#### Supplement to Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer

## Weak Counterexamples

Here are four weak counterexamples.

Consider a still open problem in mathematics, such as Goldbach's conjecture (the conjecture that every even number equal to or greater than 4 is the sum of two prime numbers).

Being a still open problem, Goldbach's conjecture is by itself a weak counterexample to PEM: we have at present experienced neither its truth nor its falsity, so intuitionistically speaking, it is at present neither true nor false, and hence we cannot at present assert “Goldbach's conjecture is true, or it is false”.

As an illustration of the technique that Brouwer used to generate
weak counterexamples to other classically valid statements, we show
three more weak counterexamples, adapted from the first Vienna lecture
(Brouwer, 1929). They are based on a sequence of rational numbers
a(*n*), defined in terms of Goldbach's conjecture, as
follows:

a(n) ={ -(½) ^{n}if for allj≤n, 2j+4 is the sum of two primes

-(½)^{k}if for somek≤ n, 2k+4 is not the sum of two primes

The sequence of the *a*(*n*) satisfies the Cauchy
condition (the condition that for every rational number ε >
0 there is a natural number N such that |*a*(*j*)
− *a*(*k*)| < ε for all
*j*,*k*>N), as for every *n*, any two members
of the sequence after *a*(*n*) lie within
(½)^{n} of each other. Therefore the sequence
converges and determines a real number α.

From the way α is constructed, it is clear that we can assert
that α=0 only when we know that the first clause of the
definition of *a*(*n*) always applies, in other words, only
when we have proved Goldbach's conjecture; and we can assert that
α ≠ 0 only when we know that for some *n* the second
clause applies, in other words, when we have found a counterexample to
the conjecture. So far, we have neither. This leads to the following
three weak counterexamples:

- We cannot now assert
∀
*x*∈ℝ (*x*= 0 ∨*x*≠ 0), because we cannot, intuitionistically, assert α = 0 ∨ α ≠ 0 until we have a proof of one of the disjuncts. - Similarly, we cannot now assert
∀
*x*∈ℝ (*x*< 0 ∨*x*= 0 ∨*x*> 0). - We cannot now assert
∀
*x*∈ℝ (*x*∈**Q**∨*x*∉**Q**), for to assert that α∈**Q**we have to know*m*,*n*∈**Z**such that α =*m*/*n*, but we can't as long as we do not know the value of α. (By construction, α cannot be irrational.)

Should Goldbach's conjecture one day be proved or disproved, the definition of α can easily be modified by appealing to a remaining open problem; Brouwer's first Vienna lecture shows a general way to do this.