as well as non-monistic and non-quantitative comparison of and choice between values based on practical reason; and that value-pluralism's recognition of both genuine moral variety and a basic, minimal standard of human decency support liberalism. Steven Lukes has also contributed much to this debate, as have commentary by Hans Blokland (1999), Jeffrey Friedman (1997), Amy Gutmann (1999), Ira Katznelson (1994), Charles Larmore (1994), Pratap B. Mehta (1997), Jonathan Riley (2001 and 2002), Michael Walzer (1995) and Daniel Weinstock (1997); there is also a significant review of the topic by Albert Dzur (1998), and a collection of essays exploring the political implications of pluralism (Baghramian and Ingram, 2000). Whether these works—in particular, Galston and Crowder's volumes—have exhausted the pluralism/liberalism debate remains to be seen.

21. The insensitive and authoritarian rule of managerial bureaucrats—those whom Stalin, in one of Berlin's favourite quotations, called ‘engineers of human souls’—particularly worried Berlin throughout the 1950s, when most of his work on political judgement was written.

22. While Herzen's combination of ironic wit, moral passion and vivacity naturally appealed to Berlin, it may seem strange that the biddable British academic should have identified himself with the wayward Russian aristocrat turned wandering revolutionary, or that the very embodiment of cautious, sceptical and moderate liberalism should have regarded a radical malcontent, the father of Russian agrarian socialism, as a political guide.

In fact, Herzen was an ambivalent revolutionary, and Berlin, while certainly every inch the liberal, was a less stolid and more radical thinker than is sometimes recognised. The two men shared a passion for liberty, a suspicion of authority, an opposition to both injustice and intellectual complacency. However, what Berlin seized on in Herzen was the latter's opposition to — and occasional passionate denunciation of— the doctrine of historical inevitability, and the political ethics to which this attack was joined.

23. The distinction goes back at least to Kant, and it (or something like it) had appeared in the works of T. H. Green, Bernard Bosanquet, and Boris Chicherin, and had more recently been used by Guido de Ruggiero, R. G. Collingwood, John Petrov Plamenatz, and Dorothy Fosdyke, among others; Berlin himself acknowledged Benjamin Constant as the main influence on his thinking. Berlin's conception of positive and negative liberty may also owe something to Rousseau's distinction between the liberty of the man and that of the citizen, and to the more general distinction among earlier theorists, of whom Rousseau was the most prominent, between natural and moral liberty.

24. Berlin cites Stoicism's preaching of self-discipline and renunciation as a way of resisting, and remaining uncorrupted by, overwhelmingly powerful earthly authorities; Rousseau's insistence that the only just society is one in which people retain their liberty by transmuting it from the individual self-governance of solitary selves in a state of nature to the collective self-rule of the people by the people, so that obedience to the civil authority is really obedience to oneself, and thus freedom rather than subjection; and finally Kant's philosophy of moral autonomy, whereby the individual's inalienable freedom and dignity lie in the fact that the individual acts in accordance with a self-given moral law, and is therefore recognised as a freely choice-making being, dependent on no one and nothing else. Berlin has considerable sympathy for this last, Kantian, outlook, though he believed that it had inspired profound errors. He acknowledged that the Stoic ideal was admirable, but charged that it rested on a misuse of words: to attain independence through a renunciation of those desires that make one prey to the domination of others might be sublime, and it might be the best that one can do in certain circumstances; but the fact remains that one is then less free than one would be otherwise, in that there are constraints, both internal and, ultimately, external, preventing one from acting with true freedom.

25. It must be noted that the former part of Berlin's argument here is somewhat stronger than the latter: the conflict of values may mean that the making of choices is an inescapable and even significant part of life, but this is not, in itself, a reason for embracing the making of choices as something valuable and central to both dignity and fulfillment. Indeed, if making choices involves the tragic losses that Berlin claims it sometimes does, one may be inclined to try to escape the painful and difficult position of having to choose, rather than proudly embracing it.

26. Berlin's Zionism has been the subject of minor controversy. Some critics have complained that it led him to turn a blind eye to injustice and tacitly approve of Israeli chauvinism. This was not so. Berlin was a liberal and humane Zionist; he believed in the justice and necessity of a Jewish homeland, but also opposed violence, nationalist aggression and chauvinism wherever they appeared. Indeed, his aversion to political radicalism led him to support the moderate, pro-British Chaim Weizmann against more assertive Zionist leaders such as David Ben-Gurion in the 1940s, even when it became apparent that Ben-Gurion's strategy was likely to be more effective than Weizmann's in establishing a Jewish state. Later in life Berlin was a quiet but firm, and at times privately vehement, critic of the Likud bloc and of Israeli policy in the West Bank and Gaza, and a supporter of the Peace Now movement and a ‘two-state solution’ to the Israeli-Palestinian conflict (see I. Berlin, 1997, letter to A. Margalit).

27. These included Raymond Aron, Daniel Bell, Norberto Bobbio, Michael Oakeshott, Karl Popper and Arthur Schlesinger, Jr.

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