Legalism in Chinese Philosophy

First published Wed Dec 10, 2014

Legalism is a popular—albeit quite inaccurate—designation of an intellectual current that gained considerable popularity in the latter half of the Warring States period (Zhanguo, 453–221 BCE). Legalists were political realists who sought to attain a “rich state with powerful army” and to ensure domestic stability in an age marked by intense inter- and intra-state competition. They believed that human beings—commoners and elites alike—will forever remain selfish and covetous of riches and fame, and one should not expect them to behave morally. Rather, a viable sociopolitical system should allow individuals to pursue their selfish interests exclusively in ways that benefit the state, viz. agriculture and warfare; while a proper administrative system should allow officials to benefit from ranks and emoluments, but also prevent them from subverting the ruler’s power. Both systems are unconcerned with individual morality of the rulers and the ruled; rather they should be based on impersonal norms and standards: laws, administrative regulations, clearly defined rules of promotion and demotion, and the like.

Legalist thinkers contributed greatly to the formation of China’s empire both on the theoretical level and as political practitioners; and many of their ideas continued to be employed throughout China’s history. Yet their derisive views of moralizing discourse of their rivals, their haughty stance toward fellow intellectuals, and their pronouncedly anti-ministerial rhetoric all gained them immense dislike among the imperial literati. From China’s second imperial dynasty, the Han (206 BCE–220 CE) on, the prestige of Legalism declined; only a few texts associated with this current survived intact; and even in the modern period, notwithstanding sporadic outbursts of interest in Legalism, this current has not received adequate scholarly attention.

1. Defining Legalism

The term “Legalist school” (fa jia 法家) is ubiquitous in studies of early Chinese political philosophy. Despite manifold criticisms of its inaccuracy (e.g., Goldin 2011), the term may still be usefully employed, as long as two major points are taken into account. First, Legalists were not a self-aware and organized intellectual current; rather the name was coined as a post-factum categorization of certain thinkers and texts, and its primary function before the twentieth century was that of a bibliographical category in imperial libraries. Therefore, the identification of any thinker or text as “Legalist” will forever remain arbitrary; the term may be used as a heuristic convention but should not be employed (pace Creel 1974) as an analytical device. Second, “Legalism” is a problematic name. The Chinese term fa jia is already misleading, because it inadvertently reduces the rich intellectual content of this current to a single keyword, fa. “Legalism” is a doubly misleading English translation, because the semantic field of the term fa 法 is much broader than “law”; it refers also to methods, standards, impersonal regulations and the like (Creel 1974: 147–149; Goldin 2011). It is incongruent, then, to discuss the fa jia within the context of the Occidental notion of “the rule of law,” as was popular in early modern Chinese scholarship (e.g., Hsiao 1979: 442–446) and as is sometimes done even nowadays (Fu Zhengyuan 1996: 158–161). If these intrinsic inaccuracies of the term “Legalism” are borne in mind, it can be employed—as in what follows—merely for heuristic convenience. The term is simply so widespread in scholarly literature that replacing it with a new designation will just further confuse the readers.

While the term “Legalism” was coined only during the Han 漢dynasty (206 BCE-220 CE), its roots—or more precisely the idea of grouping together several thinkers who will be eventually dubbed “Legalists”—can be traced already to Han Fei 韓非 (d. 233 BCE), who is often considered the most significant representative of this intellectual current. In chapter 43, “Defining the Standards” (“Ding fa” 定法) of Han Feizi 韓非子, the thinker presents himself as a synthesizer and improver of the ideas of two of his predecessors, Shang Yang 商鞅 (d. 338 BCE) and Shen Buhai 申不害 (d. 337 BCE) (Han Feizi 43: 397–400). Pairing Shen Buhai and Shang Yang, and adding Han Fei himself to them became common from the early Han dynasty (see, e.g. Huainanzi 6: 230; 11:423; 20: 833). The historian Sima Qian 司馬遷 (ca. 145–90 BCE) identified these three thinkers as adherents of the teaching of “performance and title” (xing ming 刑名) (Shiji 62: 2146; 68: 2227; translation borrowed from Goldin 2013: 8). This term was synonymous to the later fa jia (Creel 1974: 140).

The first to use the term fa jia was Sima Qian’s father, Sima Tan 司馬談 (d. 110 BCE). In an essay on the “essence of the six schools of thought,” Sima Tan notices that fa jia are “strict and have little kindness,” and “do not distinguish between kin and stranger, nor differentiate between noble and base: everything is determined by the standard (or law, fa).” Sima Tan criticized the Legalists’ approach as “a one-time policy that could not be constantly applied,” but also hailed the fa jia for “honoring rulers and derogating subjects, and clearly distinguishing offices so that no one can overstep [his responsibilities]” (Shiji 130: 3289–3291; for translations cf. Smith 2003: 141; Goldin 2011: 89). A century later the bibliographical category of fa jia was created. The Han librarian Liu Xiang 劉向 (77–6 BCE) identified ten texts in the Han imperial library as belonging to fa jia (Han shu 30: 1735). Thenceforth “Legalist school” remained a major category of imperial book catalogues. Since the early 20th century this term has come to be widely used for classification and analysis of early Chinese thought.

1.1 Major Legalist Texts

Of the ten “Legalist” texts in the Han imperial catalogue, six ceased circulating more than a millennium ago; two arrived at our days relatively intact, and of two others only a few fragments survived vicissitudes of time. The earliest (in terms of its composition) surviving text is the Book of Lord Shang (Shang jun shu 商君書), attributed to Shang Yang (aka Gongsun Yang 公孫鞅 or Lord Shang 商君), a major reformer who orchestrated the rise of the state of Qin 秦 to the position of a leading power of the Chinese world. In the process of transmission, the book lost at least three chapters; a few others had been badly damaged, becoming barely legible. Since the late 18th century efforts have been made to prepare a critical edition of the text and amend its corrupted parts; yet more than two centuries passed before the comprehensive critical edition was published (Zhang Jue 2012). The text is highly heterogeneous in terms of its composition: some chapters were almost certainly penned by Shang Yang himself; others may come from the hand of his immediate disciples and followers, but a few other were written decades and even more than a century after his death. This said, the text presents a relatively coherent ideological vision, and it is likely that it reflects intellectual evolution of what Zheng Liangshu (1989) dubbed Shang Yang’s “intellectual current” (xuepai 學派).

The second surviving text, Han Feizi 韓非子, is attributed to Han Fei, a scion of the ruling family from the state of Hán 韓 (not to be confused with the Hàn 漢 dynasty), a tragic figure who was allegedly killed in the custody of the King of Qin, whom Han Fei wanted to serve. Of all Legalist texts in the Han imperial catalogue, the Han Feizi fared the best over the vicissitudes of time: all of its 55 chapters attested in the Han catalog are still intact. The issue of whether or not the entire book had been penned by Han Fei is debatable: considerable differences among the chapters in terms of style and mode of argumentation lead not a few scholars to suspect that they come from different authors. On the other hand, the differences may be explained as reflecting the process of Han Fei’s intellectual maturation, or the need to adapt argumentation to different audiences; and since most of the chapters present a coherent outlook, it increases the likelihood that most of them were indeed written by Han Fei (Goldin 2013). Overall, the Han Feizi is considered as philosophically and literally more engaging than the Book of Lord Shang, and it has been more widely studied in China, Japan, and in the West.

Two other Legalist texts mentioned in the Han imperial catalog did not survive intact, but lengthy quotations from them in the imperial encyclopedia have allowed partial reconstruction of their content. Shēnzi 申子 is attributed to Shen Buhai, who acted as a chancellor of the state of Hán 韓 in the middle fourth century BCE, and who is credited with major administrative improvement there. Of the original six chapters fewer than three dozen fragments remain intact (Creel 1974). Another text, Shènzi 慎子 is attributed to Shen Dao 慎到 (fl. ca. 300 BCE), of whom very little is known (it is even possible that the figure of Shen Dao a is conflation of several personalities; see Xu Fuhong 2013: 2–8). Of original 42 chapters, seven survived (albeit in an incomplete form) in a seventh-century CE encyclopedy; altogether over 120 surviving fragments of the text are considered authentic (Thompson 1979; cf. Xu Fuhong 2013). In what follows, to avoid confusion between Shēnzi and Shènzi, they will be referred to as works of Shen Buhai and Shen Dao respectively.

The above four texts are the major repository of Legalist ideology. Several other texts appear to be closely related to these in terms of ideological outlook and vocabulary: of particular importance for discussing Legalism are several chapters of a heterogeneous miscellany, Guanzi 管子, which is nominally attributed to another major reformer, Guan Zhong 管仲 (d. 645 BCE) from the state of Qi 齊, but which was in reality produced between the fourth and the second centuries BCE. Of further relevance for understanding Legalist thought are a few segments of another multi-authored compilation, the Lüshi chunqiu 呂氏春秋 (ca. 240 BCE), and memorials of the man who is considered the architect of the Qin 秦 Empire (221–207 BCE), Li Si 李斯 (d. 208 BCE) (for Li Si, see Bodde 1938). In addition, many more texts and thinkers are at times identified by scholars as “Legalist”; but since most of these identifications are quite arbitrary they will not be considered in the framework of the current discussion.[1]

1.2 Historical Context

Legalism is just one of the many intellectual currents that flourished in China during the three centuries prior to the imperial unification of 221 BCE. This period, often identified as the age of the “Hundred Schools” was exceptionally rich in terms of political thought. The outburst of interest in political issues was not accidental: it took place against the backdrop of a severe systemic crisis. The end of the Springs-and-Autumns period (Chunqiu 春秋, 770–453 BCE) was marked by the progressive disintegration of political structures in the Zhou 周 realm (the then Chinese world). Gradually, the Zhou world became entangled in a web of debilitating struggles among rival polities, between powerful nobles and the lords within each polity, as well as among aristocratic lineages and among rival branches within major lineages. By the fourth century BCE, a degree of re-centralization in individual polities was achieved, but interstate warfare further intensified, giving, in retrospect, the new era an ominous name: the age of the Warring States (Zhanguo 戰國, 453–221 BCE). As wars became ever bloodier and more devastating, and with no adequate diplomatic means to settle the conflicts in sight, most thinkers and statesmen came to an understanding that unity of “All-under-Heaven” (tianxia 天下) was the only means to attain peace and stability (Pines 2000). How to bring this unity about and how to “stabilize All-under-Heaven” became the central topic addressed by competing thinkers. In the final account, the Legalists’ ability to provide the most compelling answers to this question became the singular source of their ideological appeal.

Crises and bloodshed aside, the Warring States period was also an age rife with opportunities for intellectually active individuals. It was an exceptionally dynamic period, marked by novel departures and profound changes in all walks of life. Politically, the loose aristocratic entities of the Springs-and-Autumns period were replaced by centralized and bureaucratized territorial states (Lewis 1999). Economically, the introduction of iron utensils (Wagner 1993) revolutionized agriculture, allowing higher yields, prompting the development of wastelands, and bringing about demographic growth, as well as accelerating urbanization and commercialization of the economy. Militarily, new technologies, such as the crossbow, as well as new forms of military organization, brought about the replacement of aristocratic chariot-led armies by mass infantry armies staffed by peasant conscripts, resulting in a radical increase in warfare’s scale and complexity (Lewis 1999). And socially, the hereditary aristocracy that dominated the Zhou world during much of the Bronze Age (ca. 1500–400 BCE) was eclipsed by a much broader stratum of shi 士 (sometimes translated as “men of service”), who owed their position primarily to their abilities rather than their pedigree (Pines 2013c). These profound changes required new approaches to a variety of administrative, economic, military, social, and ethical issues: old truths had to be reconsidered or reinterpreted. For intellectuals eager to tackle a variety of new questions—and particularly for the Legalists—this was a golden age.

Each of the competing “schools of thought” sought ways to improve the functioning of the state, to attain sociopolitical stability, and to bring about peace under Heaven; yet among a variety of answers those provided by the Legalists appear to be most practical. This is not incidental: after all, some of the major Legalist thinkers, most notably Shang Yang, were the leading reformers of their age. Legalist thinkers were at the forefront of administrative and sociopolitical innovation; they were the most ready to dispense with bygone norms and paradigms; and they were more pragmatic and result-oriented than most of their ideological rivals. On the other hand, their dismissive attitude toward traditional culture and toward moralizing discourse, as well as their highly critical stance toward other members of educated elite, and their pronounced anti-ministerial approach, earned them considerable enmity. In the long term, Sima Tan’s observation seems correct: the Legalists’ recipes were highly effective in the short run but were much less attractive in the long term.

2. Philosophical Foundations

Legalism is at times compared with modern social sciences (Schwartz 1985), and this comparison grasps well some of its characteristics. Angus C. Graham (1989: 269) notices that Legalists are the first political philosophers in China “to start not from how society ought to be but how it is.” Indeed, this was the most practical-oriented of all preimperial intellectual currents. Its proclaimed goal was to create “rich state and powerful army” (fu guo qiang bing 富國強兵),[2] which would be the precondition for future unification of the entire subcelestial realm. The thinkers’ focus was on how to attain this goal, and less on philosophical speculations. Consequently, their writings are generally devoid of overarching moral considerations, or conformity to divine will—topoi which recur in the writings of the followers of Confucius 孔子 (551–479 BCE) and Mozi 墨子 (ca. 460–390 BCE). Cosmological stipulations of political order, which became hugely popular after the Laozi 老子 (fourth century BCE) are of slightly higher importance for the Legalists than morality or religion: they are referred to in some of Shen Buhai and Shen Dao’s fragments and, more notably, in several chapters of the Han Feizi. Yet these speculations are not essential for these thinkers’ arguments: hence, pace attempts to consider cosmological digressions of Han Fei as foundations of his political philosophy (Wang and Chang 1986), it would be more accurate to see them as argumentative devices that were “not fully assimilated” into Han Fei’s thought (Graham 1991: 285; cf. Goldin 2013: 14–18).[3] Generally, Legalist thinkers display considerable philosophical sophistication only when they need to justify their departures from conventional approaches of other intellectual currents. In this regard their views of historical evolution and of human nature are highly engaging.

2.1 Evolutionary view of History

The Warring States period was an age of comprehensive sociopolitical change, and thinkers of different intellectual affiliations had to come to terms with this change. The majority tried to accommodate it within the framework of the “changing with the times” paradigm (Kern 2000: 170–174): namely, certain innovations and modifications of existent policies are inevitable, but these do not require a radical overhaul of the current sociopolitical system, and do not undermine the usefulness of the past as a guideline for the present. Legalists were much more resolute in their willingness to dispense with traditional modes of rule, and they questioned the very relevance of the past to the present. Their attack on supporters of learning from the past was twofold. First, there was simply no uniform model of orderly rule in the past to be emulated. Second, and more substantially, society evolves, and this evolution turns behavioral modes, institutions, and even values of the past obsolete.

The first and best-known argument in favor of dispensing with the past models is presented in the first chapter of the Book of Lord Shang. Shang Yang is cited saying: “Orderly generations did not [follow] a single way; to benefit the state, one need not imitate antiquity” (Shang jun shu 1:4). Han Fei explains further: past models are irrelevant not only because they were changing from time to time, but also because we cannot verify exactly what they were. The way of the former paragons is bitterly contested, and those who claim the authority of antiquity—such as adherents of Confucius and Mozi—simply cannot agree on the lessons of the past that are to be applied in the present: “He who claims certain knowledge without examining the issue is a fool; he who relies on things which are impossible to ascertain is an impostor. It is therefore clear that those who rely on former kings, and claim they can determine with certainty [the way of the paragon legendary rulers] Yao and Shun, are either fools or impostors” (Han Feizi 50: 457).

Yet having postulated the impossibility of learning from past models, Shang Yang and Han Fei propose an alternative lesson that can be learnt: that changing circumstances may require not a piecemeal but a comprehensive readjustment of the sociopolitical system. To demonstrate the magnitude of change in the past, both thinkers turn to remotest antiquity, and trace how the state was formed. For instance, Shang Yang depicts social evolution from primeval promiscuous life to an incipient stratified society and then to a fully mature state with laws, regulations, officials, and the power of coercion. At the earlier stages of human history, the people could be constrained by moral suasion; yet this was simply because that was the age of relative abundance: “Formerly… the people cut trees and slew animals [for food]; the people were few, while trees and animals plenty. … Men plowed to obtain food, women wove to obtain clothing; there was no use for either punishments or administration, but there was order” (Shang jun shu 18: 107). Han Fei echoes Shang Yang: in the remote past “the people were few while goods were plenty; hence people did not compete” (Han Feizi 49: 443). Now, this age of primeval morality has gone forever. Both thinkers emphasize the devastating impact of demographic growth on human mores. “Nowadays, five children are not considered too many, and each child also has five children; the grandfather is still alive, and he already has twenty-five grandchildren. Therefore, the people are plenty while commodities and goods are few; people work laboriously, but provisions are scanty; hence the people compete” (Han Feizi 49: 443). Under these new circumstances, moral norms are no longer relevant; contention is the rule, and it can be quelled only through coercion.

The evolutionary view of history and especially the emphasis that economic conditions can alter moral values, distinguish the Legalists critically from proponents of alternative models of state formation (Pines 2013a). The Legalists imply that everything is changeable: as socioeconomic conditions change, human behavior changes as well; and this in turn requires adaptation of political institutions. Shang Yang summarizes:

When the affairs of the world change, the Way that is implemented alternates as well. … Hence it is said: “When the people are stupid, one can become the monarch by means of one’s knowledge; when the generation is knowledgeable, then one can become the monarch by means of one’s might” (Shang jun shu 7: 53).

The last phrase represents the rationale behind Shang Yang’s model of state formation. If radical restructuring of society was legitimate in the past, so it is in the present. In the current situation, when the people are “knowledgeable,” a powerful state, which is ready to coerce its subjects, is the only viable solution. The Book of Lord Shang (but not Han Feizi) allowed for the possibility that in the future the need for excessive reliance on coercion would end and a milder, morality-driven political structure would evolve, but these utopian digressions are of minor importance in the text (Pines 2013a). What matters is the bottom line: radical reforms were inevitable in the past; and they are inevitable in the present.

2.2 Human Nature

The second pillar of Legalist political philosophy is their view of human nature. Legalists eschew the discussion of whether or not human badness or goodness are inborn, or whether or not all humans possess fundamentally similar qualities. What matters for them is, first, that the overwhelming majority of human beings are selfish and covetous; second, that this situation cannot be changed through education or self-cultivation; and, third, that human beings’ selfishness can become an asset to the ruler rather than a threat. That “the people go for benefits as water flows downwards” (Shang jun shu 23:131) is a given: the task is to allow the people to satisfy their desire for glory and riches in a way that will accord with, rather than contradict, the state’s needs. Shang Yang explains how to attain this:

Wherever name/fame and benefit meet, the people will go in this direction. … Agriculture is what the people consider bitter; war is what the people consider dangerous. Yet they brave what they consider bitter and perform what they consider dangerous: it is because of calculations [of name and profit]. … When benefits come from land, the people exhaust their strength; when fame comes from war, the people are ready to die (Shang jun shu 6: 45–46).

The people covet wealth and fame; they are afraid of punishments: this is their basic disposition (qing 情). This disposition is not to be altered but to be properly understood and then manipulated: “When a law is established without investigating the people’s disposition, it will not succeed” (Shang jun shu 8: 63). To direct the populace toward the pursuits which benefit the state, namely agriculture and warfare, even though they consider these “bitter and dangerous,” one should establish a combination of positive and negative incentives. The entire sociopolitical system advocated by Shang Yang can be seen as the realization of this recommendation.

The Legalists’ view of the people as covetous and selfish was not exceptional to this intellectual current: it was shared, among others, by as significant a Confucian thinker as Xunzi 荀子 (ca. 310–230 BCE) as well as by many other thinkers (Sato 2013). Yet in marked distinction from Xunzi and from other Confucian thinkers, the Legalists dismissed the possibility that the elite—rulers and ministers alike—would be able to overcome their selfishness. The topic of the ruler’s quality will be discussed below; here, suffice it to focus on that of the ministers. For thinkers from the entire spectrum of Confucian thought, it was axiomatic that the government should be staffed by morally upright “superior men” who would serve out of commitment to the ruler above and the people below. For the Legalists, it was equally axiomatic that this cannot be the case. Shen Dao explains:

Among the people, everybody acts for himself. If you [try to] alter them and cause them to act for you, then there will be none whom you can attain and employ. … In circumstances where people are not able to act in their own interests, those above will not employ them. Employ the people for their own [interests], do not employ them for your sake: then there will be none whom you cannot make use of (Shenzi, 24–25).

Shen Dao dismisses the possibility that the ministers will be driven by moral commitment; on the contrary, such exceptional individuals should not be employed at all. This sentiment recurs in Han Feizi, a text that expresses with utmost clarity its belief that every member of the elite—like any member of society—pursues his own interests (cf. Goldin 2005: 58–65; 2013). Morally upright officials do exist, but these are exceptional individuals: “one cannot find even a dozen upright and trustworthy men of service (shi 士), while the officials within the boundaries are counted in hundreds; if one cannot employ but upright and trustworthy men of service, then there will be not enough people to fill in the offices” (Han Feizi 49: 451). This awareness is the source of the thinker’s great concern with regard to the ongoing and irresolvable power struggle between the ruler and the members of his entourage (see below), and is also a source of Han Fei’s (and other Legalists’) insistence on the priority of impersonal norms and regulations in dealing with the ruler-minister relations. Proper administrative system should not be based on trust and respect for ministers; rather they should be tightly controlled. A political system that presupposes human selfishness is the only viable political system.

3. Tillers and Soldiers: Ruling the People

One of the (in)famous controversial dictums in the Book of Lord Shang states: “When the people are weak, the state is strong; hence the state that possesses the Way strives to weaken the people” (Shang jun shu 20: 121). Elsewhere, the text specifies:

In the past, those who were able to regulate All-under-Heaven first had to regulate their people; those who were able to overcome the enemy first had to overcome their people. The root of overcoming the people is controlling the people as the metalworker does metal, and the potter clay. When the roots are not firm, the people will be like flying birds and running animals: who will be able to regulate them then? The root of the people is law. Hence, those who excel at orderly rule bar the people with law; then they are able to attain fame and lands. (Shang jun shu 18: 107)

These and many similar sayings explain Shang Yang’s image as a “people-basher.” No other thinker was as explicit as he in pointing at the persistent contradiction between society (“the people”) and the state. The people’s intrinsic selfishness constantly endangers social order; and to safeguard this order, the ruler should resolutely rein in his subjects through the law (fa 法 in this context refers primarily to punitive laws). The state should tightly control its subjects: the system of mandatory registration of the population and creation of mutual responsibility groups among the populace will ensure that every crime is denounced and the criminal—particularly those who abscond from the battlefield—will know that “there is nowhere to flee from the army ranks, and the escapees can find no refuge” (Shang jun shu 18: 108). Moreover, to overawe the people, the text advocates inflicting heavy punishments for even petty offenses, as only then will the people be sufficiently scared as to behave properly. Eventually, harsh punishments will eliminate the very need for punishments:

To prevent wrongdoing and stop transgressions, nothing is better than making punishments heavy. When punishments are heavy and [criminals] are inevitably captured, then the people dare not try [to break the law]. Hence, there are no penalized people in the state. When there are no penalized people in the state, it is said, then: “Clear punishments eliminate executions.” (Shang jun shu 17: 101)

Due to above pronouncements, Shang Yang gained notoriety as an advocate of oppression; but actually his attitude toward the people is much more balanced than is often imagined. The Book of Lord Shang frequently speaks of “loving/caring for the people” (ai min 愛民) and “benefiting the people” (li min 利民), echoing other contemporaneous texts which proclaimed the people’s well-being as the ultimate goal of policy-making (Pines 2009: 201-203). The people are not just the potential enemy of the ruler: they are his major asset. Without their harsh labor in the fields or their bravery on the battlefield, the state is doomed. Yet the people will not embrace tilling and waging war just out of fear of coercion. A more complex system is needed: one that will introduce attractive positive incentives along with awe-inspiring negative ones. Shang Yang explains:

The disposition of the people is to have likes and dislikes; hence the people can be ruled. The ruler cannot but investigate likes and dislikes. Likes and dislikes are the root of awards and penalties. The disposition of the people is to like ranks and emoluments and dislike punishments and penalties. The ruler sets up the two in order to guide the people’s will and to establish whatever he desires. (Shang jun shu 9: 65)

Punishments and penalties can deter the people from misbehavior, but to encourage them to do “whatever the ruler desires,” positive incentives—“ranks and emoluments”—are no less important. The ruler’s major goal, as Shang Yang reiterates incessantly, is to turn his subjects into diligent farmers and valiant soldiers. This can be attained only if engagement in these “bitter and dangerous” occupations will be the exclusive way to secure material riches and glory. This understanding stands at the background of Shang Yang’s most celebrated reform: the replacement of Qin’s traditional hereditary aristocratic order with the new system of “ranks of merit.”

The system of 20 (initially fewer) “ranks of merit” introduced by Shang Yang was one of the most daring acts of social engineering in human history. This system became the cornerstone of social life in Qin. The lowest ranks were distributed for military achievements, particularly decapitating enemy soldiers, or could be purchased in exchange for extra grain yields; successful rank-holders could be incorporated into the military or civilian administration and thereafter be promoted up the social ladder. Each rank granted its holder economic, social, and legal privileges; and since the ranks were not fully inheritable, the system generated considerable social mobility (see details in Loewe 1960 and 2010; Pines et al. 2014: 24–26). The new system attempted to unify the social, economic, and political hierarchy under the government’s control, which in turn required the elimination of alternative avenues of enhancing one’s socioeconomic and political status. This latter concern is strongly pronounced throughout the Book of Lord Shang:

The means through which the sovereign encourages the people are offices and ranks; the means through which the state prospers are agriculture and warfare. Now, the people seek offices, but those are attainable not through agriculture and warfare but through crafty words and hollow ways: this is what is called to exhaust the people. (Shang jun shu 3: 20).

The text insists repeatedly that the only way to make agriculture and warfare attractive is to prevent any alternative route toward enrichment and empowerment. It specifies that “those who do not work but eat, who do not fight but attain glory, who have no ranks but are respected, who have no emoluments but are rich, who have no offices but lead: these are called ‘scoundrels’” (Shang jun shu 18: 111). Any group which tries to bypass engagement in agriculture and warfare—be these merchants who amass riches without tilling or talkative intellectuals who seek promotion without contributing to the state economically or militarily—should be suppressed or at least squeezed out of profits. Nothing—neither learning, nor commerce, nor even artisanship—should distract the people from farming and making war. The text summarizes:

Hence, my teaching causes those among the people who seek benefits to gain them nowhere but through tilling; and those who want to evade disasters escape through no other means but war. Within the borders, everyone among the people first devotes himself to tilling and warfare, and only then obtains whatever pleases him. Hence, though the territory is small, grain is plenty, and though the people are few, the army is powerful. He who is able to implement the two of these within the borders will accomplish the way of Hegemon and Monarch. (Shang jun shu 25: 139)

4. Maintaining the Bureaucracy

To rule and control the people effectively, the government should rely on an extensive bureaucracy; but this bureaucracy in turn should be properly staffed and tightly monitored. It is with this regard that the Legalists made a lasting contribution to China’s administrative thought and administrative practices. Their strongly pronounced suspicion of scheming ministers and selfish officials was conducive to the promulgation of impersonal means of recruitment, promotion, demotion, and performance control. These means became indispensable for China’s bureaucratic apparatus for millennia to come (Creel 1974).

4.1 Recruitment and Promotion

One of the primary issues that the rulers of the Warring States faced was that of recruitment into government service. During the aristocratic Springs-and-Autumns period, the overwhelming majority of officials were scions of hereditary ministerial lineages; only exceptionally could outsiders join the government. This situation changed by the fifth century BCE, as aristocratic lineages were largely eliminated in internecine struggles and members of lower nobility—the so-called “men of service,” shi 士—could advance up the ladder of officialdom. It was then that the new meritocratic discourse of “elevating the worthy” (shang xian 尚賢) proliferated and upward social mobility became legitimate (Pines 2013c). Yet who were the “worthy” and how to determine one’s worthiness was a matter of considerable uncertainty and confusion. While certain texts presented highly sophisticated ways of discerning the employee’s true worth (Richter 2005), their recommendations required exceptional perspicacity of an employer and were largely impractical. Instead, the most popular way of recruitment was based on a notion of “recognition” of one’s worth (Henry 1987): an employee was recommended to the ruler (or to a high official), interviewed, and then his worth was “recognized” and high position assigned. This widespread practice was deeply resented by the Legalists. The very idea of reliance on vague concept of “worthiness” and on personal impression of the ruler as the primary means of recruitment was in their eyes fundamentally flawed, because it allowed manifold manipulations. Shang Yang explains why “worthiness” based on one’s reputation is an intrinsically problematic concept:

What the generation calls a “worthy” is one who is defined as upright; but those who define him as upright are his associates (dang 黨). When you hear [them] talking about him, you consider him able; when you ask his associates, they approve. Hence, one is ennobled before one has any merits; one is punished before one has committed a crime. (Shang jun shu 25: 136–137)

“Worthiness” is too vague and too prone to manipulation by partisans to serve as an adequate means of promotion; and relying on one’s reputation or on an interview with the ruler are equally flawed methods. Similar views are echoed in Han Feizi and in other legalist texts, such as “Relying on Standards” (“Ren fa” 任法) chapter of Guanzi (Rickett 1998: 144–151). Shen Dao further warns the ruler that if he decides on promotions and demotions on the basis of his personal impression, this will cause inflated expectations or excessive resentment among his servants:

When the ruler abandons the standard (fa 法) and relies on himself to govern, then punishments and rewards, recruitment and demotion all arise out of the ruler’s heart. If this is the case, then even if rewards are appropriate, the expectations are insatiable; even if the punishments are appropriate, lenience is sought ceaselessly. If the ruler abandons the standard and relies on his heart to decide upon the degree [of awards and punishments], then identical merits will be rewarded differently, and identical crimes will be punished differently. It is from this that resentment arises. (Shenzi, 52)

Decisions on matters of promotion and demotion should never be based on the ruler’s heart; not only because he can be misled and manipulated by unscrupulous aides, but also because any decision—even if correct one—which is not based on impersonal standards will cause dissatisfaction among his underlings (see more in Harris, forthcoming). An alternative will be a set of clear impersonal rules that will regulate recruitment and promotion of officials. For Shang Yang, recruitment will be based on the ranks of merit. Han Fei remains doubtful about these: after all, why should valiant soldiers who gained ranks of merit become good officials? Han Fei himself does not solve the problem of initial recruitment but develops ways to monitor subsequent promotion of an official:

Thus, as for the officials of an enlightened ruler: chief ministers and chancellors must rise from among local officials; valiant generals must rise from among the ranks. One who has merit should be awarded: then ranks and emoluments are bountiful and they are ever more encouraging; one who is promoted and ascends to higher positions, his official responsibilities increase, and he performs his tasks ever more orderly. When ranks and emoluments are great, while official responsibilities are dealt with in an orderly way—this is the Way of the Monarch. (Han Feizi 50: 460)

Promotion should be dissociated once and for all from the ruler’s (or his ministers’) personal judgments. One should simply check an incumbent’s performance on the lower level of bureaucracy, and promote him to higher positions with ever more responsibilities. This objective process of promotion according to measurable and objective merits became one of the hallmarks of the Chinese administrative system throughout the imperial era and beyond.

4.2 Monitoring Officials: Technique of Government

Rewards and punishments (primarily promotion and demotion) are the major handles through which the ruler has to control his officials. But how to judge their performance? Here the Legalists put forward the idea of xing ming 刑名: “performance and title.” Although this compound is attested only in Han Feizi, throughout the Former Han dynasty it was most commonly identified with what we nowadays call “Legalism.” Han Fei explains what he means by xing ming:

Performance and title refers to statements and tasks. The minister presents his statement; the ruler assigns him tasks according to his statement, and evaluates his merits exclusively according to the task. When the merit is in accordance with the task, and the task is in accordance with the statement, then [the minister] is awarded; when the merit is not in accordance with the task, and the task is not in accordance with the statement, then he is punished. (Han Feizi 7: 40–41)

The proposed way of estimating the official’s performance is not entirely reasonable (why punish a minister for over-performing?) but at least it tries to establish firm criteria of evaluation, which in this case are related to the minister’s own “bid” (Goldin 2013: 8–10). The advantages are clear: the system will prevent ministerial manipulations and will reaffirm the ruler’s control over his officials. This latter point is of particular importance to the Legalists. Various means through which the ruler should monitor the ministers are named in Han Feizi and other Legalist texts as “technique” (shu 術) or “rules” (shù 數) (the meaning of both terms may overlap: Creel 1974: 125–134; Yang 2010). Both terms are similar to fa but are narrower in their meaning, referring primarily to a variety of means through which the ruler controls his officials. Han Fei claims that shu is the hallmark of Shen Buhai’s ideas, and explains its meaning as follows:

Technique is to give official positions in accordance with one’s responsibility, to investigate reality in accordance with the name, to hold the handles of death and life, to assess the abilities of every minister. This is what the ruler should hold. (Han Feizi 43: 397)

This passage explains the general principles of Shen Buhai’s “techniques” but does not detail how they functioned. “Techniques” and “rules” are referred in Legalist texts as the best means of preserving the ruler’s control: the enlightened ruler relies on these, while the benighted one in contrast casts these away and subsequently is misled by his ministers’ delusive words and by persuaders’ inducements (shui 說). Yet amid the strong emphasis on the power of techniques, rules, laws, and regulations, we can discover the sober realization that even these are not always enough, and that a perfect administrative system simply cannot come into existence. Thus, in one of the later chapters of the Book of Lord Shang it is said:

Nowadays, [the ruler] relies on many officials and numerous clerks; and to monitor them establishes assistants and supervisors. Assistants are placed and supervisors are established to prohibit [the officials] from pursuing [personal] profit; yet assistants and supervisors also seek profit, so how they will able to prohibit it? (Shang jun shu 24: 133)

This appears to be a rare insight concerning the administrative system’s fundamental inability to monitor itself in the long term; yet the observation does not lead to any radical alternatives to the system of supervision over officials. The chapter simply reasserts the superiority of techniques and rules over the ruler’s personal intervention in policy-making and does not explain how these would prevent the supervisors’ machinations. Insofar as techniques and rules are implemented by self-interested—or simply erring—human beings, the question remains: to what extent can the impersonal mode of rule cure the intrinsic maladies of the bureaucratic system (cf. Van Norden 2013)? This question remains one of the major challenges to the Legalists’ legacy.

5. The Ruler and his Ministers

Not a few scholars consider Legalists in general and Han Fei in particular as staunch theorists of “monarchic despotism” (Hsiao 1979: 386). This evaluation should be qualified, though. What distinguishes Han Fei and his ilk from other thinkers is neither his insistence on the monarchic form of rule as singularly appropriate, nor adoration of the sovereign’s authority; actually, on these points the Legalists do not differ from most other intellectual currents of their age (Pines 2009: 25–107). Rather, their distinctiveness was in their pronounced anti-ministerial stance. This stance is exemplified by the following saying of Shen Buhai:

Now the reason why a ruler builds lofty inner walls and outer walls, looks carefully to the barring of doors and gates, is [to prepare against] the coming of invaders and bandits. But one who murders the ruler and takes his state does not necessarily climb over difficult walls and batter in barred doors and gates. [He may be one of the ministers, who] by limiting what the ruler sees and restricting what the ruler hears, seizes his government and monopolizes his commands, possesses his people and takes his state. (Creel 1974: 344, translation modified)

This warning epitomizes what may be considered the major dividing line between Legalists and their opponents. Despite their pronounced belief in monarchic form of rule, most thinkers of the Warring States period insisted that the monarch would never succeed without a worthy aide. Their common desideratum was attaining harmonious relations between the ministers and the rulers; not coincidentally, the common simile of these relations was that of friends, i.e. of equals. Some thinkers were even more assertive in their interpretation of a worthy minister as the ruler’s de facto superior, a teacher and not just a friend (Pines 2009: 163–172). One of the most radical manifestations of this pro-ministerial mindset of the Warring States era was the idea of abdication, according to which a good ruler may consider yielding the throne to his meritorious aide (Allan 1981; Pines 2005). For Legalists, in contrast, this very idea proved that the pro-ministerial discourse of their rivals was usurpation in disguise. Ministers should never be trusted: they are neither the ruler’s friends, nor his teachers, but his bitter foes and plotters, who should be checked and controlled rather than cherished and empowered. This sober realization—promoted, ironically, by the members of the ministerial stratum—added certain tragic dimensions to the Legalists’ political theory.

5.1 The Ruler’s Superiority

Legalists shared the conviction of most other political theorists of the Warring States period: stability and orderly rule in either the individual state or “All-under-Heaven” can be attained only under an omnipotent monarch. They added a few new dimensions to this overarching monarchistic discourse. For instance, in Shang Yang’s model of state formation, the establishment of the ruler is presented—in contrast to Mozi (see the section on Political Theory in the entry on Mohism)—not as a starting point, but as the crowning stage of sociopolitical evolution, the final and singularly important step toward stability. The ruler is the only person who represents common interests of the polity (gong 公, “commonality,” actually is an identical word to “the lord”; cf. Goldin 2013: 3–4). As such, his power is conceived not as the means of personal enjoyment but as the common interest of his subjects. Shen Dao elaborates:

In antiquity, the Son of Heaven was established and esteemed not in order to benefit the single person. It is said: When All under Heaven lacks the single esteemed [person], then there is no way to carry out the principles [of orderly government, li 理]…. Hence the Son of Heaven is established for the sake of All under Heaven, it is not that All under Heaven is established for the sake of the Son of Heaven…. Even if the law is bad, it is better than absence of laws; thereby the hearts of the people are unified. (Shenzi, 16).

Shen Dao presents his political credo with rare clarity. A ruler is crucial for the proper functioning of the political system; he is the real foundation of political order, not a beneficiary but rather a servant of humankind. Significantly, the ruler attains these blessed results by the sheer fact of his existence and not due to his morality or intelligence. As Shen Dao clearly states, bad laws are better than a lawless situation, and we may infer that a bad ruler is better than anarchy. What matters—as Shen Dao explains elsewhere—are not the ruler’s individual qualities but his ability to preserve his “positional power” (or “power of authority,” shi 勢). As long as the ruler preserves his power intact, i.e., by refraining from delegating it to ministers and preserving the singularity of decision-making in his own hands, the political system will act well. Otherwise, turmoil is inevitable. Shen Dao warns:

When the Son of Heaven is established, he should not let the regional lords doubt [his position]; when a lord is established, he should not let nobles doubt [his position]; … Doubts bring commotion; doubleness [of the sources of authority] brings contention, intermingling brings mutual injury; harm is from sharing, not from singularity (Shenzi, 47–48).

Shen Buhai echoes Shen Dao: “He who is a singular decision-maker can become the sovereign of All under Heaven” (Creel 1974: 380, translation modified).

Why is the singularity of the ruler’s position so important? It is because by the sheer fact of his exclusive authority, the ruler is able to arbitrate conflicts among his ministers and to preserve the chain of command in his state, without which the state may collapse. This explains also the Legalists’ emphasis on absolute obedience to the ruler’s commands, epitomized by the dictum to punish a minister who disobeyed commands even if the results of his actions were successful (Guanzi 45: 913; Rickett 1998: 150). Similarly, the above mentioned dictum in Han Feizi to punish an over-performing minister may be understood in this context: fear of a minister’s high ambitions and of his potential disobedience outweighs other considerations. The ruler’s exclusivity and omnipotence is the sine qua non of proper political order. Preserving and strengthening his authority is the Legalists’ singularly pronounced political commitment.

5.2 Entrapped Sovereign?

The Legalists’ strong adherence to the principles of monarchism is self-evident; but it is not free of manifold tensions and contradictions. Those are fully epitomized in Han Fei’s thought. Han Fei shared his predecessors’ view of the ruler as the pivot of sociopolitical order, the sole guarantor of stability and prosperity of his subjects; yet he was also bitterly aware of the ruler’s inadequacy. The very fact that the monarch—unlike his officials—owes his position to pedigree alone means that this position will more often than not be occupied by a mediocrity. Multiple historical examples scattered throughout Han Feizi unequivocally demonstrate how devastating the ruler’s ineptitude can be (Graziani, forthcoming). The intrinsic contradiction between an institutionally infallible and humanly erring sovereign is the major source of tension in the Han Feizi (Pines 2013b).

Thinkers of different ideological inclinations shared the sober realization that a sovereign may be a mediocrity; yet for them this problem was easily resolvable. Insofar as the ruler would be prudent enough to entrust everyday affairs to a meritorious aide, he would be able to continue enjoying absolute prestige, while practical matters would be decided by worthy ministers (see, e.g., Xunzi 11: 223–224). For Han Fei, though, this solution is unacceptable. Time and again he warns the ruler that nobody can be trusted: the ruler’s wife, his beloved concubine, his eldest son and heir—all hope for his premature death because this may secure their position. Threats come also from the ruler’s brothers and cousins, from uncles and bedfellows, from dwarfs and clowns who entertain him, from dancers in his court; and, of course from the talkative “men-of-service” (shi) who conspire with foreign powers to imperil his state. Every single person around the throne should be suspected; and minimal negligence can cost a ruler his life and his power. And the most dangerous foes are precisely those whom other thinkers considered the ruler’s friends and teachers, namely his closest aides, his ministers. Han Fei compares them to hungry tigers ready to devour the sovereign whenever the opportunity arrives:

The Yellow Emperor said: “A hundred battles a day are fought between the superior and his underlings.” The underlings conceal their private [interests], trying to test their superior; the superior employs norms and measures to restrict the underlings. Hence when norms and measures are established, they are the sovereign’s treasure; when the cliques and cabals are formed, they are the minister’s treasure. If the minister does not murder his ruler, it is because the cliques and cabals are not formed. (Han Feizi 8: 51)

This is an amazing saying: the minister is, by his nature, deceitful and murderous, and his failure to eliminate the sovereign is simply a sign of insufficient preparations, not of unwillingness to do so. The ministers’ threat to the monarch is inherent in their position, and it can be defused only through proper implementation of methods and techniques of rule.

Han Fei’s repeated anti-ministerial philippics perplex the reader. It is somewhat ironic that a thinker who actively sought employment in the rulers’ courts presented his own stratum as intrinsically malicious. As many traditional and modern scholars noticed, Han Fei’s personal tragedy—he was slandered at the court of Qin, imprisoned and reportedly forced to commit suicide before being able to present his views to the King of Qin—was a by-product of the very atmosphere of the ruler-minister mistrust that the thinker himself generated. But going beyond this personal tragedy there is a more general question: how can the ruler maintain his functions in the situation of permanent danger and absolute mistrust between him and his aides?

Han Fei’s immediate answer is that the ruler should protect himself through careful employment of the techniques of government depicted above. He should check his ministers’ reports, investigate their performance, promote or demote them according to the match between “performance” and the “name”; he should remain calm and secretive and let them expose themselves; he should encourage mutual spying and denouncement among his ministers. But this supposedly neat solution is problematic. First, it requires at times superhuman intellectual abilities of the ruler, in direct contradiction to Han Fei’s own insistence that his system fits an “average” (i.e., mediocre) sovereign (Han Feizi 40: 392). Second, it remains unclear how the ruler will gain access to reliable information if each of his close aides—as Han Fei reminds him—is a potential cheater (Han Feizi 6: 36–37). And third, a system which requires permanent surveillance of everybody can easily fall into a trap of totalitarian regimes in which “each agent charged with inspecting and observing must logically be subject to inspection and observation himself” (Graziani, forthcoming). Han Fei’s clear-sightedness with regard to ministerial machinations is remarkable, but it eventually entraps the sovereign in the nightmarish situation of comprehensive suspicion and mistrust.

Yet scheming ministers aside, the sovereign should beware of his own mistakes, which may be even worse than his foes’ plans. The monarch is the most revered individual, but also the weakest chain in the government apparatus. He can be duped by his underlings, is prone to misjudge them, and his actions may frequently endanger the very foundations of political order that he is supposed to safeguard. Hence, the thinker repeatedly urges the ruler to refrain from any personal activities, any reliance on personal knowledge, and any manifestation of personal likes and dislikes. “He who relies on personal abilities is the worst ruler”; “When the sovereign abandons the law and behaves selfishly, there is no difference between the rulers and the ruled”; “When the ruler has selfish kindness, the ruled have selfish desires” (Han Feizi 48: 432; 6: 32; 45: 414 et saepe). The ruler should refrain from any action; echoing the Laozi 老子, Han Fei urges him to remain empty and tranquil (Han Feizi 5: 27). The thinker summarizes his recommendations:

The ruler does not reveal his desires; should he do so, the minister will carve and embellish them. He does not reveal his views; should he do so, the minister will use them to present his different [opinion]. … The way of the enlightened sovereign is to let the knowledgeable completely exhaust their contemplations—then the ruler relies on them to decide on matters and is not depleted of knowledge; to let the worthy utilize their talents—then the ruler relies on them, assigns tasks, and is not depleted of abilities. When there is success, the ruler possesses a worthy [name]; when there is failure, the minister bears the responsibility. (Han Feizi 5: 27)

This is a curious recommendation: the ruler should completely nullify himself both in order to preserve his authority against scheming ministers, and to acquire—unjustly!—a good name at the minister’s expense. Yet this sovereign, who has neither desires nor observable views, becomes the ultimate slave of his office. For the sake of self-preservation he must abolish his personality, being completely submerged by the system which he ostensibly runs. A.C. Graham provocatively notices that the ruler in Han Fei’s system “has no functions which could not be performed by an elementary computer. … Might one even say than in Han Fei’s system it is ministers who do the ruling?” (Graham 1989: 291). This paradox of an entrapped sovereign, who enjoys God-like omnipotence, but who is required to refrain from any activism in order to preserve this omnipotence is one of the most fascinating manifestations of the intrinsic contradiction of the authoritarian system. When it comes from a thinker who is often described as singularly authoritarian-minded, it deserves utmost attention.

6. Assault on Culture and Learning

In the twentieth century not a few scholars dubbed Legalists “totalitarians” (e.g., Creel 1953: 135–158; Rubin 1976: 55–88; Fu Zhengyuan 1996). Some of the aspects of the Legalist program—a powerful state that overwhelms society, rigid control over the populace and the administrative apparatus, harsh laws, and the like—seem to lend support to this equation. Yet when we move to the realm of thought control—a sine qua non for a true totalitarian polity—the results are somewhat equivocal. While Shang Yang and Han Fei have much to say on matters of culture and learning, their message is predominantly negative: they eagerly expose the fallacies of their opponents’ views, but do not necessarily provide an ideological alternative of their own.

Shang Yang is particularly notorious for his comprehensive assault on traditional culture and on moral values. The Book of Lord Shang abounds with controversial and highly provocative statements like this one:

Poems, Documents, rites, music, goodness, self-cultivation, benevolence, uprightness, argumentativeness, cleverness: when the state has these ten, the superiors cannot force the people to [engage in] defense and warfare. If the state is ruled according to these ten, then when the enemy arrives it will be dismembered, and when the enemy does not arrive, it will be impoverished. If the state eradicates these ten, then the enemy will dare not to arrive, and even if he arrives, he will be repelled; when the army is raised and sent on a campaign it will seize [the enemy’s land]; while if the army is restrained and does not attack, the state will be rich. (Shang jun shu 3: 23)

This and similar pronouncements, as well as the text’s derisive language (it dubs moral values as “lice” 蝨), explain why Shang Yang gained notoriety in the eyes of imperial literati, as well as many modern scholars, as an enemy of morality. Yet this conclusion should be qualified. The “alienating rhetoric,” an example of which is cited above, is concentrated only in a few chapters of the Book of Lord Shang; most other display more accommodative views toward traditional moral values; some even promise that “the sage ruler” would be able to “implement benevolence and righteousness in All under Heaven” (Shang jun shu 13: 82; see also detailed discussion in Pines 2012). It seems that the text assaults not morality as such but rather moralizing discourse. It is this discourse—or more precisely its bearers, the peripatetic “men of service” who seek employment at the rulers’ courts—which arouse Shang Yang’s indignation.

Shang Yang deplores traveling intellectuals because they damage the foundations of his sociopolitical model. By gaining official positions and emoluments outside the carefully designed system of ranks of merit, they undermine the people’s commitment to agriculture and warfare.

When one thousand people are engaged in agriculture and war, yet there is a single man among them engaged in Poems, Documents, argumentativeness and cleverness, then one thousand people all will become remiss in agriculture and war. … This is the doctrine of impoverishing the state and weakening the army. (Shang jun shu 3:22–26)

It is worth noticing that Shang Yang’s dislike of traveling persuaders is less related to the content of their doctrines but rather focuses on their negative impact on the people’s mores. The very fact that talkative intellectuals are being promoted distracts the people from substantial occupations and causes them engagement in hollow talk and needless learning. Moreover, intellectuals, with their sophisticated ideas, destroy the people’s simple-mindedness (pu 樸), making the latter less diligent and more difficult to control. Thus, both economically and politically, learning is harmful: it distracts the people from their diligent work and diminishes their submissiveness.

This said, the Book of Lord Shang does speak at times of “teaching” or “indoctrination” (jiao 教). Yet normally, this term refers not to imposition of a new set of values, but rather to the internalization of the government’s regulations, which would allow the people to comply with the government’s requirements without the need in coercion (cf. Sanft 2014). In a major discussion of jiao, the text says:

What is called “unification of teaching” is that … fathers and elder brothers, younger brothers, acquaintances, relatives by marriage, and colleagues all say: “What we should be devoted to is just war and that is all.” … This is what I, your minister, call “unification of teaching.” … The people’s desire to wealth and nobility stops only when their coffin is sealed. And the gates of riches and nobility must be [entered exclusively] through military [service]. Therefore, when they hear about war, the people congratulate each other; whenever they move or rest, drink or eat, they sing and chant only about war. (Shang jun shu 17: 105)

Teaching the people to “sing and chant only about war” could easily refer to military indoctrination, such as we encounter in other countries that employed mass armies. Yet the Book of Lord Shang never speaks of, e.g., adoration of martial spirit, dehumanization of the enemy, identifying martiality with masculinity, and similar devices employed in militaristic education elsewhere. Rather, for Shang Yang “teaching” means simply the people’s internalization of the fact that the only way to satisfy their desires for riches and glory is to excel in war. Hence war, which elsewhere in the book is frankly associated with what the people hate (Shang jun shu 18: 108), becomes the focus of the people’s aspirations. “Teaching” is then not about ideological indoctrination; it is just about willful compliance with the government’s policies.

Han Fei’s views of traditional culture and of learning echo Shang Yang’s, but he is even more vehement in his dislike of traveling scholars who rise up the sociopolitical ladder by selling their ideas to the rulers and to high ministers. He repeatedly ridicules rulers who are fond of argumentativeness and of crafty words: they employ proponents of mutually exclusive doctrines just out of admiration of their rhetorical skills, and without any consideration of the doctrines’ political worth. Han Fei advises:

Now, when the ruler listens to [a certain] teaching, if he approves of its doctrine, he should promulgate it among the officials and employ its adherents; if he disapproves of its doctrine, he should dismiss its adherents and cut it off. (Han Feizi 50: 459)

This proposal amounts to “nationalization” of intellectual activity. Han Fei does not deny in principle that some of the rival doctrines may benefit the state; he just denies their proponents the right to develop and elaborate their views independently of the state. Han Fei leaves his rivals no illusions: intellectuals can pursue their ideas only insofar as they are part of the state-ordained system of power, otherwise their ideas will be “cut off.” Elsewhere, he concludes:

Accordingly, in the country of an enlightened ruler there are no texts written in books and on bamboo strips, but the law is the teaching; there are no “speeches” of the former kings, but officials are the teachers; there is no private wielding of swords, but beheading [enemies] is valor. (Han Feizi 49: 452)

Han Fei’s suggestion to eliminate “texts written in books and on bamboo strips” and to turn officials into teachers was implemented by his fellow student and nemesis, Li Si, soon after the imperial unification of 221 BCE. In 213 BCE, after heated court debates, Li Si launched a comprehensive assault on “private learning,” which he identified as intellectually divisive and politically subversive. He then suggested eliminating copies of the canonical books of Poems and Documents, as well as Speeches of the Hundred Schools [of thought] from private collections, leaving copies only in the possession of the court erudites (bo shi 博士). Li Si concluded his proposal by echoing Han Fei’s views: “And those who want to study laws and ordinances, let them take an official as a teacher!” (Shiji 87: 2546).

Li Si’s assault on private learning is often misinterpreted as the victory of “Legalist” over “Confucian” ideology, but this is wrong. Confucianism as such was not targeted; actually, it prospered among the court erudites (Kern 2000: 188–191). What mattered to Li Si—as to Han Fei—was not doctrinal unity as such, but the imposition of the state control over intellectual life, as in all other spheres of social activity. Intellectuals were not persecuted because of the content of their ideas; but they were required either to enter government service or to quit their pursuits. Eventually, Li Si’s biblioclasm backfired. It caused not only considerable resentment in the short term, but, more ominously, brought about immense dislike of Qin—and of Legalism—among the overwhelming majority of the imperial literati for millennia to come (Pines 2014a).

7. Epilogue: Legalism in Chinese History

Qin unification of 221 BCE could have become the triumph of Legalism. The rise of the state of Qin started with Shang Yang; and it was by following his “agriculture cum warfare” course of action that this state became rich and powerful enough to subdue its formidable enemies. Many aspects of Qin’s policy before the imperial unification and in its aftermath—such as the creation of an intrusive government apparatus, tight supervision over officials, reliance on impartial laws and regulations, and the like—were designed by Shang Yang, Shen Buhai, Han Fei, and their like. And these policies brought about unprecedented success: after five centuries of unending warfare, the entire realm “under Heaven” was unified under a single ruler! Proud of his success, the First Emperor (r. 221–210 BCE) toured his newly acquired empire, erecting stone steles on the sites of sacred mountains; in the stele inscriptions he boasted of bringing unity, peace, stability, and orderly rule (Kern 2000; Pines 2014b). Dreams of generations of preimperial thinkers were realized, and this was done primarily through following the recipes of those whom we dub today “Legalists.”

Yet history was cruel to the Legalists: the Qin dynasty (221–207 BCE), which was designed to rule for “myriad generations” (Shiji 6: 236), collapsed shortly after the founder’s death, brought down by a popular rebellion of unprecedented scope and ferocity. This swift collapse—which took place just a few years after Li Si’s infamous biblioclasm—shaped the image of Qin for millennia to come. The dynasty was no longer a success story, but rather that of miserable failure; and the ideas which guided its policymakers were discredited as well. Already in the first generations after the Qin, consensus was reached: its collapse was due to excessive activism, abnormal assertiveness of its administrative apparatus, over-reliance on penalties, senseless expansionism, and debilitating mistrust between the emperors and their entourage (Shiji 6: 276–284; Xin yu 4: 62). All these policies could be meaningfully attributed to the Legalists, whose intellectual legacy was as a result discredited. At best it was reduced to Sima Tan’s assessment: “a one-time policy that could not be constantly applied.”

The diminishing appeal of Legalism became fully visible under the reign of Emperor Wu of the Han (r. 141–87 BCE). While the Emperor himself adopted assertive domestic and foreign policies largely patterned after the Qin dynasty, he considered it prudent to distance himself from the Qin and Legalism, and to endorse—however superficially—Confucianism. It was during his reign that first proposals were made to ban the followers of Shang Yang, Shen Buhai, and Han Fei from holding office. Although in the short term these proposals had limited consequences (Shang Yang’s legacy was still openly defended by the government representative during the court debates in 81 BCE), in the long term the attitude toward Legalists changed. Few scholars studied their writings; even fewer were courageous enough to endorse their legacy openly. Much like Qin itself (for which see Pines 2014a), Legalism henceforth became a negative label, associated with the policies immensely opposed by the majority of imperial literati: excessive harshness, oppression, terror at court, imperial hubris, and the like. Self-identification as a follower of Shang Yang or Han Fei became a rarity, if not an impossibility.

In imperial times, the position of Legalism was somewhat paradoxical. On the one hand, its ideas remained highly influential, especially in the realm of administrative practice, but also with regard to the policies of the enrichment and empowerment of the state, as well as in some legal practices. On certain occasions, some of the leading imperial reformers—from Zhuge Liang 諸葛亮 (181–234) to Su Chuo 蘇綽 (498–546), from Wang Anshi 王安石 (1021–1086) to Zhang Juzheng 張居正 (1525–1582)—could openly recognize their indebtedness to the Legalist ways of reinvigorating the government apparatus and restoring the state’s economic and military prowess. On the other hand, most political reformers and activists remained closet Legalists at best. For the vast majority of the literati, Shang Yang, Han Fei, and their like were negative examples; hence, most of the texts associated with the Legalist school ceased circulating, and only a very few merited commentaries. Overt endorsement of Shang Yang, for instance, would be all but impossible for a respected man of letters.

It was only at the turn of the twentieth century that Legalism was rediscovered and partly rehabilitated by the new generations of intellectuals. Frustrated by China’s inability to reconstitute itself in a modern world as a “powerful state with a strong army,” young intellectuals began searching for a variety of non-traditional responses to domestic and external challenges; among these, some turned toward Legalism. It was deemed relevant not only because it had demonstrable practical achievements in the past, but also because of its innovativeness, willingness to depart from the patterns of the past, and even its quasi-scientific outlook. For instance, the first major promulgator of interest in Shang Yang’s thought, Mai Menghua 麥夢華 (1874–1915), was positively attracted by the surprising similarity between Shang Yang’s views of history and evolutionary ideas of Occidental social theorists (Li Yu-ning 1977: lviii-lix). Even such a major liberal thinker as Hu Shi 胡適 (1891–1962) was willing to forgive the Legalists their notorious harshness and oppressiveness, hailing Han Fei and Li Si for their “brave spirit of opposing those who ‘do not make the present into their teacher but learn from the past’” (Hu Shi 1930: 6.480–81). Slightly later, it was no less a figure than Hu Hanmin 胡漢民 (1879–1936), one of the most eminent Guomindang 國民黨 (Kuomintang, KMT, “Party of the Nation”) leaders, who wrote a preface to a new edition of the Book of Lord Shang (Hu Hanmin 1933).

The endorsement of Legalism peaked under Mao Zedong 毛澤東 (1893–1976). Mao’s intellectual activism started, incidentally, with a high-school essay written in praise of Shang Yang (Schram 1992–2004, Vol. 1: 5–6), and his positive view of Shang Yang and of the Qin dynasty strengthened as time passed. In the last years of Mao’s life, under the infamous “anti-Confucian” campaign, Legalism was openly endorsed and hailed as “progressive” intellectual current both in its outlook and its historical role (Li Yu-ning 1977); attempts were even made to position it as a direct predecessor of Mao Zedong’s Thought (see, e.g., Liu Zehua 2012).

After Mao’s death, this grotesque politicization of Legalism discontinued. While in the 1980s Legalism still could surface in China’s intellectual debates about paths that the country needed to take, and while echoes of Chinese polemics could be heard in the West as recently as the 1990s (Fu Zhengyuan 1996), this “usage of the past to criticize the present” gradually receded. With it, studies of Legalist thought receded as well, especially in the West and in Japan, but to a certain extent also in China. Most recently, this trend is changing, and the academic community is rediscovering the richness of Legalist thought. Without excessive endorsement or disparagement, scholars can investigate this set of ideas, which was highly effective in the context of the Warring States period, but proved less applicable to other historical circumstances.


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This research was supported by the Israel Science Foundation (grant No. 511/11) and by the Michael William Lipson Chair in Chinese Studies. I am indebted to Paul R. Goldin for his insightful comments on the early version of this article.

Copyright © 2014 by
Yuri Pines <>

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