Notes to Experiment in Biology

1. Description of the depiction of the Meselson-Stahl experiment. On the first row: a picture of a cell with a double helix labelled “Bacteria growing in N15. All its DNA is heavy.”; next two cells labelled, “Transfer to N14 medium.”; finally four cells labelled, “Continued growth in N14 medium.”

Next row a label, “DNA isolated from the cells is mixed with CsCl solution (6M; density ~ 1.7) and placed in ultracentrifuge cell.” and below it a centrifuge with two test tubes labelled “centrifuge cell”.

Next row, a label, “Solution centrifuged at very high speed for ~48hr.” and below that the centrifuge rotating with one test tube labelled, “Greater concentration of CsCl at the outside is due to its sedimentation under the centrifugal force.” The other test tube is labelled above with “ρ=1:65 ρ=1:80” and below with three arrows pointing to parts of another cell. The leftmost part is labelled “Light DNA”, the midmost, “N14–N15 hybrid DNA”, and the rightmost, “Location of heavy DNA”.

Below the rotating centrifuge is an arrow pointing to a label, “The location of DNA molecules within the centrifuge cell can be determined by ultraviolet optics. DNA solutions absorb strongly at 2600A.”

And below that three test tubes. The leftmost with a double helix at the bottom is labelled, “Before transfer to N14”. The second with a double helix in the middle is labelled, “One cell generation after transfer to N14. The third with a double helix at the top and a broken helix in the middle is labelled, “Two cell generations after transer to N14”.

Copyright © 2012 by
Marcel Weber <marcel.weber@unige.ch>

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