Bernard Bosanquet (1848-1923), British philosopher, political theorist and social reformer, was one of the principal exponents (with F.H. Bradley) of late nineteenth and early twentieth century ‘Absolute Idealism.’
- 1. Life
- 2. General Background
- 3. Principal Contributions
- 4. General Assessment
- 5. Works
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Bernard Bosanquet was born on July 14, 1848 in Rock Hall (near Alnwick), Northumberland, England. He was the youngest of five sons of the Reverend Robert William Bosanquet by the latter's second wife, Caroline (MacDowall). Bernard's eldest brother, Charles, was one of the founders of the Charity Organization Society and its first Secretary. Another brother, Day, was an Admiral in the Royal Navy and served as Governor of South Australia. Yet another, Holford, was elected to the Royal Society and was a fellow of St John's College, Oxford.
Bosanquet studied at Harrow (1862-1867) and at Balliol College, Oxford (1867-1870), where he came under the influence of idealist ‘German’ philosophy, principally through the work of Edward Caird and T.H. Green. (Green reputedly described him as “the most gifted man of his generation.”) Bosanquet received first class honors in classical moderations (1868) and literae humaniores (1870) and, upon graduation, was elected to a Fellowship of University College, Oxford, over F.H. Bradley. While at University College, Bosanquet taught the history of logic and the history of moral philosophy; his only published work during this time was a translation of G.F. Schoemann's Athenian Constitutional History.
Upon the death of his father in 1880 and the receipt of a small inheritance in 1881, Bosanquet left Oxford for London, where he became active in adult education and social work through such organizations as the London Ethical Society (founded 1886), the Charity Organisation Society, and the short-lived London School of Ethics and Social Philosophy (1897-1900). During this time he met and married (in 1895) Helen Dendy, an activist in social work and social reform, who was to be a leading figure in the Royal Commission on the Poor Laws (1905-1909).
While in London, Bosanquet was also able to engage in philosophical work, and many of his major publications date from this time. Some of them — such as The Philosophical Theory of the State and Psychology of the Moral Self — were developed from lectures that he gave to adult education groups. He was an early member of the Aristotelian Society, and served as its Vice President (1888) and President (1894-1898).
At the age of 55, Bosanquet briefly returned to professorial life, as Professor of Moral Philosophy at the University of St Andrews in Scotland (1903-1908), but his health was not good and he wished to devote more time to original philosophical writing. He retired to Oxshott, Surrey, where he nevertheless remained active in social work and philosophical circles. In 1911 and 1912, Bosanquet was elected Gifford Lecturer in the University of Edinburgh. The text of these lectures — The Principle of Individuality and Value and The Value and Destiny of the Individual — serve as the most developed statement of his metaphysical views. Understanding Bosanquet's metaphysics, however, requires recognizing that it reflects his earlier work in ethics, social work and political philosophy.
The publication of the Gifford lectures incited a good deal of critical reaction to Bosanquet's views, particularly in metaphysics (e.g., on the ‘idealism/materialism’ controversy and on the nature of finite individuality), logic (e.g., concerning the status of propositions and the nature of inference), and ethics. Despite his vigorous participation in such exchanges, present throughout Bosanquet's work is his desire to find common ground among philosophers of various traditions and to show relationships among different schools of thought, rather than to dwell on what separates them.
In spite of the challenges to idealism from both within and outside of the academic world, discussion of Bosanquet's work continued through the early decades of the 20th century. He died in his 75th year in London on February 8, 1923.
At the time of his death, Bosanquet was arguably “the most popular and the most influential of the English idealists” (J.H. Randall). He was the author or editor of more than 20 books and some 150 articles. The breadth of his philosophical interests is obvious from the range of topics treated in his books and essays — logic, aesthetics, epistemology, social and public policy, psychology, metaphysics, ethics and political philosophy. For his contributions to philosophy and to social work, he had been made a Fellow of the British Academy in 1907, and had received honorary degrees from Glasgow (1892), Durham (1903), Birmingham (1909), and St Andrews (1911).
Bosanquet was one of the earliest philosophers in the Anglo-American world to appreciate the work of Edmund Husserl, Benedetto Croce, Giovanni Gentile and Emile Durkheim, and the relation of his thought to that of Ludwig Wittgenstein, G.E. Moore and Bertrand Russell is significant, though still largely unexplored. Although F.H. Bradley is today far better known in philosophical circles, in his obituary in the Times, Bosanquet was said to have been “the central figure of British philosophy for an entire generation.”
Bosanquet's philosophical views were in many ways a reaction to 19th century Anglo-American empiricism and materialism (e.g., that of Jeremy Bentham, John Stuart Mill and Alexander Bain), but also to that of contemporary personalistic idealism (e.g. that of Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, James Ward, Hastings Rashdall, W.R. Sorley, and J.M.E. McTaggart) and organicism (e.g. Herbert Spencer). Bosanquet held that the inspiration of many of his ideas could be found in Hegel, Kant, and Rousseau and, ultimately, in classical Greek thought. Indeed, while at the beginning of his philosophical career Bosanquet described Kant and Hegel as “the great masters who ‘sketched the plan’,” he said that the most important influence on him was that of Plato. The result was a brand of idealist philosophical thought that combined the Anglo-Saxon penchant for empirical study with a vocabulary and conceptual apparatus borrowed from the continent. Bosanquet is generally considered to be one of the most ‘Hegelian’ of the British Idealists, though the extent to which the term ‘Hegelian’ is appropriate or illuminating in describing his work has been a matter of some recent debate.
More directly, Bosanquet's thought shows a number of similarities to that of T.H. Green, his teacher, and to Bradley, his contemporary. Bosanquet himself acknowledges that these similarities are far from coincidental. He frequently admits his debt to Green's works and, as late as 1920, he wrote that “since the appearance of Ethical Studies… I have recognized [Bradley] as my master; and there is never, I think, any more than a verbal difference or difference of emphasis, between us”.
There is, however, at least some hyperbole in such comments. Bosanquet did not follow either Green or Bradley blindly, and there are important differences in his work. While he defended Green's ethical theory and many of Green's conclusions, he addressed a number of issues never dealt with in Green's corpus. Moreover, while it is clear that Bosanquet considered Bradley's work in metaphysics and ethics to have been momentous, this admiration was no doubt influenced by the fact that Bradley's philosophy and method reflected interests and an approach that Bosanquet had arrived at quite independently.
Bosanquet's earliest philosophical writing was in logic; his interest in the area continued throughout his career, and it was initially considered to be the area in which he made his most significant contributions to philosophy.
The first published statement of Bosanquet's views on logic appears in his 1883 essay, “Logic as the Science of Knowledge.” Here, one finds an explicit debt to Hegel and to Lotze (whose System of Philosophy he was encouraged by T.H. Green to translate and edit). Developed expositions of Bosanquet's logic appear in his Knowledge and Reality: A Criticism of Mr F.H. Bradley's ‘Principles of Logic’ (1885) and in Logic, or the Morphology of Knowledge (1888). (The main themes of this latter work were recast in a short volume, The Essentials of Logic .) Bosanquet produced a second edition of his Logic in 1911, adding a number of notes and three chapters dealing specifically with pragmatist and realist criticisms of idealist coherence theory. During the last decade of his life he engaged in a number of exchanges on questions in logic, culminating in the publication of Implication and Linear Inference (1920), which C.D. Broad described as containing “the clearest and most plausible account” of Bosanquet's views (Broad, p. 323).
For Bosanquet, logic is central to philosophy — but it is ‘logic’ in a broad sense. He writes: “By Logic we understand, with Plato and Hegel, the supreme law or nature of experience, the impulse towards unity and coherence […] by which every fragment yearns towards the whole to which it belongs…” (Principle of Individuality and Value, p. 340); the “inherent nature of reason” is “the absolute demand for totality and consistency” (Value and Destiny of the Individual, p. 9). Moreover, logic — “the spirit of totality” — is “the clue to reality, value and freedom” (Principle of Individuality and Value, p. 23). Not surprisingly, then, Bosanquet argues that metaphysics — “the general science of reality” — cannot be distinguished from logic — the science of knowledge — any more than one can separate a result from the process which produces it.
Despite the connection between logic and knowledge, however, Bosanquet denied that he was offering an epistemological view — in the sense of a theory of cognition in which truth and reality are treated as independent of one another.
In general, then, there are three key elements to Bosanquet's logic. First, logic is concerned with “the properties which are possessed by objects or ideas in so far as they are members of the world of knowledge.” (Essentials of Logic, p. 44) Everything that can be studied must be ‘asserted in consciousness’ and, thus, is ultimately the concern of logic. Second, Bosanquet writes that reality is “composed of contents determined by systematic combination in a single coherent structure.” (Logic, p. 5) To have a complete description of some thing, then, it must be understood in its context and in its relations to other things. To say that a judgement is ‘true,’ then, we must take the system in which the judgement is bound up and then note “how unintelligible that part of our world… would become if we denied that judgement.” (“Logic as the Science of Knowledge,” Works, vol. 1, p. 302) Bosanquet's view is best described, then, as a coherence theory — though it is one that is concerned with more than the formal consistency of the set of true propositions. Third, according to Bosanquet, “the true meaning of propositions lies always ahead of fully conscious usage, as the real reality lies ahead of actual experience” (Logic, 2nd ed., p. x); our understanding of the world is always incomplete. Nevertheless, “experience forces thought along certain lines from partial to more complete notions.” (“Logic as the Science of Knowledge,” Works, vol. 1, p. 311) Coherence, therefore, is attained by a dialectical, evolutionary process. But this does not mean that humanity will some day arrive at ultimate truth.
Bosanquet‘s logic was, and has been, the subject of much discussion; the focus of this debate is the nature of inference and the theory of induction.
In Implication and Linear Inference, for example, Bosanquet defends his long-standing view that inference is ‘every process by which knowledge extends itself’ (op. cit., p. 2). It is made possible by implication — i.e., the property of each system whereby one can go from one part to all other parts. Standard formal logic (e.g., linear inference or syllogistic) is only a limited form of inference for, as Bosanquet reminded his readers, logical principles are not part of some abstract real but are the expression of the movement and life of the mind.
Bosanquet considered induction as importantly related to deduction; in this respect, his views are similar to those of Christoph Sigwart and W.S. Jevons. To see specifically how induction and deduction are related, one must start with Bosanquet's distinction between the ‘verification’ of a hypothesis and its ‘establishment.’ In induction, a hypothesis is “verified by the agreement of its deduced conclusion with observed facts”; it is established only “in proportion as we are convinced that the verified results could not be deduced from any other principle.”(“Logic as the Science of Knowledge,” Works, vol. 1, p. 329). But then Bosanquet adds that “every verified result is pro tanto a confirmation of any principles from which it is deducible” (ibid.). Inference, then, is neither deductive (i.e., from general principles) nor inductive (e.g., from ‘instances’ or ‘sense data’) but “systematic” — it proceeds from within a whole or a system. Thus, knowledge does not exist as a set of isolated formal propositions; all that we know is within a system.
Bosanquet's view of inference and of induction had significant consequences, not only for the then-contemporary understanding of logic — by challenging the view that deductive inference is “useless” (because those who know the premises already know the content of the conclusion) — but also for the ‘new’ logic of Frege, as developed by Russell and Whitehead, where judgement was separated from inference and ‘linear implication’ was the norm. It is perhaps for this reason that Bosanquet's arguments incited not only a wide-ranging critical response — particularly from the ‘neo-realists’ at Cambridge and in the United States — but the tantalizing remark by Wittgenstein to Moore in 1914 (cited in McGuinness, pp. 199-200) that much of Wittgenstein's (unsuccessful) Cambridge B.A. dissertation was “cribbed” from Bosanquet's logic.
Although Bosanquet's logic follows, in many respects, that of Hegel, it arguably avoids Bertrand Russell's criticism of Hegel's logic — i.e., that it unconsciously assumes and incorporates the faults of traditional logic. Indeed, Bosanquet's defense of elements of classical deductive logic against J.S. Mill's criticisms “made philosophy safe for logic” and was, in large part, responsible for “rehabilitating” logic in British philosophy, particularly after the critiques of Locke and his successors. It has also been argued (by Fred Wilson) that Bosanquet's views on logic and scientific method are close to those of some contemporary critics of empirical accounts of natural laws, such as Fred Dretske and David Armstrong.
Bosanquet's publications on metaphysics date from the late 1880s, but it was not until the early 1910s, when he was in his 60s, that he published his comprehensive statement on the topic — his Gifford lectures, The Principle of Individuality and Value and The Value and Destiny of the Individual. It is important to realise that it was only after he had developed his views in ethics, social work, philosophical psychology, and political philosophy, that his metaphysics took its final form.
Bosanquet's first essays on metaphysics — “Is Mind Synonymous with Consciousness?” and “What Takes Place in Voluntary Action?” — focused on the nature of mind, and in 1893-94 he offered a course of lectures that became the basis of his book, Psychology of the Moral Self (1897). Opposed to the crude associationist and the ‘push and pull’ psychology of empiricists (such as David Hume, J.S. Mill and Alexander Bain) who held that thought consists of disconnected, discrete data of the senses, and the ‘psychological habits’ that arise out of the contiguous relations of these data, Bosanquet argued that one cannot separate the human individual from everything makes up its world.
A key interest of Bosanquet was the articulation of a theory of mind and will. In Psychology of the Moral Self, in a lecture on ‘the organisation of intelligence,’ Bosanquet argues that “[t]he psychical elements of the mind are so grouped and interconnected as to constitute what are technically known as Appercipient masses or systems” (op. cit., p. 42). The mind or self, then, is a multiplicity of such systems. Bosanquet describes the mind, then, as “a growth of material, more like a process of crystallization, the material moulding itself according to its own affinities and cohesions” (op. cit., p. 9) — a view which, he says, is implicit in Plato and Aristotle.
In his Gifford lectures, Bosanquet moves beyond the discussion of mind in order to focus on a principle underlying much of his philosophical thought and rooted in his studies in logic — individuality.
In the first series of Gifford lectures, The Principle of Individuality and Value, Bosanquet holds that when we speak of ‘the real’ or ‘truth,’ we have in mind a ‘whole’ (i.e., a system of connected members), and it is by seeing a thing in its relation to others that we can say not only that we have a better knowledge of that thing, but that it is “more complete,” more true, and more real. Since this whole is self-contained and self-sufficient, Bosanquet calls it (following Aristotle) an ‘individual.’ But because of its ‘independence’ and self explanatory character or necessity, it is also a universal. The ‘whole’ is, then, what Bosanquet calls a ‘concrete universal.’ This ‘logical universal as a living world’ he calls “positive individuality” or “the Absolute,” and the position he adopts is often referred to ‘absolute idealism.’
According to Bosanquet, the ‘mainspring of movement and effort in the finite world’ is ‘contradiction.’ Nevertheless, as principles come into conflict, a process of harmonisation also occurs. Terms are readjusted or new distinctions are introduced, so that both conflicting elements find a place in the result. This process or method of meeting and removing contradiction, characteristic of the growth of any thing, is what Bosanquet calls the argument a contingentia mundi, and it is through this process that one is led to the Absolute.
This understanding of individuality is the principle of value. Since individuality is ‘logical self-completeness and freedom from incoherence,’ Bosanquet holds that, in as far as things are completely organised and have parts which confirm and sustain one another, they have value; it is not a matter of whether they are, as in utilitarian accounts, desired.
In Bosanquet's metaphysics, there is no rigid line between ‘nature’ or the physical, and ‘mind.’ Bosanquet is clearly opposed to dualism; he sees the “mind as a perfection and cooperation of the adaptations and acquisitions stored in the body” (op. cit., p. xxv) and not a separate thing, independent of the body. Bosanquet's anti-dualism does not, however, lead to panpsychism — the view that all nature has consciousness. (In this respect he appears to differ from F.H. Bradley.) Still, he argues that nature is complete only through human consciousness. Human consciousness serves, Bosanquet holds, as a “copula” between nature and the Absolute.
In the second series of Gifford lectures, The Value and Destiny of the Individual, Bosanquet focuses on how his theory of the Absolute bears on the nature and value of the finite (i.e., human) individual. He does so, first, by saying something of the evolution or development of the human person, as both a natural being and a being possessing a self-determining will, then, by looking at finite beings in relation to one another and, finally, by showing how finite selfhood can have stability and security. ‘Progress’ in the development of the human individual, Bosanquet suggests, is not ‘serial’ nor should it be seen as approximation towards a defined telos. The destiny of the finite self is that it comes to recognise itself as an element of the Absolute; it is in relation to this, Bosanquet says, that one sees its value.
Some critics responded that Bosanquet's arguments radically reduced or eliminated the value of the human person because, they claimed, the ‘perfection of human personality’ that he advocated was not the development of a finite individual as a finite individual. This issue was the focus of an important exchange among Bosanquet, Andrew Seth Pringle-Pattison, G.F. Stout, and R.B. Haldane on “Do Individuals Possess a Substantive or Adjectival Mode of Being?” (published in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 1917-1918). Here, Bosanquet asserts that individuals characterise the world “as permanent qualifications” (op. cit., pp. 86-87) — but, at the same time, he reiterates his view that finite selves are not “necessarily eternal or everlasting units.” Still, one may say that while Bosanquet's ‘absolute idealism’ leads him to reject certain conceptions of the self, he does not reject its existence or its value. He simply denies that finite individuals are wholly independent centres or principles of value.
Although Bosanquet described his approach as ‘idealist,’ he was aware that the term was broad and potentially misleading. In work published after the Gifford lectures, Bosanquet took pains to try to explain how his view was entirely unlike the subjective idealism challenged by G.E. Moore's “The Refutation of Idealism” and, in “Realism and Metaphysic” (1917), Bosanquet suggested that his philosophy could be more accurately described as “speculative.”
Bosanquet pursues this issue of the character of his philosophy in The Distinction between Mind and its Objects (1913) and in the last book to be published during his lifetime, The Meeting of Extremes in Contemporary Philosophy (1921).
In The Distinction between Mind and its Objects — which dealt with the common characteristics of American neo-realism and Italian neo-idealism (specifically, that of Benedetto Croce and Giovanni Gentile), and the relation of his own account to that of ‘philosophical realism’ and the ‘neo-realists’ — Bosanquet argues that the terms ‘idealism’ and ‘realism’ are both vague and misleading. There are, as he notes, different kinds of realism and different kinds of idealism as well. The terms are not antithetical; in fact, Bosanquet saw some affinity between himself and the realist Samuel Alexander. Nevertheless, Bosanquet thoroughly rejected the views of such authors as R.B. Perry, W.P. Montague and E.B. Holt. He argued that, while aiming at providing a comprehensive view of reality, this ‘new realism’ restricts the place of mind and cuts it off from physical reality.
The very title of The Meeting of Extremes in Contemporary Philosophy (1921) reveals Bosanquet's conviction that, despite the apparently radical differences separating them, there is a convergence both in aim and in result of the investigations of the different dominant philosophical ‘schools’ — for example, on such matters as the reality of time, and the confidence of progress in ethics and in the advance of humanity as a whole. Bosanquet notes that, although there is a clear disagreement among critical realists and absolutists concerning the nature of ‘the real,’ as each seeks a complete account, it is led to adopt positions that are characteristic of its ‘opponent.’ Bosanquet's own “speculative philosophy” — based, he maintains, on careful analysis of experience — complements both of the preceding approaches. With a more reasoned understanding of progress and a correct account of the nature of ‘individuality’ and the ‘unity’ of reality (where mind and its objects are seen together in a single context), the absurdities of the extremes of idealism and realism can be avoided, and the opposition between them can be overcome.
Bosanquet's philosophical views on religion were in large part influenced by early nineteenth century biblical studies — initially, mediated through the writings of his Oxford tutors, Edward Caird and Benjamin Jowett.
The work of David Strauss, Ferdinand Baur, and others, at the beginning of the nineteenth century, marked a turn in the scholarly approach to religion and scripture, towards what is now called ‘the scientific study of religion.’ Religious experience, sacred texts, and religious practice were now to be seen as phenomena open to critical investigation and which could — and should — be examined independently of one's religious commitment, and according to the principles of literary and historical analysis. Strauss and his followers challenged the conflation of religious dogmas and creeds with original religious experience, and they were particularly doubtful whether one could recover much knowledge of such experience from ‘events’ recorded in scripture.
By the mid-nineteenth century, this approach to the study of religion had established itself in Britain, particularly in Oxford. Figures such as Jowett and Caird, and others in the Church of England ‘Broad Church movement’ (such as Frederick Temple, Bishop J.W. Colenso, and Thomas Arnold) argued for a more analytical and ‘rational’ approach to understanding religious belief — though they were frequently criticised for this by Church authorities.
The distinction of practice from dogma and experience from creeds was, however, also a feature of the evangelical movement within the Church of England. Bosanquet, like many of his fellow idealists, was raised in an Evangelical household; his later philosophical views, then, can be seen as an evolution, rather than an interruption or contradiction, of his early religious convictions.
Despite his conventional religious upbringing, Bosanquet was not an orthodox Christian. While he did claim that religion was not only central to one's life, but was that which made life worth living, he held that, taken literally or at face value, many particular religious beliefs are either incoherent or false. Bosanquet notes that, in religion, “rationalism, curiosity, metaphor, and deduction from metaphor, operate by way of distortion” (What Religion Is, p. 68), and that, to help one read biblical texts, one must engage in a hermeneutical enterprise, and ‘learn to interpret’ them — though, even here, he doubted whether ‘the sacred books of a Church can ever be understood in their actual meaning.’ Moreover, some religious beliefs do not mean what many take them to mean. Bosanquet argues, for example, that, if we examine the idea of God — who is often described as an ‘infinite individual — we will find that to attribute ‘infinity’ to a being would be inconsistent with “every predicate which we attach to personality.” Finally, Bosanquet held that religious belief in general is not about some supernatural being or transcendent realm, entering into our daily lives. It focuses, rather, on what takes place in the world. His analysis of religion and religious belief is, then, ‘immanentist.’
Bosanquet distinguished religious beliefs about particular persons or events from ‘religion’ (or, what was the same thing for him, ‘religious belief as a whole’ or ‘religious consciousness’). Still, he did not see himself as either an agnostic or atheist, or as reducing ‘religion’ to the ‘ethical.’ While he states that there is much in Christianity that is no longer intelligible, he insists that religion — in the sense of religious consciousness — is needed for morality, and that an ethics cut off from religion is “without sap or life.” Similarly, Bosanquet's opposition to seeing religion or religious belief as a faith in something supernatural does not mean that he denied the existence of the spiritual or held a ‘reductionist’ view of reality. When it comes to human consciousness, he argued, the spiritual — the awareness of the infinite in our world — is at least as much a part of what exists as the material. This ‘infinite’ here is what Bosanquet called the ‘Absolute.’
Human beings are, Bosanquet noted, aware of something infinite that bears directly on their lives, and in his entry on ‘Philosophy of Religion,’ for J.M. Baldwin's Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology (1902), he writes that it is this awareness, and one's commitment to “that set of objects, habits, and convictions, whatever it might prove to be, which [one] would rather die for than abandon, or at least would feel himself excommunicated from humanity if he did abandon” that constitutes what religion is. (While some idealists, such as Pringle-Pattison, seem to have held that such an Absolute is God, Bosanquet did not — though neither does he explicitly reject the existence of God.) Still, religious belief is neither the same as, nor tied essentially to, rituals and practices. Neither does it require adherence or assent to a set of propositions or dogmas — and certainly not to a set of propositions focusing on beings or events in the history of a community of believers. Religious belief is, in short, quite distinct from ‘theism.’
While one finds religious belief and religious consciousness throughout history and throughout the world, Bosanquet rejects the view that all religions are on a par. Religious consciousness has evolved and higher forms of religion — i.e., those which show a unity of the Divine and human nature — are the more ‘true.’ What Bosanquet is ultimately interested in, then, is religion in its highest or most developed form — what Caird called ‘Absolute Religion.’ Though Bosanquet does not develop what, specifically, this means, his Gifford lectures give some hint as to the direction of his thought.
Despite his criticisms of, and challenges to, Christianity, Bosanquet believed that the world had benefitted from Christian civilisation and culture, and that Christianity was a progress over ‘earlier’ stages of religion. Moreover, he not only frequently employs allusions to Christian religious belief and practice to illustrate his general views, but retains elements from Christian doctrine, such as the ideas of the atonement and of justification by faith — though in a highly modified form. The doctrines of the atonement (to which Bosanquet often referred, using the words of Goethe, as ‘dying in order to live’) and of ‘justification by faith’ (which emphasised the presence of religious consciousness in ‘works’) have a practical rather than a theological significance. The former reflected the notion of ‘self-sacrifice,’ involved in the achievement of self-realisation — where one had to ‘die’ to the desires of one's ‘private will’ in order to ‘live’ as a more complete moral agent. And the latter doctrine was a reminder that one's actions could have a moral and spiritual character only so far as they were carried out, out of a set of dominant ideas to which one was committed.
Bosanquet holds that religion is reasonable, and that any rational person would be religious. He insists that religious belief as a whole is not superstition, and that it is true so far as it is an expression of a ‘nisus to totality’ or a ‘move to wholeness.’ Again, since particular religious beliefs purport to be cognitive, they must, at least in principle, be able to be known by believers and non-believers alike. (He is, however, sceptical about the relevance of traditional apologetics.) In both cases, the standard that Bosanquet employs in order to assess truth in religion is the same as that which he uses to assess the truth in general — namely, coherence.
In the recent The God of Metaphysics, the late T.L.S. Sprigge endorses a broadly Bosanquetian account of religion, but raises a number of criticisms of Bosanquet's account — particularly concerning its implications for ethics. Sprigge argues, for example, that by his ‘assimilation’ of evil into the Absolute, Bosanquet not only fails to take evil seriously, but encourages passivity, assuming that evil is either inevitable or will eventually disappear on its own. The claim that Bosanquet's absolute idealism entails such an attitude towards evil seems difficult, however, to square with Bosanquet's concern for public welfare and interest in social reform.
Though Bosanquet's analysis of religious belief reflects an understanding that, broadly speaking, was shared by a number of his fellow idealists, it is significantly different from other late 19th century and early 20th century perspectives, such as those of William Clifford, John Henry Newman, and William James, and can be seen as an alternative to them. Given its immanentist character and insistence on separating religion from dogma and theology, it is close to the view of religion that one finds in recent work by R.B. Braithwaite, R.M. Hare, W. Cantwell Smith, D.Z. Phillips, and Hendrik Hart, and there is some similarity to the contemporary ‘Sea of Faith’ movement, advanced by the Anglican theologian, Don Cupitt. Bosanquet's views, like those of these authors, have been challenged (for example, by C.C.J. Webb, François Houang, and Alan P.F. Sell) for not only being inconsistent with any orthodox theism, but as presenting in its stead a ‘generic religion’ (which, some critics hold, is not religion at all). It is, however, important to recognise that Bosanquet is not advancing a non-cognitivist or fideist view of religion, and that he maintains that both religious beliefs as a whole and particular religious beliefs must meet appropriate ‘rational’ standards.
Bosanquet's writings on art and aesthetics are not as well known as those of the ‘third generation’ idealist, R.G. Collingwood (1889-1943) or of his Italian late contemporary Benedetto Croce (1866-1952). Yet Bosanquet was the author of the first history of aesthetics in English — described by Monroe C. Beardsley as “a pioneering work” which remained the only comprehensive study of aesthetics in English for half a century — and was referred to by the literary scholar and Oxford Professor of Poetry, A.C. Bradley as “the only British philosopher of the first rank who had dealt fully with this branch of philosophy [i.e., aesthetics].”
Bosanquet had a life-long interest in the arts, and his writings are replete with examples and illustrations taken from them. He read widely, particularly in poetry, from the classics to the moderns, and for several years served on the (London) Council of the Home Arts and Industries Association. Among his early works was a translation of The Introduction to Hegel's Philosophy of Fine Art (1886) — to which he wrote an important introduction — and he was the author of several articles on aesthetics, A History of Aesthetic (1892), a series of lectures on aesthetics given to the London Ethical Society (1895-96), and Three Lectures on Aesthetic (1915).
Bosanquet's aesthetics shows a debt to Hegel, to the Romantic poets, to the ‘Arts and Crafts’ movement, and to the philosophy of Hermann Lotze (1817-1881). Bosanquet was particularly inspired by Hegel's views on the function and the development of art, but he was also influenced by the Romantic movement and its disciples (e.g., J.W. Goethe, F.W.J. Schelling, and William Wordsworth — but also S.T. Coleridge, Robert Southey, and William Blake), a movement that, interestingly, Hegel had disparaged. The Romantics’ emphasis on unity, the importance of art as a form of self-expression essential to the development of the self, and the organic conception of nature all have an important place in Bosanquet's work. But other Romantic themes were not adopted so readily. Bosanquet rejected any emphasis of emotion over reason, and he acknowledged the importance of ‘limits’ to art and to artistic activity in general.
For Bosanquet, art is revelatory of the ‘spiritual’ character of the world, and aesthetics — thinking about art — is important because it is a disciplined attempt to understand how artists and artworks contribute to this. Bosanquet's work in aesthetics focused on four principal areas: i) the nature and evolution of aesthetic consciousness, ii) artistic production, iii) aesthetic appreciation — particularly, the experience of beauty, ‘ugliness,’ and the sublime in art, and iv) the role of art in the development of character. Throughout, Bosanquet writes that he is simply following Hegel's lead — though his work is clearly a development rather than a repetition of Hegel's views. Bosanquet's discussion of aesthetic consciousness is to be found in his A History of Aesthetic (and, to an extent, in his introductory essay to The Introduction to Hegel's Philosophy of Fine Art). In A History of Aesthetic, for example, Bosanquet describes the gradual recognition in Europe of art as a synthesis of content and expression. He traces the continuity and ‘interruption’ in the understanding of art and the beautiful, from the classical Greek model (with its idea that ‘art is symbolic’), through the middle ages, to the beginnings of a concrete synthesis in Schiller and Goethe, and then towards a “synthesis of content and expression in that ‘characteristic’ which overmasters the mind and feeling” which he finds in Ruskin's analysis of “the penetrative imagination.” While Hegel had earlier held that there was a development in consciousness over time — which at one point includes aesthetic consciousness, Bosanquet was not committed to the Hegelian claim that aesthetic consciousness developed dialectically.
For Bosanquet, aesthetics is importantly connected to metaphysics; understanding art and the work of the artist requires a broader metaphysical and logical account. (It is this relation between the metaphysical and the aesthetic, developed in Bosanquet's later writings, that led Dorothy Emmet to write that Bosanquet's Three Lectures on Aesthetic was his “most successful book.”) For Bosanquet, aesthetic experience was characteristic of the ‘higher experiences’ we have that give us insight into the full nature of reality, and features of such experiences were features that one also finds in logic and metaphysics.
Bosanquet was also interested in what is — and what is involved in the production of — a work of art, and in what happens when one encounters works of art (i.e., the notion of aesthetic appreciation). Here, too, Bosanquet's treatment of these issues goes beyond Hegel's; it also anticipates elements later found in Collingwood and Croce.
The creation of a work of art, according to Bosanquet, is an expression of spirit or feeling; some see Bosanquet as articulating a nascent expression theory of art. Yet Bosanquet held that there is also a content communicated in a work of art, and so it is ‘representative’ (Three Lectures, p. 43) — not in the sense of copying a natural object, but as embodying the ‘soul’ or essence of an object or a feeling in a new medium. (Here, Bosanquet is clearly influenced by Hegel's view that beauty exists when the Idea is embodied in sensuous form.) While artists have some preconception of the effect they wish to produce in the work of art, they also learn as they engage in the activity itself. A work of art, then, is a product of a process of expression, but this expression must normally be completed in an object in the ‘physical’ world. Nevertheless, Bosanquet insists that a work of art is also something objective — he writes: “Feeling, […] in order to be capable of utterance in determinate form, must take on an objective character” (Value and Destiny of the Individual, p. 43). Bosanquet calls a work of art a “concrete universal”; it possesses an organisation and a unity that shows a relation of interdependence among its parts, and it presents certain general principles in a concrete form. Art is, moreover, ‘social’ and public — so far as both the artist and the spectator are epistemically dependent on the communities in which they live. And art can help not only to understand other aspects of the world, but to reveal something of the ‘spiritual’ character of the world.
In his Three Lectures on Aesthetic, Bosanquet focuses primarily on aesthetic appreciation, analysing the ‘aesthetic attitude’ which, he says, is an activity not of the mind alone, but of the whole person — “body-and-mind.” (This issue of the connexion of body and mind is discussed at length in Lecture V of The Principle of Individuality and Value.) Although Bosanquet is an idealist, he is an objective idealist, and holds that, like perception, aesthetic experience involves the whole person.
On Bosanquet's view, the aesthetic attitude is “contemplative” — it is a “preoccupation with a pleasant feeling, embodied in an object which can be contemplated” (Three Lectures, p. 10). The spectator and the artist alike can have this experience. But the work of art is also something in which the observer finds him or herself ‘expressed.’ Bosanquet writes that when we “imaginatively contemplate” an art object, we are “able […] to live in it as an embodiment of our feeling” (Three Lectures, p. 30); there is no ultimate distinction between ‘art’ and the feelings it evokes in us. Second, the appreciation of a work of art requires understanding it as a whole or as a unity — and so it must be ‘organisational.’ But, third, this organisational character refers not only to elements or features within the art object itself, but to the environment in which the work comes to be. Art (and aesthetic consciousness) have their basis only in a community or a larger whole, and so in this sense they are ‘general.’
Bosanquet's Three Lectures also addressed such questions as the forms of aesthetic satisfaction and the different ‘kinds’ of beauty — beauty being understood as more than what is aesthetically pleasing. It is here that most of the critical attention to his work (e.g., by John Dewey) has been focussed. Bosanquet argues that while beauty is sometimes “easy” — accessible and recognisable by all — the excellence of certain beautiful items may be evident only to those possessing “aesthetic insight.” Because of the “intricacy” or complexity of the components of a work of art, some might consider an aesthetically excellent object to be an ugly one. This, Bosanquet writes, is a mistake. Ugliness is, Bosanquet argues, strictly speaking a failure in expression. Ugliness in art must not be confused with ‘difficult art’ — i.e., art that is beautiful, though many may fail to appreciate it.
Finally, Bosanquet was interested in the role of art in the development of character. In several early essays (from 1886 to 1890), he emphasised how art leads to an expansion of the self — of the artist, in creating the work of art, but also of the spectator, in appreciating the work. (Bosanquet followed William Morris and John Ruskin in holding that this applies as much to ‘artistic handiwork’ as to ‘fine art.’) In the short term, aesthetic appreciation leads to a greater ability to appreciate not only art but life. But Bosanquet also maintains that in the long term — here, agreeing with Hegel — art is a vehicle for the recognition of insights concerning the unity of reality, and for an experience of something greater than ourselves.
While Bosanquet's aesthetics is close to the expression theory associated with Collingwood and Croce, and while there is a continuity between Bosanquet's work and Collingwood's early studies in aesthetics, Bosanquet was a sharp critic of Croce. Bosanquet holds that any adequate aesthetic theory must leave room for externality in art, and so he thinks that any theory that calls into question “the reality of the external world” — which he believes Croce's does — cannot provide an accurate portrayal of the unity of the world. Bosanquet also challenges, for example, the claim that art is prior to the conceptual and the philosophical. He argues that Croce ignores that “the aesthetic attitude is learnt,” and that if language is just expression, not only are logic and conceptual meaning are excluded from it, but we get a metaphysical “singleness” without substance, content, or “definite meaning.” Finally, Bosanquet writes that Croce fails to provide an adequate statement of the relation between the aesthetic, nature, and the metaphysical. By restricting the aesthetic to the realm of art, Croce ignores the role that the beauty of nature has in calling us ‘out of ourselves’ and to the recognition of the real.
Bosanquet's account of the production of the work of art and the nature of aesthetic appreciation is arguably an advance on Hegel, not only in the understanding of art and aesthetic experience as something more than a prelude to Religion, but in re-situating them within the history of the development of consciousness. (Consequently, he denied what he saw to be the Crocean interpretation of Hegel — that, at some point, art (as uniquely expressing certain truths) would cease to have a function, and be superceded by another form of consciousness.) Moreover, Bosanquet's view that art is an expression of emotion — later articulated and developed by Croce and Collingwood — may nevertheless be able to avoid some of the criticisms raised against these later formulations. Recent studies (e.g., by Morigi) have suggested that there are insights within Bosanquet's work that warrant further investigation of idealist aesthetics, and Bosanquet's analyses of aesthetic judgement and aesthetic consciousness may plausibly bear on other fields (e.g., politics) concerning matters related to self consciousness and our relations to other persons.
Bosanquet's social and political philosophy is called ‘idealist’ because of his view that social relations and institutions were not ultimately material phenomena, but best understood as existing at the level of human consciousness. Writing largely in reaction to the utilitarianism of Bentham and Mill and to the natural-rights based theory of Herbert Spencer, Bosanquet's views show both a strong influence of Hegel and an important debt to Kant and to the classical Greek thought of Plato and Aristotle. Indeed, Bosanquet often spoke of his political theory as reflecting principles found in ‘classical philosophy,’ and one of his early works was a commentary on Plato's Republic. Nevertheless, his political thought lies clearly within the tradition of liberalism.
The main source for Bosanquet's social and political philosophy is The Philosophical Theory of the State (1899; 4th ed., 1923), though many of his ideas are developed in dozens of articles and essays which he wrote for professional academic journals, for publications of the Charity Organisation Society and for the popular press. Like many of his fellow idealists (notably T.H. Green, D.G. Ritchie, William Wallace, John Watson and, to a lesser degree, F.H. Bradley). Bosanquet's principal concern was to explain the basis of political authority and the state, the place of the citizen in society, and the nature, source and limits of human rights. The political theory that he develops is importantly related to his metaphysics and logic — particularly to such notions as the individual, the general will, ‘the best life’, society, and the state. In order to provide a coherent account of such issues, Bosanquet argued, one must abandon some of the assumptions of the liberal tradition — particularly those that reveal a commitment to ‘individualism’.
Bosanquet saw authority and the state neither as based on individual consent or a social contract, nor as simply institutions where there is a general recognition of a sovereign, but as products of the natural development of human life, and as expressions of what he called the ‘real’ or general will. On Bosanquet's view, the will of the individual is “a mental system” whose parts — “ideas or groups of ideas” — are “connected in various degrees, and more or less subordinated to some dominant ideas which, as a rule, dictate the place and importance of the others” (i.e., of the other ideas that one has). Thus, Bosanquet writes that, “[i]n order to obtain a full statement of what we will, what we want at any moment must at least be corrected and amended by what we want at all other moments.” But the process does not stop there. He continues: “this cannot be done without also correcting and amending it so as to harmonise it with what others want, which involves an application of the same process to them.” In other words, if we wish to arrive at an accurate statement of what our will is, we must be concerned not only with what we wish at some particular moment, but also with all of the other wants, purposes, associations and feelings that we and others have (or might have) given all of the knowledge available. The result is one's ‘real’ or the ‘general will’.
Bosanquet sees a relation between the ‘real’ or ‘general will’ and the ‘common good.’ He writes that “The General Will seems to be, in the last resort, the ineradicable impulse of an intelligent being to a good extending beyond itself.” This ‘good’ is nothing other than “the existence and the perfection of human personality” which he identifies with “the excellence of souls” and the complete realisation of the individual. It is so far as the state reflects the general will and this common good that its authority is legitimate and its action morally justifiable. Bosanquet describes the function of the state, then, as ‘the hindrance of hindrances’ to human development.
The influence of Rousseau and Hegel is clearly evident here. Indeed, Bosanquet saw in Hegel's Philosophy of Right a plausible account of the modern state as an ‘organism’ or whole united around a shared understanding of the good. Moreover, like Hegel, he argued that the state, like all other social ‘institutions,’ was best understood as an ethical idea and as existing at the level of consciousness rather than just material reality. Within nation states, Bosanquet held that the authority of the state is absolute, because social life requires a consistent co-ordination of the activities of individuals and institutions.
Still, although Bosanquet believed that the state was absolute, he did not exclude the possibility of an organized system of international law. The conditions for an effective recognition and enforcement of such a system were, he thought, absent at that moment — though he held out hope that the League of Nations reflected the beginnings of the consciousness of a genuine human community and that it might provide a mechanism by which multinational action could be accomplished.
Because the state can be said to reflect the general will that is also each individual's real will, Bosanquet held (following Rousseau) that sometimes individuals can be required to engage in certain activities for their own good — that is they can be ‘forced to be free.’ Moreover, he maintained that it is in terms of the ‘common good’ that one's ‘station’ or ‘function’ in society is defined, and it is the conscientious carrying out of the duties that are attached to one's ‘station’ that constitutes ethical behaviour. In fact, on Bosanquet's account, it is primarily in light of one's service in the state that a person has the basis for speaking of his or her particular identity. Not surprisingly, then, Bosanquet was frequently challenged by those who claimed that he was anti-democratic and that his philosophical views led to a devaluation of the individual. Such attacks ignore, however, Bosanquet's insistence on liberty as the essence and quality of the human person and his emphasis on the moral development of the human individual and on limiting the state from directly promoting morality (which reflects both his own reading of Kant and the influence of Green's Kantianism.) Moreover, while Bosanquet did not hold that there were any a priori restrictions on state action, he held that there were a number of practical conditions that did limit it. For example, while law was seen as necessary to the promotion of the common good, it could not make a person good, and social progress could often be better achieved by volunteer action. (It is just this emphasis that Bosanquet found and defended in the approach to social work of the Charity Organisation Society.)
Although the state and law employ compulsion and restraint, they were considered to be ‘positive’ in that they provided the material conditions for liberty, the functioning of social institutions, and the development of individual moral character. For Bosanquet, then, there was no incompatibility between liberty and the law. Moreover, since individuals are necessarily social beings, their rights were neither absolute and inalienable, but reflected the ‘function’ or ‘positions’ they held in the community. For such rights to have not only moral but legal weight, Bosanquet insisted that they had to be ‘recognized’ by the state in law. Strictly speaking, then, there could be no rights against the state. Nevertheless, Bosanquet acknowledged that, where social institutions were fundamentally corrupt, even though there was no right to rebellion, there could be a duty to resist.
Although Bosanquet is sometimes regarded as a conservative, recent studies have pointed out that he was an active Liberal and, in the 1910s, supported the Labour Party. He insisted on the positive role that the state can have in the promotion of social well being and he was in favour of worker ownership. It is also worth noting that Bosanquet's audience was as much the professional in social work or the politician, as the philosopher. He was well-informed of the political situation in Britain, on the continent, and in the United States. His interests extended to economics and social welfare, and his work in adult education and social work provides a strong empirical dimension to his work. This background provided him with a broad base from which to reply to challenges from many of his critics — e.g., from philosophers, like Mill and Spencer, and from social reformers, such as Sidney and Beatrice Webb and, the founder of the Salvation Army, General William Booth. Despite charges that Bosanquet's political philosophy is simplistic, inconsistent, or naive, Adam Ulam notes that The Philosophical Theory of the State “has a comprehensiveness and an awareness of conflicting political and philosophical opinions which give it a supreme importance in modern political thought. Bosanquet is both a political theorist and a political analyst.”
It has sometimes been suggested that the influences of Kant and Hegel lead to a tension in Bosanquet's political thought. Bosanquet's emphasis on the moral development of the human individual and on limiting the state from directly promoting morality clearly reflects both his own reading of Kant and the Kantian influences on Green. Moreover, Bosanquet believed that the ‘best life’ that he describes as the ‘end’ of the individual and of the state alike, approximates what Kant referred to as ‘the kingdom of ends’. Even Bosanquet's justification of the authority of the state can be seen as a reflection of a Kantian imperative that one wills the state as a necessary means to the moral end.
Soon after his move to London, in 1881, Bosanquet joined his half-brother Charles and his friend and former classmate C.S. Loch in their work with the Charity Organisation Society (COS). This led to a lifelong association with the COS — one with which Bosanquet was indelibly connected. He was a Member of Council of the COS from 1898 until his death, serving as Vice Chairman (1901-1915) and as Chairman (1916-1917). He also served on Administration and District Committees of the COS and was involved in the operation (and, from 1908-1912, served as Chairman of the Executive Council) of the COS-sponsored training School of Sociology and Social Economics from 1903 until its incorporation into the London School of Economics in 1912.
For Bosanquet, social work needed to be connected with education and, by extension, educational reform. Through his cousin Mary McCallum, Bosanquet learned about the Home Arts and Industries Association and its role in practical education and, starting in 1891, he frequently lectured and taught university extension courses for the London Ethical Society (LES) — initially under auspices of the University Extension Scheme at Essex Hall — and its successor, the short-lived London School of Ethics and Social Philosophy (1897-1900). Many of his publications, including The Essentials of Logic, A Companion to Plato's Republic for English Readers, Psychology of the Moral Self, and The Philosophical Theory of the State, were based on or were prepared as texts for these courses.
Bosanquet's lectures and essays on social topics deal not only with general concerns on the role of social institutions and the state in promoting the good life, but on specific questions dealing with social reform. Many of these essays were published in the Charity Organisation Review, but several were of a broad interest and appeared in leading philosophical and sociological journals and books. In Essays and Addresses (1889), Bosanquet advances an “ideal of modern life” which he calls “Christian Hellenism.” There, in “The Kingdom of God on Earth,” he gives an analysis of the human individual and the community that was taken up later in his political philosophy.
Particularly because of his COS work, Bosanquet was familiar with the empirical data on what was called ‘the social problem,’ and he made extensive concrete proposals for social reform; one finds examples of this in “In Darkest England” On the Wrong Track (1891), his discussion and critique of Salvation Army General William Booth's programme for the alleviation of pauperism, and in Aspects of the Social Problem (1895), a collection of essays which he edited and to which he contributed six of the 18 chapters. Bosanquet believed, however, that the key to social progress is the development of individual character. It is this focus on ‘character’ rather than ‘social conditions’ that brought his views into conflict with a number of reformers, including the Fabian social radicals, Sidney and Beatrice Webb. In particular, it led to the accusation that Bosanquet's views were too individualistic and out of touch with the root of the problem of poverty. This disagreement came to a head during the sessions of the Royal Commission on the Poor Laws on which both Helen Bosanquet and Beatrice Webb served. Some commentators have noted that, when one examines their specific suggestions on practical policy, the differences between the Bosanquets and their opponents are more often over strategy than principle.
For Bosanquet, education is not simply the acquisition of knowledge, but of values; his involvement in adult education was inspired both by his interest in bringing advanced formal education to a larger population that had a more extensive life experience than the typical undergraduate, but also by his views on art in the development of character. While an adequate education requires having some understanding of general principles, it also involves moral and aesthetic values. In his early writings, but also in his later work, Bosanquet's is particularly concerned with how such values can be inculcated.
In his two early essays on “Artistic Handiwork in Education” (1887), Bosanquet argues for some form of handicraft work being introduced into elementary and secondary education. This, Bosanquet writes, can contribute to the awakening, the enjoyment, and the appreciation of beauty in nature and in art. Handicraft that has a distinctively artistic character requires not only exertion through the exercise of active apprehension, but also “seeing deeply” into nature. Moreover, the study of works of art provides a key to understanding both the culture and character of other nations but also universal human values.
Similar views on education can be discerned in Bosanquet‘s The Education of the Young in ‘The Republic’ of Plato (1900), in his remarks on “How Could the Ethical Efficiency of Education be Increased?” (1908), and in essays in Some Suggestions in Ethics (1918). In Some Suggestions in Ethics, for example, Bosanquet distinguishes between ignorance’ and ‘stupidity’. Ignorance is the intellectual state of not knowing facts. But, more problematic for Bosanquet, is stupidity — the “inability to see” or the blindness to values — for it either distorts, or reflects a distortion of, one's “ideas concerning facts, objects and truths.” For Bosanquet, then, education should be primarily directed at improving character; it is the remedy for “awakening interests and proportioning them to values” (op. cit., p. 237). This, however, requires educational reform in schools — concerning the atmosphere or ‘tone’ of the school, the personality of the teachers, and the organisation of work and play. Through the social activities involved in participation — particularly of the young — in the arts or in artistic training, Bosanquet believed that society can facilitate both the appreciation of beauty and the recognition of moral excellence.
Interest in Bosanquet's work — as with idealism as a whole — waned during the middle decades of the 20th century. Of the idealists, the writings of Bradley and, in political theory, Green, are now much better known. There is no simple explanation of this; many factors seem relevant.
First, some of the work that made Bosanquet's reputation in his time — his popular essays, the books and articles that came out of his university extension courses, and his involvement in social policy — now seems largely dated. For example, several of his essays lack the logical rigor that one finds in material destined for the more specialized audience of academic philosophers. While insightful and wide ranging — and while accessible to a much wider audience than the work of other idealists, such as Bradley and J.M.E. McTaggart — Bosanquet's writings lack the sharpness, the density, and, at times, the outrageousness of those of some of his contemporaries.
It has been suggested, as well, that some of the concepts central to Bosanquet's work are not clearly defined, and Bosanquet himself was an indifferent literary stylist. His work often betrays a looseness that one tends to find in texts based on lectures prepared for general audiences or for classes, and even his early work on logic was remarked upon for its “stiffness.” But these primarily stylistic concerns may also be a product of refusing to sever the analysis of concepts from the experience which Bosanquet was trying to describe.
There are other reasons that no doubt contributed to the decline of interest in Bosanquet's work. Aside from the general collapse of idealism as a philosophical movement — by the early part of the 20th century, it was seen by many as a philosophical dead- end — and the suspicion of what was regarded by later generations as its obscure vocabulary, Bosanquet's association with the majority report of the Poor Law Reform Commission and his alleged championing of the nation state, led many to see him as a conservative if not reactionary thinker whose contributions to philosophy and politics were outdated almost as soon as they had been published.
In recent years, however, there has been a renewed interest in Bosanquet's work — particularly concerning his philosophical and social thought, which is experiencing a revival in the work of some contemporary liberal theorists. Given the number of studies published during the past twenty years on Hegel, Green and, more recently, Bradley, and given the reevaluation of the significance of the work of British idealism and its place in the history of philosophy, it seems likely that there will be a reconsideration of the contribution of Bosanquet's philosophy as well.
The most comprehensive list to date of Bosanquet's work is found in Vol. 1 of Essays in Philosophy and Social Policy, 1883-1922, (ed. William Sweet), Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 2003, pp. xxxix-lxv.
The 20 volume Collected Works of Bernard Bosanquet (edited by William Sweet) appeared in 1999 from Thoemmes Press (Bristol, U.K.). In addition to reprints of the standard editions of Bosanquet's principal works, the Collected Works contains two volumes of previously uncollected essays, with notes and Introductions. The Collected Works includes the following texts:
- Knowledge and Reality, A Criticism of Mr. F. H. Bradley's ‘Principles of Logic’. London: Kegan Paul, Trench, 1885.
- Logic, or the Morphology of Knowledge. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1888. 2d ed., 1911.
- Essays and Addresses. London, Swan Sonnenschein, 1889.
- A History of Aesthetic, London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1892. 2d ed., 1904.
- The Civilization of Christendom and Other Studies. London: Swan Sonnenschein, 1893.
- The Essentials of Logic: Being Ten Lectures on Judgement and Inference. London and New York: Macmillan, 1895.
- Aspects of the Social Problem, London, 1895.
- A Companion to Plato's Republic for English Readers: Being a Commentary adapted to Davies and Vaughan's Translation. New York/London, 1895.
- The Philosophical Theory of the State, London, 1899; 4th ed., 1923.
- Psychology of the Moral Self, London and New York: Macmillan, 1897.
- The Principle of Individuality and Value. The Gifford Lectures for 1911 delivered in Edinburgh University. London: Macmillan, 1912.
- The Value and Destiny of the Individual. The Gifford Lectures for 1912 delivered in Edinburgh University. London: Macmillan, 1913.
- The Distinction Between Mind and its Objects. The Adamson Lecture for 1913 with an Appendix. Manchester: University Press, 1913
- Three Lectures on Aesthetic, London: Macmillan, 1915.
- Social and International Ideals: Being Studies in Patriotism, London: Macmillan, 1917.
- Some Suggestions in Ethics, London: Macmillan, 1918; 2nd ed. 1919.
- Implication and Linear Inference, London: Macmillan, 1920.
- What Religion Is, London: Macmillan, 1920.
- The Meeting of Extremes in Contemporary Philosophy. London: Macmillan, 1921.
- Three Chapters on the Nature of Mind, London: Macmillan, 1923.
- Science and Philosophy and Other Essays by the Late Bernard Bosanquet, (ed. J.H. Muirhead and R.C. Bosanquet), London, Allen and Unwin, 1927.
Two recent editions of Bosanquet's work are
- The Philosophical Theory of the State and Related Essays by Bernard Bosanquet, (ed. with Introductions, notes, and annotations by William Sweet and Gerald F. Gaus), Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press/South Bend, IN: St Augustine's Press [distributed by University of Chicago Press], 2001.
- Essays in Philosophy and Social Policy, 1883-1922, (ed. William Sweet), 3 volumes, Bristol, UK: Thoemmes Press, 2003.
Several of Bosanquet's undergraduate essays appear in
- Unpublished Manuscripts in British Idealism; Political Philosophy, Theology and Social Thought. (ed. Colin Tyler), 2 vols. Bristol: Thoemmes Press, 2005
- Acton, H.B. “Bernard Bosanquet,” The Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Ed. Paul Edwards, New York, 1967, Vol. 1, pp. 347-350.
- Acton, H.B. “The Theory of Concrete Universals,” Mind, n.s. XLV (1936): 417-31; n.s. XLVI (1937): 1-13.
- Armour, Leslie. “The Dialectics of Rationality: Bosanquet, Newman and the Concept of Assent,” in Rationality Today, Ottawa, ON: University of Ottawa Press, 1979, pp. 491-497.
- Armour, Leslie, “Moral and Economic Socialism; Bosanquet, the Economy, and ‘the Citizen Mind’,” Bradley Studies, 6 (2000): 18-45.
- Beardsley, Munroe C. Aesthetics from Classical Greece to the Present, New York: Macmillan, 1966
- Bedau, Hugo Adam. “Retribution and the Theory of Punishment,” Journal of Philosophy 75 (1978): 601-620.
- Bosanquet, Helen. Bernard Bosanquet: A Short Account of his Life . London, 1924.
- Boucher, David and Andrew Vincent, British Idealism and Political Theory, Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2001.
- Bradley, James. “Hegel in Britain: A Brief History of British Commentary and Attitudes,” The Heythrop Journal, Vol. 20, (1979): 1-24; 163-182.
- Broad, C.D. “The Notion of a General Will,” Mind, n.s. XXVIII, (1919): 502-504.
- Broad, C.D. “Critical Notice of Implication and Linear Inference,” Mind, n.s. 29 (1920): 323-338.
- Bussey, Gertrude Carman. “Dr. Bosanquet's Doctrine of Freedom,” Philosophical Review, XXV (1916): 711-719 and 728-730.
- Carr, H. Wildon, “Mr Bosanquet on Croce's Aesthetic” Mind, n.s. 29 (1920): 207-211.
- Carritt, E.F. Morals and Politics: Theories of their Relation from Hobbes and Spinoza to Marx and Bosanquet. Oxford, 1935.
- Carter, Matt, “Ball, Bosanquet and the Legacy of T.H. Green,” History of Political Thought, 20 (1999): 674-694.
- Cole, G.D.H. “Loyalties,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, n.s. XXVI (1925-1926): 151-170.
- Collini, S. “Hobhouse, Bosanquet and the State: Philosophical Idealism and Political Argument in England: 1880-1918,” Past and Present, 72 (1976): 86-111.
- Collini, S. “Sociology and Idealism in Britain: 1880-1920,” Archives europeennes de sociologie, 19 (1978): 3-50.
- Connelly, James. “Sweet, Bosanquet and ‘the Hindrance of Hindrances,’” Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, 9 (2002): 112-122.
- Crane, Marion Delia. “Dr. Bosanquet's Doctrine of Freedom,” Philosophical Review, XXV (1916): 719-728.
- Crane, Marion Delia. “The Method in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet,” Philosophical Review, XXIX (1920): 437-452.
- Crane (Carroll), Marion. The Principles of Absolutism in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet. New York. Ph.D. thesis in philosophy, Cornell University, 1921. (Reprinted in “The Principle of Individuality in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet,” Philosophical Review, XXX (1921): 1-23 and “The Nature of the Absolute in the Metaphysics of Bernard Bosanquet,” Philosophical Review, XXX (1921): 178- 191.)
- Crossley, David, “The Unified Theory of Punishment of Green and Bosanquet,” Bradley Studies, 10 (2004): 1-14.
- Cunningham, G. Watts. “Bosanquet on Philosophic Method,” Philosophical Review, XXXV (1926): 315-327.
- Cunningham, G. Watts. “Bosanquet on Teleology as a Metaphysical Category,” Philosophical Review, XXXII (1923): 612-624.
- Cunningham, G. Watts. The Idealist Argument in Recent British and American Philosophy. New York, 1933.
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- Milne, A.J.M. The Social Philosophy of English Idealism. London, 1962.
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