Notes to Citizenship

1. The Encyclopédie defines the citizen as “celui qui est membre d'une société libre de plusieurs familles, qui partage les droits de cette société, et qui jouit de ses franchises.” (Translation: member of a free society of many families, who shares in the rights of this society and enjoys its immunities.) For the Encyclopédie, a citizen can only be male and families are the uncontested building blocks of society.

2. In the 18th century as well as today one can't write about citizenship without saying at least a few words on Athenian and Roman conceptions.

3. If a central element of citizenship consisted of participating in the business of ruling, as Aristotle and the republican tradition claimed, the corollary was that citizenship is impossible in a monarchy, where one can only be a ‘subject’: having the obligation to obey the law of the realm and enjoying its protection, but without the right to participate in its formulation. In other words, citizen and subject would be opposites. Against this dangerous idea, Hobbes had argued that: “Whether a Common-walth be Monarchicall, or Popular, the freedome is still the same” (Hobbes 1991, 149). This claim was premised on an essentially negative conception of liberty. According to Hobbes, whether we live in a monarchy or a Republic, our obligation to obey the law is the same and our liberty “lyeth therefore only in these things, which in regulating [our] actions, the Soveraign hath praetermitted” (Hobbes 1991, 148).

4. For an account of this resurgence, see Kymlicka and Norman 1994.

5. See, for instance, Cohen 1989, 248 where citizenship as a form of membership is defined as: “an exclusive category that forms the basis of a special tie and affords a social status and a pole of identification that can itself become a rather thick and important identity able to generate solidarity, civic virtue and engagement”. Judith Skhlar, for her part, distinguishes between citizenship as a social status that contributes to the individual's sense of self and citizenship as the manifestation of national identity (Shklar 1991, introduction).

6. Here we have to assess how the agents themselves characterize their attachment to the political community. This is no easy task since individuals' identities are often complex, ambiguous and not entirely consistent.

7. See, for instance, R. Beiner's introduction to Theorizing Citizenship: he defines the “problem of citizenship” as that of confronting “what draws a body of citizens together into a coherent and stably organized political community, and keeps that allegiance durable” (Beiner 1995, 1).

8. As Rousseau famously wrote: “obedience to the law one has prescribed for oneself is freedom” (Rousseau, 1978, 56).

9. See, for instance, bk. I, chaps. vi and bk. III, chaps. xv of On the Social Contract.

10. Here I follow Jean-Fabien Spitz's reading of this passage (Spitz 1995, 481-484). For a different interpretation, see Holmes, 1984.

11. There is an abundant critical literature on Marshall's conception. See Giddens, 1982; Turner 1992, 34-47 and, more recently, Lister 2005.

12. For an account of the importance – and limits - of voting rights and work as instruments of integration in the American case, see Shklar 1991.

13. See the essays published in Kymlicka and Norman 2000. See also Spinner 1994; Parekh 2000; May, Modood and Squires 2004; Eisenberg and Spinner-Halev 2005.

14. The academic debate on the uneasy relation between multiculturalism and women's equality was originally sparked by the publication in 1999 of Susan Okin's provocative essay “Is multiculturalism bad for women?” (Okin 1999) and has been ongoing ever since. See, in particular: Shachar 2001, Okin 2005, Deveaux 2006, Song 2007 and Phillips 2010.

15. For diverging views on these tests see, for example, Bauböck 2008, 43 and Miller 2008, 385.

16. By putting forward a thinner conception of nationhood without eliminating its cultural dimension, the liberal nationalist view can be said to undercut the familiar contrast between ‘civic’ and ‘cultural’ conceptions of the nation. This contrast is often illustrated by referring to the French and German traditions. See for instance: Brubaker 1992; Schnapper, 1994.

17. For Kymlicka's euroscepticism, see Kymlicka 2001, 324-326. See also Miller 1995, 160-165. For the postnationalists, see Habermas 1996, 1998, 2001 a, b and also Ferry 1992.

18. A common starting-point for the contemporary philosophical discussion is Kant's 1795 essay on “Perpetual peace” and his formulation of a right to hospitality. See Bohman and Lutz-Bachmann 1997; Benhabib 2004.

19. David Miller (2010) has tried to refute Abizadeh's argument by purporting to show that immigration controls are not coercive, but rather preventive. See Abizadeh's reply to this criticism in Abizadeh 2010.

20. In “Law of Peoples”, Rawls considers that a nation's prosperity is determined mainly by endogenous, rather than exogenous factors (as endogenous factors, he lists a nation's political culture; the religious, philosophical, and moral traditions supporting its basic structure; the moral qualities of its citizens, etc.) (Rawls 1999, 109). He has been strongly criticized for this by authors such as Charles Beitz (1979), Thomas Pogge (2002), and Seyla Benhabib (2004).

21. For a critical discussion of Walzer's analogies, see for instance Carens 1987. Bader (1995, 217-21) formulates a sociological critique of Walzer's argument focusing on the gap between his conception of the political community and the modern state.

22. Here, as in section 2.2., Habermas's argument raises queries about the possibility of distinguishing neatly between the political and background cultures. To understand a liberal state as a political form of life raises difficult questions about how much is to be included under that heading.

23. Here, as in his writings discussed in section 2.2., Kymlicka defends a ‘thin’ conception of national culture which does not include “common religious beliefs, family customs, or personal lifestyles” (Kymlicka 2001, 259). He describes contemporary liberal national cultures as pluralistic and their terms of admissions as relatively undemanding.

24. For a different assessment written from a liberal nationalist perspective, see Miller 2007.

25. See J. Lichtenberg's exhortation to nationalists: “first you equalise resources [globally], then you can have your cultural belonging” (Lichtenberg 1998, 183, quoted by Tan 2004, 129).

26. For an early statement of this position see Soysal 1994. See, more recently, Bosniak 2006, Song 2009.

27. Our interest here is in authors focusing on the institutional possibility of cosmopolitan citizenship, rather than on authors who use this ideal “to remind citizens of the unfinished moral business of the sovereign state and to draw their attention to the higher ethical aspirations which have yet to be embedded in political life” (Linklater 1999, 36).

28. See also Held 2005.

29. J.S. Mill had already underscored the importance of a common language for a functioning representative government. He explained that if a people “read and speak different languages, the united public opinion, necessary to the working of representative government, cannot exist. The influences which form opinions and decide political acts, are different in the different sections of the country. An altogether different set of leaders have the confidence of one part of the country and of another. The same books, newspapers, pamphlets, speeches, do not reach them. One section does not know what opinions, or what instigations, are circulating in another” (J.S. Mill 1991, 428-429).

30. Recognizing the centrality of language in the structuring and functioning of democracy should not serve as the pretext to reintroduce the view that shared meanings are essential to democratic politics. The language of politics does not have the ‘thickness’ of the more intimate languages of friendship, family and smaller communities. But neither does it have the  ‘thinness’ of business transactions.

31. For a more positive assessment, see Bohman 2004 and 2007.

32. “[T]he more the people are aware of each other's opinions, the stronger the incentive for those who govern to take those opinions into account. When a number of individuals find themselves expressing similar views, each realizes that he is not alone in holding a particular opinion. People who express the same opinion become aware of the similarity of their views, and this gives them capacities for action that would not have been available had they kept that opinion to themselves. The less isolated people feel, the more they realize their potential strength, and the more capable they are to organize themselves and exercise pressure on the government. Awareness of a similarity of views may not always result in organization and action, but it is usually a necessary condition. … [O]ne of the distinguishing features of representative government is the possibility for the governed themselves to become aware of each other's views at any time, independent of the authorities.”

Copyright © 2011 by
Dominique Leydet <>

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