Robin George Collingwood

First published Wed Jan 11, 2006; substantive revision Mon May 17, 2010

R. G. Collingwood (1889–1943) was a British philosopher and practising archaeologist best known for his work in aesthetics and the philosophy of history. During the 1950s and 1960s his philosophy of history in particular occupied centre stage in the debate concerning the nature of explanation in the social sciences and whether or not they are ultimately reducible to explanations in the natural sciences. Primarily through the interpretative efforts of W. H. Dray, Collingwood's work in the philosophy of history came to be seen as providing a powerful antidote against Carl Hempel's claim for methodological unity.

Collingwood is the author of one of the most important treatises in meta-philosophy written in the first half of the twentieth century, An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933), which is a sustained attempt to explain why philosophy is an autonomous discipline with a distinctive method and subject matter that differ from those of the natural and the exact sciences.

He is often described as one of the British Idealists, although the label fails to capture his distinctive kind of idealism, which is conceptual rather than metaphysical. In his correspondence with Gilbert Ryle, Collingwood himself explicitly rejected the label “idealist” because he did not endorse the arch-rationalist assumptions that shaped much British idealism at the end of the 19th and the early part of the 20th century and consequently did not wish to be identified with it.

From the mid-thirties onwards Collingwood's work increasingly engaged in a dialogue with the newly emerging school of analytic philosophy. In An Essay on Metaphysics (1940) he attacked the neo-empiricist assumptions prevalent in early analytic philosophy and advocated a logical/epistemological transformation of metaphysics from a study of being or ontology to a study of the absolute presuppositions or heuristic principles which govern different forms of enquiry. Collingwood thus occupies a distinctive position in the history of British philosophy in the first half of the 20th century. He rejects equally the neo-empiricist assumptions that prevailed in early analytic philosophy and the kind of metaphysics that the analytical school sought to overthrow. His epistemological reform of metaphysics also ensures a distinctive role and subject matter for philosophical enquiry and is thus far from advocating a merely therapeutic conception of philosophy or the dissolution of philosophical into linguistic analysis in the manner of ordinary language philosophy.

See the separate entry for a discussion of Collingwood's aesthetics.

1. Biographical Sketch

R.G. Collingwood was born in Cartmel Fell, Lancashire, at the southern tip of Windermere in 1889. His father, W.G. Collingwood, was an archaeologist, artist, and acted as John Ruskin's private secretary in the final years of Ruskin's life; his mother was also an artist and a talented pianist. When he was two years old the family moved to Lanehead, on the shore of Coniston Water, close to Ruskin's house at Brantwood.

Collingwood was taught at home until the age of thirteen when he went to preparatory school and the following year to Rugby School. In 1908 he went up to University College, Oxford, to read Literae Humaniores. Before his final examinations in 1912 he became a fellow of Pembroke College.

On beginning his philosophical studies he came under the influence of the Oxford realists, especially E.F. Carritt and John Cook Wilson. Until around 1916 he was a professed realist; however, his realism was progressively undermined by his close engagement with continental philosophy, especially the work of Benedetto Croce and Giovanni Gentile. This was partly the result of his friendship with J.A. Smith, Waynflete Professor of Metaphysical Philosophy from 1910 to 1935. In 1913 he published an English translation of Croce's The Philosophy of Giambattista Vico and he was later to translate many other works by both Croce and Guido de Ruggiero, who became a close friend.

Much of Collingwood's early work was in theology and the philosophy of religion, under the influence of the ‘Cumnor Circle’, a group of Church of England modernists. In 1916 he published an essay on ‘The Devil’ in a collection produced by this group, and also his first book Religion and Philosophy.

At the same time he was engaged in serious archaeological work, from 1912 onwards spending his summers directing excavations of Roman sites in the north of England. Although he sometimes described his archaeology as a hobby, he became an authority on the history and archaeology of Roman Britain, conducting many excavations, writing hundreds of papers, and producing books still in use to this day, in particular his work on Roman inscriptions.

In late 1919 he wrote a survey of the history of the ontological proof together with an analysis of the argument. He drew on this in later work, especially in Faith and Reason (1928), An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933) and An Essay on Metaphysics (1940). In 1924 Collingwood wrote Speculum Mentis. This was a dialectic of the forms of experience: art, religion, science, history and philosophy. During this period he was also lecturing on ethics, Roman history, the philosophy of history and aesthetics: his Outlines of a Philosophy of Art (based on his lectures) was published in 1925.

Throughout the 1920s and early 1930s Collingwood was also heavily engaged in historical and archaeological work, publishing The Archaeology of Roman Britain in 1930 and several editions of Roman Britain, the culmination of this work was his survey of Roman Britain in Roman Britain and the English Settlements (1936) and his contribution to Tenney Frank's Economic Survey of Ancient Rome (1937). To add to his self-imposed burden of overwork, his abilities as a polymath (able to read scholarly work in English, French, Spanish, Italian, German, Latin and Greek) were in great demand from 1928 onwards in his capacity as a Delegate to the Clarendon Press.

Partly as a result of serious overwork coupled with insomnia, Collingwood's health went into decline from the early 1930s. In April 1931 he suffered complications arising from chicken pox and began to suffer from high blood pressure. He was granted leave of absence by the university; following his return, in the Autumn of 1932, he began writing an important new book, regarded by many as the pinnacle of his philosophical achievement — An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933). This had its origins in the methodological introduction to the lectures on moral philosophy he had been delivering annually over the preceding decade. It was a sustained investigation into the nature of philosophical reasoning through an examination of the distinctive character of philosophical concepts. Following publication of the Essay, he focused his philosophical energies on the philosophy of history and the philosophy of nature. The lectures he delivered at this time later formed the basis of the posthumously published The Idea of History (1946) and The Idea of Nature (1945).

In 1935 Collingwood succeeded J.A. Smith as Waynflete Professor of Metaphysical Philosophy and moved from Pembroke to Magdalen College. He delivered his inaugural lecture on The Historical Imagination in October of that year. He had been elected as a Fellow of the British Academy in 1934 and delivered his lecture on Human Nature and Human History there in May 1936. These two lectures were later incorporated into The Idea of History.

In 1937 he wrote The Principles of Art; whilst correcting the proofs he suffered a stroke, the first of many to come. From this time onwards he was aware that he was writing on borrowed time. His An Autobiography (1939) records his determination to put on record an account of the work he hoped to do but might not live to complete. During a recuperative voyage to the Dutch East Indies in 1938–9 he wrote An Essay on Metaphysics (1940) and began work on what he regarded as his magnum opus, The Principles of History (not published until 1995). In 1939 he sailed around the Greek islands with a group of Rhodes scholars studying at Oxford, a journey memorably recollected and evoked in The First Mate's Log (1940). On his return to Oxford he lectured on moral and political philosophy and worked at The New Leviathan (1942) which he saw as his contribution to the war effort. He wrote the book against a background of increasingly debilitating strokes.

R.G. Collingwood died in Coniston in January 1943; he was nearly 54. He is buried in Coniston churchyard in an unassuming grave between his parents and John Ruskin. He was succeeded in the Waynflete Chair in 1945 by Gilbert Ryle.

2. Metaphilosophy

2.1 Philosophical Distinctions and the overlap of classes

Collingwood's first mature work, An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933), is a substantial treatise in metaphilosophy which seeks to delineate the subject matter and method of philosophical analysis. Philosophy, according to Collingwood, is a second-order enquiry whose task is to offer a reflection on first-order forms of knowledge. The subject matter of philosophical analysis is thus the fundamental concepts and principles which govern different forms of investigation and define the subject matters of the first-order sciences.

Central to Collingwood's account of philosophical method is the doctrine of the overlap of classes. According to this doctrine, the concepts and principles with which philosophy is concerned allow for complete extensional overlap. Moral philosophers, for example, are concerned with the distinction between dutiful and expedient actions. The distinction between dutiful and expedient actions is not an empirical classification since actions which conform to the principle of utility could also be instances of the principle of duty, and moral philosophers would want to distinguish between such principles even in circumstances where prioritising one principle over the other would make no difference to the action one has to perform. Aesthetic distinctions, like moral ones, are distinctions without a difference. Thus poetry and music may be jointly instantiated in a song but we may still want to distinguish between the lyric and the melody. Philosophical distinctions, in other words, are semantic distinctions to which there may not correspond any empirical difference. The task of the philosopher is precisely to distinguish concepts which coincide in their instances. Philosophical distinctions differ from empirical classifications because the coordinate species of an empirical genus, unlike those of a philosophical one, form mutually exclusive classes. Consider for example the empirical concept “colour” and its coordinate species “red” and “blue”, or the empirical concept “mammal” and its coordinate species “cow” and “goat”. Whilst the principle of duty and that of utility may be jointly instantiated in an action, no object can be both blue and red all over, both a cow and a goat. The concept of the good, unlike the concepts of “colour” or “mammal”, is a philosophical concept whose coordinate species, “duty” and “utility”, may coincide in their instances or overlap extensionally. The mind-body distinction, according to Collingwood, is similar to the distinction between duty and utility; it is a semantic distinction between concepts which coincide in their instances.

Philosophical distinctions, whether they are found in ethics, aesthetics or the philosophy of mind, are semantic distinctions without an empirical difference. This is why what philosophers do differs from what natural scientists do: natural scientists classify, whereas philosophers draw distinctions.

2.2 Philosophical concepts and their justification

The doctrine of the overlap of classes entails, strictly speaking, that there are no such things as ‘examples’ of philosophical concepts. An action performed “out of duty” illustrates the principle of morality, but it is not an example of a moral action in the way in which Dolly is a specimen of a sheep. It follows from this that philosophical concepts cannot be justified empirically precisely because an object which illustrates one concept could also illustrate another, even at the same level of generality. Whilst a geologist may explain and justify the distinction between sedimentary and crystalline rocks by pointing to specimens of these, such an option is not open to the moral philosopher who cannot justify the concept of duty by pointing to instances of dutiful actions because, given the overlap of classes, an action which illustrates the concept of duty could also illustrate that of utility.

The justification for philosophical concepts lies in the fact that they enable us to make crucial distinctions, such as the one between duty and utility, music and poetry, actions and mere bodily movements. The justification of philosophical concepts is accordingly neither inductive nor deductive. It is not inductive because philosophical concepts need to be presupposed in order to make the relevant distinctions. It is not deductive because philosophical concepts do not possess the status of Cartesian first principles on which the edifice of knowledge is deductively built. They are rather more like Kantian categories that are presupposed and implicit in ordinary judgments. To justify a philosophical concept involves regressing from a claim to the conditions of its possibility in the manner of a transcendental argument. Philosophical justification is therefore inevitably in a way circular, since in a regressive argument, unlike a deductive one, the truth of the premises is not established independently of the conclusion. Rather, the entitlement to employ philosophical concepts lies in the fact that they ground our knowledge claims.

2.3 Meaning and truth

According to Collingwood concepts have two aspects, intension and extension. The extension of a concept is the class of objects that it denotes. The intension of a concept is what it means. Collingwood clearly rejects the extensionalist account of concepts developed by Ayer, Russell, and the early Ryle (see below ‘The Reform of Metaphysics and Early Analytic Philosophy’) for he argues that the intension of a concept is not reducible to its extension. As he puts it: “two concepts ‘are the same thing’ in the sense that a thing which exemplifies the one exemplifies the other also, but ‘their being is not the same’ in the sense that being an instance of the one is not the same as being an instance of the other” (EPM, 50). His refusal to define concepts in purely extensional terms is crucial for his account of philosophical concepts because, as we have seen, philosophical distinctions are for him purely semantic in nature. Philosophical concepts do not carve out a segment of reality but rather provide a way of describing it: in its philosophical employment, the concept of action does not distinctively denote a subset of objects, i.e., the deeds performed by animals of the human species, but is rather a way of describing what happens as an expression of rational as opposed to causal processes. Collingwood's account of philosophical distinctions (distinctions to which there may not correspond any empirical differences) and of the task of philosophy (the distinguishing of concepts which coincide in their instances) is thus clearly based on a rejection of a reductively truth-conditional semantics because the meaning of the propositions in which such concepts feature is not reducible to their truth conditions. As we have seen, whilst an empirical concept may be justified extensionally with reference to the class of objects that it denotes, no such justification is available in the case of philosophical concepts.

2.4 The role of philosophical analysis

Philosophy, Collingwood says, “does not, like exact or empirical science, bring us to know things of which we were simply ignorant, but brings us to know in a different way things which we already knew in some way” (EPM, 161). It is the task of philosophical analysis to make explicit principles which are implicit in the practices of first order sciences. Thus, for example, it is the task of a philosophy of history to reflect on the explanatory practices of historians and to tease out the fundamental assumptions that govern them. In Collingwood's understanding, history is a science of the mind or a geisteswissenschaft (see below ‘Mind and Action’) and as such it is to be contrasted with the sciences of nature. The fundamental assumption which governs history, understood as a science of the mind, is the view that what occurs is an expression of rational rather than causal processes and that historical explanations must take the form of rational reconstructions rather than inductive generalisations. Historians are thus committed to the view that “mind exists” in the very specific sense that reality, when viewed from an historical perspective, comprises actions and is to be explained rationally rather than causally. Whilst historians are committed to the view that “mind exists”, natural scientists are similarly committed to the view that “matter exists”. Again, the proposition that “matter exists” is to be understood as stating that reality, when viewed from the perspective of natural science, is comprised of events which are to be explained by the empirical method of observation and inductive generalisation, not by proffering reasons. According to Collingwood, neither the proposition “mind exists” nor the proposition “matter exists” is a metaphysical proposition in the traditional sense. They are not metaphysical propositions because they do not assert the existence of metaphysical kinds (mind and matter) but of the methodological assumptions that govern the study of mind and nature. These propositions are, as Collingwood puts it, philosophical propositions which define the domains of enquiry or subject matters of the science of history and nature. Philosophical propositions, unlike metaphysical propositions, make an epistemological claim, rather than an ontological one. They assert that mind exists for the historian and that matter exists for the natural scientist. Further, philosophical propositions cannot be accommodated within a Humean epistemology since they are neither about relations of ideas nor about matters of fact. They are not propositions about matters of fact because they are not empirically verifiable. They are not propositions about relations of ideas because they are not self- evidently true analytical propositions. Yet although philosophical propositions cannot be accommodated within Humean epistemology, accepting them does not entail a commitment to the metaphysics which Hume wanted to reject. As already mentioned, philosophical propositions are not presented as necessary existential claims but as methodologically necessary ones. Philosophical analysis thus brings us to know “in a different way things which we already knew in some ways” in so far as it enables us to become aware of the assumptions that we implicitly and unselfconsciously make in order to provide radically different and sometimes incompatible descriptions of the same thing.

2.5 The nature of philosophical problems

Collingwood's conception of the subject matter of philosophy (the fundamental principles and concepts which underpin different forms of investigation) and of its task (the distinguishing of concepts that coincide in their instances) entails a particular view of the nature of philosophical problems. Philosophical problems arise because there are certain distinctions which do not map onto the empirical classification of reality. The distinction between mind and matter, as we have seen, is one such distinction, i.e. a distinction without a difference. According to Collingwood this is why we have a problem of mind body dualism, why problems such as that of freedom of the will and determinism, or of the criteria of personal identity versus bodily continuity, arise in the first place. They arise because of our implicit commitment to two concepts, that of mind and matter, which entail a radically different way of looking at the world and of explaining what occurs in it.

To illustrate how Collingwood's doctrine of the overlap of classes affects his view of philosophical problems, let us consider the problem of mind-body dualism as it is discussed in contemporary philosophy of mind. Many contemporary philosophers would endorse the view that in spite of the progress of natural science we have been unable to explain away the mind/body distinction. They may even maintain that the so-called ‘explanatory gap’ is always likely to remain with us. Some contemporary philosophers of mind then try to explain the persistence of the mind-body problem by claiming that there are two radically different modes of access to the mind and the body and, given the ineradicability of these two modes of access, we will continue to have two radically different descriptions of reality. Admittedly, this position bears some surface similarities to that defended by Collingwood, but it is in fact very different. Like many contemporary philosophers of mind, Collingwood holds that the mind/body distinction is ineliminable, but for him such ineliminability is not connected to the existence of different modes of access. It is rather due to the fact that we mean very different things when we speak about mental phenomena than when we speak about physical ones. The explanatory gap, according to Collingwood, is not epistemological but semantic. The resilience of the mind-body problem is thus due not to the ineliminability of two modes of access, but to the ineliminability of the analytic/synthetic distinction. As long as we will make distinctions to which there correspond no empirical differences there will be a role for philosophical analysis. The role of philosophy is to discern different senses even when there is only one referent. Thus moral philosophers distinguish between the principles of duty and that of utility even when there is no difference in the actions one has to perform, and philosophers of mind distinguish between the human being and the person, even if a person and a human being are in another important sense not two different things.

3. Epistemology and Metaphysics

3.1 Metaphysics without ontology

A discussion of epistemological and metaphysical issues would normally comprise two different topics. This is not the case with Collingwood who thought that, in order to be possible, metaphysics should undergo an epistemological reform and be transformed from an ontological enquiry to an enquiry into the heuristic principles which enable us to cognize reality. This is the main gist of what is arguably Collingwood's second major work, An Essay on Metaphysics (1940). Understood as an ontological enquiry or as the study of pure being, metaphysics is not a possible science because it lacks a subject matter of its own. According to Collingwood, a science in the Latin sense of the word scientia must have a method and subject matter of its own. Thus, for example, the study of mind (history) and the study of matter (natural science) are sciences in this sense of the term for they approach reality with a particular set of questions and with a particular set of presuppositions. The historian asks after the motives which inform actions because the goal of the historian is to understand. The natural scientist enquires after constant conjunctions because the goal of the natural scientist is to predict. In order for either form of enquiry to be possible, historians and natural scientists must make different presuppositions about the nature of reality. Historians must assume that the real is rational for otherwise they could not explain what occurs as an expression of rational processes. By contrast, natural scientists must presuppose that nature is uniform, or they would be unable to formulate the inductive generalisations on which their predictions are based. Metaphysics, traditionally understood as an ontological enquiry, possesses no subject matter of its own since it undertakes to carry out a study of what exists without asking any specific questions and making any presuppositions. If therefore metaphysics is to be possible at all, it must be subjected to an epistemological reform; it must take the form not of ontology or a study of pure being, but of a study of the presuppositions that underlie different forms of enquiry.

To illustrate how different disciplines are governed by different sets of presuppositions, Collingwood considers the way in which the term ‘cause’ is employed in the historical sciences and in the practical and theoretical sciences of nature. He speaks of three distinct meanings of the term “cause”. In the historical sciences (sciences which deal with the mind) “that which is caused is the free and deliberate act of a conscious and responsible agent, and causing him to do it means affording him a motive for so doing” (EM, 285). This is what Collingwood calls sense I of the term cause. Secondly, the term cause is used in sense II in the practical sciences of nature, sciences such as medicine and engineering, where “that which is caused is an event in nature and its cause is an event or state of things by producing or preventing which we can produce or prevent that whose cause it is said to be” (EM, 296–7). Finally, the term cause is also employed in sense III in the theoretical sciences of nature where “that which is caused is an event or state of things and its cause is another event or state of things such that (a) if the cause happens or exists, the effect must happen or exist even if no further conditions are fulfilled (b) the effect cannot happen or exist unless the cause happens or exists” (EM, 285–86). When we move from sense I to sense III we effectively remove a teleological framework of explanation. The main difference between sense II and sense III of the term is that whereas in the practical sciences of nature the cause of an event is an antecedent state of affairs considered from the point of view of an interest in controlling and manipulating the natural environment, in the theoretical sciences of nature the causes of natural events are viewed independently of any impact that agents can have on the natural environment: a cause in sense III is unconditional. The main difference between sense I, on the one hand, and sense II and III on the other, is that whereas the practical and theoretical sciences of nature explain the occurrence of events by appealing to empirical regularities, the historical sciences explain actions by ascribing reasons to agents. The natural sciences are concerned with empirical or external relations between events; the historical sciences are concerned with internal, non-empirical relations between actions and the motives/beliefs they express. The term cause in sense I presupposes explanations that appeal to the notion of a practical argument in which the premises function not as antecedent conditions of the action, but as their logical ground. To have the concept of an action, for Collingwood, is to understand how the term cause is employed in sense I.

Collingwood's claim that we are here dealing with three different senses of the term cause is specifically intended to draw attention to the fact that we are providing different kinds of explanations, rather than distinguishing between explanations that have ontological or existential import (causal explanations) and explanations which do not and which are consequently epiphenomenal (mere rationalizations). The refusal to prioritise causation in a single sense, by granting ontological status to explanations employed in the theoretical sciences of nature, reflects Collingwood's attempt to provide an epistemological reform of metaphysics or a “metaphysics without ontology”.

3.2 The reform of metaphysics and early analytic philosophy

Collingwood's epistemological reform of metaphysics was partly developed as an attempt to defend metaphysics against the attacks to which it was subjected by the representatives of early analytic philosophy. It was an attempt to show that metaphysics is possible after all, even if in a highly revised form. Bertrand Russell in The Philosophy of Logical Atomism, Gilbert Ryle in “Systematically Misleading Expressions,” and A. J. Ayer in Language Truth and Logic were united in denouncing metaphysics as a science wedded to the existence of abstract entities such as beauty, goodness etc. Ayer attacked metaphysics by appealing to the verificationist principle according to which only propositions which are empirically verifiable are meaningful. Ryle traced the metaphysical commitment to the existence of abstract entities to a philosophical error induced by the surface grammar of sentences. According to Ryle, the metaphysicians of the past falsely assumed that the structure of language reflects the structure of reality and from this false assumption they inferred that if a noun, such as “beauty”, “virtue” or “punctuality”, occurs in the position of the grammatical subject, it must denote some kind of object.

In An Essay on Metaphysics Collingwood sought to show that, contrary to the prevailing neo-empiricism of the new philosophical climate, there are indeed meaningful propositions which are neither empirically verifiable nor merely analytic. To this end he distinguished between relative and absolute presuppositions. Absolute presuppositions are presuppositions which govern a form of enquiry and make it possible in the first place. Relative presuppositions are presuppositions that are internal to a particular form of enquiry. To illustrate: the statement that the cause of malaria is the bite of a mosquito would be a relative presupposition, but the statement that we can prevent or produce certain effects by preventing or producing their causes is an absolute presupposition of medical science. Relative presuppositions are empirically verifiable since they may be found to be either true or false. Absolute presuppositions are not empirically verifiable because they are neither true nor false, yet must necessarily be presupposed in order to engage in a particular form of enquiry. Absolute presuppositions are neither analytically true, nor are they empirically true or false, and yet they are meaningful. Collingwood thus confronts the principle of verifiability advocated by Ayer in Language, Truth and Logic by producing examples of propositions that are allegedly meaningful and yet express neither relations of ideas nor matters of fact.

Collingwood's reform of metaphysics thus represents a distinctive philosophical position in British philosophy in the first half of the twentieth century. Although he rejects traditional metaphysics, he does not share either the programme of logical positivism or that of ordinary language philosophy. Unlike the logical positivists, Collinwood seeks to defend a third kind of propositions (absolute presuppositions) which are neither analytically nor empirically true. Such propositions express the heuristic principles employed in a particular form of enquiry and are thus methodologically necessary principles. Unlike the Ryle of “Systematically Misleading Expressions,” he believes that, when understood in methodological rather than metaphysical terms, a commitment to the concept of mind and matter are logically necessary if we are to engage in the practice of history and natural science, and not simply errors generated by the surface structure of propositions.

3.3 Realism, idealism and anti-realism

Although Collingwood was a critic of realism, he was often wary of the label idealist. In his correspondence with Ryle he explicitly rejected it. Nonetheless, since he is often described as one of the British idealists, it is important to explain in what sense if any he might legitimately be called an idealist. His reform of metaphysics suggests that he might be more appropriately described as a weak anti-realist rather than as an idealist, since his commitment to idealism is not a commitment to immaterialism, but to the claim that there is no epistemically unmediated access to reality. In other words, the ‘realism’ which constitutes the target of Collingwood's critique is not the ontological thesis that there exist mind independent objects, but the epistemological thesis that there is such a thing as presuppositionless knowledge of reality. Collingwood's rejection of this realism develops out of an attempt to explain how forms of enquiry which make mutually exclusive absolute presuppositions can co-exist alongside one another. His reform of metaphysics entails that ontology or the study of what is must be subordinated to epistemology and thus that the subject matter of different forms of enquiry, such as nature and history, are distinct from one another not in virtue of the entities that they designate but of the way in which they investigate them. The realism that Collingwood attacks seems ill positioned to explain how can there be a distinction in the subject matters of two sciences without there being a distinction in the entities which they investigate.

Collingwood advances one main argument against epistemological realism. This argument is restated in a number of different ways. As we have already seen, in An Essay on Metaphysics, he claims that the idea of presuppositionless knowledge is an oxymoron because there can be no science of pure being; a science of pure being is a science without a subject matter and thus not a science at all. This argument is also developed in An Autobiography (1939) where Collingwood claims that realism is committed to the view that “knowing makes no difference to what is known” and that such a view is self-contradictory since one cannot consistently claim to know an object independently of any other predicate that may be ascribed to it i.e., to know it as merely existing without further qualification. Collingwood's argument against realism is thus a development of the claim that existence is not a real predicate and that as such it fails to describe an object in any way. Objects to which no predicate other than existence is ascribed, are unknown since we cannot say anything about them other than that they are. With this in mind, Collingwood's reluctance to accept the description of his philosophy as idealist may be explained by the fact that his idealism, as a form of epistemological anti-realism, differs significantly from that of British idealists such as Bradley and Bosanquet, who were much more confident in the ability of thought to grasp the ‘ultimate’ nature of reality and whose work has a rationalistic flavour that is absent from Collingwood's philosophising.

4. Mind and Action

4.1 History as the study of Mind

According to Collingwood, the science which is dedicated to the study of mind is history. Collingwood's philosophy of mind and action is thus to be found in his philosophy of history, primarily in The Idea of History (1946) and The Principles of History (1999) both of which were posthumously published. The claim that history is the study of mind is prima facie counter-intuitive because many of us tend to think of history as a descriptive science of the past rather than as a normative science of thought. Collingwood's claim that history is the study of mind is in line with the distinction between the Naturwissenschaften and the and Geisteswissenschaften that is found in continental philosophy of social science. Collingwood arrives at the claim that history is the study of mind by reflecting on what we mean when we use the word ‘history’. He claims that when speaking about history we do not usually mean ‘natural history’. For example, we would not class palaeontology as a historical science. In ordinary usage history tends to be identified not with natural history but with the history of human affairs. Moreover, if we reflect carefully on what we mean by history, we find that we do not mean the history of human beings in so far as they are purely natural beings, but a history of human beings in so far as they are rational beings. There is an evolutionary history of the species homo sapiens, but such a natural history is not what we properly mean when we speak about human history. We tend to identify history in the proper sense with the history of human beings not in so far as they are natural beings but in so far as they are civilized beings:

… a great many things which deeply concern human beings are not, and never have been, traditionally included in the subject-matter of history. People are born, eat and breathe and sleep, and beget children and become ill and recover again, and die; and these things interest them, most of them at any rate, far more than art and science, industry and politics and war. Yet none of these things have been traditionally regarded as possessing historical interest. Most of them have given rise to institutions like dining and marrying and the various rituals that surround birth and death, sickness and recovery; and of these rituals and institutions people write histories; but the history of dining is not the history of eating, and the history of death-rituals is not the history of death. (PH, 46).

The subject matter of history, therefore is provided not by natural but rational processes. As Collingwood puts it, the so-called Res Gestae “are not the actions, in the widest sense of that word, which are done by animals of the species called human; they are actions in another sense of the same word, equally familiar but narrower, actions done by reasonable agents in pursuit of ends determined by their reason.” (PH, 46). History proper, then, is the history of mind.

4.2 Actions and Events

As we have seen, the subject matter of history, understood as a science of the mind, is actions--actions understood not simply as the doings of human beings but of human beings in so far as they are rational. Actions, in the sense in which they constitute the subject matter of historical investigation have an ‘inside’ that events lack. To explain an event all we need to do is to subsume it under a general law that is obtained by inductive generalisation, through the observation of repeated events of type B following events of type A. In order to understand an action, by contrast, we need to render it intelligible by reconstructing the thought processes that inform it. Whereas in event-explanations the relation between the explanans and the explanandum is empirical, in action-explanations the relationship between the explanans and the explanandum is a logical or conceptual relation. To explain an action is not to look for an antecedent condition that, together with a general empirical law, explains the occurrence of an event, it is rather to look for the motive that renders behaviour intelligible and as such more than mere behaviour.

Collingwood's description of actions as having an inside which mere events lack led many of his early commentators to conclude that he believed the distinction between actions and events to be a distinction between inner psychological processes which are inaccessible from a third person perspective and outer bodily movement which are observable form a third person perspective. Collingwood was thus accused of subscribing to what Ryle called the doctrine of the ghost in the machine. Most contemporary commentators, on the other hand, would argue that the inside/outside distinction is not to be taken literally, that it is a mere metaphor intended to draw attention to the fact that the term “because” has different meanings in different explanatory contexts. The distinction between actions and events, far from being a distinction between inner psychological processes and outer bodily movements, is a distinction between the explanatory practices of different sciences. As Collingwood puts it in The New Leviathan (1942), the relationship between the mind and the body “is a relation between the sciences of the body, or natural sciences, and the sciences of the mind; that is the relation inquiry into which ought to be substituted for the make-believe inquiry into the make-believe problem of ‘the relation between body and mind” (NL, 2.49/11). In line with Collingwood's conception of philosophical analysis as a second order enquiry into first order forms of knowledge, it is the task of the philosophy of history to make explicit the explanatory principles that are implicit in the practice of historians. It is also the task of the philosophy of history to detect bad history or explanations that pass themselves as historical whilst they are not. As we have seen, history for Collingwood differs from natural science because in the former as opposed to the latter the relationship between the explanans and the explanandum is logical or conceptual rather than empirical. The question that the genuine historian asks is not “what kind of event usually precedes the event that I am trying to explain?” but “what reasons make the action intelligible?” In other words the historian is concerned with rational connections rather than with inductive generalisations. Further, only to the extent that this point is acknowledged is the study of history genuinely distinct from the study of nature.

Collingwood denounces historians who employ the method of inductive generalisations as writing pseudo-histories. The pseudo history that Collingwood has in mind is of the kind one finds in Hume's account of miracles. According to Hume, a historian who comes across statements which are, in the eyes of the historians, false, should simply discard them. Historians who come across statements asserting the occurrence of miracles should ask themselves whether an inductive generalisation based on their own experience of reality would provide probabilistic evidence for the occurrence of miraculous events. If the experience of the historian fails to provide such probabilistic support, then the historian is justified in deeming the statement false and cutting it from the available evidence. Collingwood calls this kind of history scissors-and-paste history and condemns it as a pseudo history. Genuine history seeks to recover the meaning behind the statements, not whether they are true or false. To recover such meanings historians must try, as far as possible, to bear in mind the epistemic and motivational premises of agents, even when they regard them as false. Thus an historian who comes across a statement claiming that certain agents changed their itinerary in order to avoid crossing mountains inhabited by devils, should not discard the statement as false but rather understand the decision making process in the light of the agent's beliefs, even if these are not shared by the historian. In investigating the actions of historical agents, Collingwood reminds us, historians cannot presuppose that the agents whose actions they are trying to interpret share the same background epistemic premises. Whilst the uniformity of nature is an absolute presupposition of natural science (the assumption that nature is uniform is necessary in order to carry out the inductive generalisations that enable us to predict and control the natural environment), historians cannot presuppose that the agents whose thoughts they are trying to recover share their same background beliefs. The presumption of rationality is a presupposition of historical enquiry; but historians must presuppose that agents are rational not in the substantive sense that they hold true beliefs, but in the more minimal sense that they can infer validly from premises to conclusions and act on the practical syllogism.

4.3 Philosophical hermeneutics and the rejection of psychologism

Collingwood's defence of the autonomy of action explanations and his identification of the historical sciences with a search for meaning has sometimes been compared with the project of philosophical hermeneutics pursued by H. G. Gadamer in Truth and Method. Gadamer himself acknowledged Collingwood's influence in his introduction to the German edition of Collingwood's An Autobiography. Gadamer's philosophical hermeneutics constitutes an attack on psychologism because it refuses to identify meaning with authorial intentions. The meaning of a text, far from being just what's intended by the author, emerges through the process of interpretation. The interpreter brings to this process the fore-conceptions or fore-judgments of his Zeitgeist. In the process of interpretation, these fore-conceptions are tested to see whether they can yield a coherent explanation. If they fail to do so, the interpreter must revise his or her understanding of the text accordingly. Although understanding a text is not a matter of merely imposing one's prejudgments upon it, meaning is ultimately rethought in a new way as the Zeitgeist of the interpreter changes. Gadamer's anti-psychologism thus leads him to the view that the meaning of the text is not only rediscovered by each generation of interpreters; it changes with each generation of interpreters.

Collingwood's philosophy of history shares with Gadamer the view that meaning (in Collingwood's case the meaning of an action rather than a text) is not to be identified with inner psychological processes. An action's meaning is to be found in a publicly re-enactable syllogism. It is because meaning is not a hidden psychological entity that it is inter-subjectively accessible. But although Collingwood, like Gadamer, eschews a psychologistic account of meaning, he does not endorse the quasi-sceptical conclusion according to which the meaning of a text is different for each generation of interpreters. For Collingwood there is such a thing as seeing the world from the agent's point of view. Taking the agent's point of view does not mean entering the agent's mind by some quasi-miraculous telepathic process; it requires rather that we temporarily suspend our own epistemic and motivational premises in order to understand the inferential processes that guide agents with radically different beliefs. Failing to take the agent's epistemic and motivational premises on board leads the historian to write bad historical narratives, the narratives Collingwood refers to as scissors-and-paste histories. Thus, whilst Collingwood's philosophy of history, like Gadamer's philosophical hermeneutics, rejects psychologism, Collingwood, unlike Gadamer is not sceptical about the possibility of reaching inter-generational agreement about the meaning of past actions.

4.4 The argument against methodological unity

The relevance of Collingwood's defence of the autonomy of history to debates about the method and subject matter of the social sciences was brought to the attention of a wider audience by W. H. Dray during the 1950s and 60s. Dray located Collingwood's action/event distinction within the context of contemporary debates in the philosophy of social science and drew on the work of Collingwood to counter the claim for methodological unity advanced by Hempel in his influential 1942 article: “The Function of General Laws in History”. Hempel claimed that explanations in history and the social sciences at large are covertly nomological explanations for historians, just as natural scientists rely upon general laws, even if they do not explicitly mention them. Dray argued that Hempel failed to see that what distinguishes action from event explanations is the nature of the connection between the explanans and the explanandum. In naturalistic explanations the explanans is an antecedent condition, an event which precedes in time the event whose cause it is said to be; in mentalistic explanation the explanans is the logical ground of an action, the motive or thought that renders it intelligible.

Whilst in the 1950s and 60s Collingwood played an important role in the debate about the nature and goal of explanation in the human sciences, his work in the philosophy of history is now very rarely mentioned. This is probably due to two factors. First, the publication of Davidson's seminal 1963 essay “Actions. Reasons and Causes” brought about a paradigm shift in the way the action/event distinction was understood. Prior to Davidson's essay, the consensus was that the philosophical issue at stake in the action/event distinction was a conceptual one: “what does it mean to explain something as an action?” “What does it mean to explain something as an event?”. After Davidson, the consensus has been that the philosophical question raised by the action/event distinction is not conceptual but metaphysical: “how can action explanations co-exist alongside event explanations?” Discussions of the action/event distinction have accordingly tended to focus not on methodological issues but on the problem of causal over-determination. The relative neglect in which Collingwood's philosophy of history has fallen may also be due to the fact that as the discussion of the action/event distinction moved from a methodological to a metaphysical plane, it has tended to occur in the philosophy of mind and action rather than in the philosophy of social science. In spite of this neglect Collingwood's philosophy of history articulates a non-causalist position that is relevant to the reasons versus causes debate in its contemporary incarnation.

4.5 Reasons and causes

According to Collingwood the distinction between reasons and causes is a distinction between different forms of explanations (rational and causal explanations), not a distinction between mere elucidation and causation. In contemporary philosophy of mind and action the reasons/causes distinction is taken to be a distinction between explanations that have ontological or metaphysical import and explanations which do not. By contrast, in line with his project of developing a metaphysics without ontology, Collingwood does not construe the distinction between reasons and causes in this way. This is why in An Essay on Metaphysics he describes the distinction between these different kinds of explanations as employing different senses of the term cause: reasons and causes are species of the same philosophical genus, “explanation”, and as such they can coincide in their instances. Thus, what could be described by the natural scientist as the movement of the biceps could be described by the historian as an action embodying a motive, e.g. opening a window. The action and the bodily movement are ontologically the same but conceptually distinct. Collingwood's distinction between actions and events in the philosophy of history thus rests on an endorsement of the overlap of classes as outlined in his earlier treatise in meta-philosophy.

It is important to point out that the dual aspect theory that lies at the basis of Collingwood's action/event distinction differs substantially from the dual aspect theories developed in the twentieth century by Davidson and like-minded non-reductive physicalists wedded to a theory of mind-body supervenience. For the latter there is a kind of explanation that is metaphysically basic (causal explanation). Reasons are thus said to be causes only in so far as the actions which they elucidate are re-described as events. For Collingwood, by contrast, there is no level of explanation that has ontological primacy because all explanations, including causal explanations, are relative to subject matter. Collingwood's dual aspect theory, like Davidson's, rejects ontological or substance dualism, but Collingwood's non-reductivism, unlike Davidson's, is grounded not in a theory of supervenience which grants ontological priority to the explanatory framework of natural science but in a metaphysically neutral monism grounded in his epistemological reform of metaphysics. Collingwood thus occupies what may be referred to as a pre-Davidsonian position in the reasons versus causes debate. His non-reductivism in the philosophy of action bears a greater resemblance to that defended by Von Wright (1971), F. Stoutland (1976) and, more recently, T. Burge (1993) and L. Rudder Baker (1993), than to that of D. Davidson.

4.6 Re-enactment

One of the best-known aspects of Collingwood's philosophy of history is his account of re-enactment. Collingwood's account of re-enactment is developed in answer to the question “what does it mean to understand historically?” Historical understanding differs from explanation in natural science because historians do not formulate empirical hypotheses but think through the actions of historical agents in order to make them intelligible.

One of the most discussed aspects of Collingwood's account of re-enactment is the claim that when historians re-enact the thought of an historical agent, they do not re-enact a thought of a similar kind but the very same thought of the agent. This claim has often been regarded as counterintuitive since to say that the thought of the agent and that of the historian are the same appears to presuppose that there is only one rather than two numerically distinct acts of thought, that of the historian and that of the agent. Collingwood's point, however, is that, since thought proper is conceptually distinct from the physiological process in which it is instantiated, the criterion of numerical identity that is usually applied to physiological processes is not applicable to thought. Thoughts, in other words, are to be distinguished on the basis of purely qualitative criteria, and if there are two people entertaining the (qualitatively) same thought, there is (numerically) only one thought since there is only one propositional content. Collingwood makes this point by saying that “… in its immediacy, as an actual experience of his own, Plato's argument must undoubtedly have grown up out of a discussion of some sort, though I do not know what it was, and been closely connected to such a discussion. Yet if I not only read his argument but understand it, follow it in my own mind re-enacting it with and for myself, the process of argument which I go through is not a process resembling Plato's, it is actually Plato's so far as I understand him correctly. ” (IH, 301) As the last clause in the sentence makes clear, Collingwood's account of re-enactment is designed to establish a conceptual point about what thought is and a related point about the criteria for identifying and distinguishing thoughts, not a method for the recovery of past thoughts. The doctrine of re-enactment has, however, often been read as an attempt to establish a methodological as opposed to a conceptual point. Thus, in the aftermath of the publication of The Idea of History, the re-enactment doctrine was widely associated with Dilthey's account of empathetic understanding and accused of ascribing to the historian telepathic powers of access to other minds. On the conceptual reading the re-enactment doctrine establishes merely that it is possible in principle to re-enact the thoughts of others because thoughts, unlike physiological processes, are not private items unique to the person who has them, but publicly rethinkable propositional contents. It may be important to draw attention to the fact that if the point of the re-enactment doctrine is conceptual rather than methodological, then Collingwood's project differs substantially from that of contemporary simulation theorists and that it is inappropriate to champion him as a forefather for this project (Davies and Stone, 2000).

4.7 Re-enactment, radical interpretation and radical translation

The question that Collingwood asks — how is it possible to understand the thoughts of agents who lived in a distant past? — bears some surface similarities to the question asked by Davidson  (2001) and Quine, namely, “how is it possible to understand agents whose language is radically alien to us?” But despite surface similarities there are key differences between Collingwood's account of re-enactment and the accounts of radical interpretation and radical translation as found in the work of Davidson and Quine respectively. Collingwood believes that in order to understand the thoughts of historical agents the historian must suspend his own beliefs and temporarily adopt those of the agents, even if they are deemed to be false. As we have seen in the context of Collingwood's critique of pseudo histories, such as scissors-and-paste history, historians must be sensitive to the fact that historical agents may not share their own epistemic beliefs, indeed, that many beliefs that are logically efficacious, and that render the actions of historical agents intelligible, may well be false. On Davidson's and Quine's accounts, by contrast, the interpreter/translator must assume the speakers of the (alien) language to hold broadly true beliefs. The so-called principle of charity is a pre-condition of radical interpretation/translation. Davidson's and Quine's accounts of radical interpretation/translation thus indirectly rest on the endorsement of a kind of truth conditional semantics. Whereas meaning and truth are intimately tied in Davidson's and Quine's accounts of radical interpretation/translation, they are separated in Collingwood's account of re-enactment. For Collingwood, understanding the difference between truth and meaning is the starting point for acknowledging the autonomy of the sciences which study the mind.

5. Interpretative Problems

5.1 Historicism and the ‘radical conversion’ hypothesis

One main point of contention in Collingwood scholarship is whether Collingwood's epistemological reform of metaphysics was also intended as a ‘historicist’ revision of this science. The question is important because if this were indeed the case, then Collingwood would effectively be advocating a naturalization of epistemology. The question as to whether Collingwood advocated a reduction of philosophy to history arises primarily because of a number of passages in An Essay on Metaphysics which have a decidedly historicist flavour. Collingwood says, for example, that it is the task of metaphysics to study what different people believed in different periods of time. Such claims are clearly different in character from those found elsewhere in the book where he identifies metaphysics without ontology not with a genetic enquiry, but with the normative task of discovering the logical ground on which our claims rest. On this view the task of the metaphysician is to show what our presuppositions logically commit us to believe, rather than what people believe as a matter of historical fact. The accusation of historicism is usually levelled against Collingwood's later work (An Autobiography, An Essay on Metaphysics) and it is thus concluded that his philosophy underwent a radical change of direction. In his earlier work (paradigmatically An Essay on Philosophical Method) he seems to conceive of philosophy as a normative activity and thus as distinct from the descriptive enquiry of natural science, whereas in his later years he appears to retract this claim. The hypothesis of a radical conversion to historicism was first advanced by Malcom Knox in the editorial introduction to the posthumously published The Idea of History. It was also endorsed by early commentators such as A. Donagan and N. Rotenstreich. The expression “radical conversion hypothesis”, however, was actually coined by Rubinoff (1966) who along with many others nonetheless rejected it as an adequate description of Collingwood's position.

5.2 The ontological argument and the Collingwood-Ryle correspondence

One of the most baffling aspects of Collingwood's work is his allegiance to the ontological proof. Collingwood's interest in the ontological argument spans his entire career. He wrote extensively on the ontological proof in 1919 and both of his major works, An Essay on Philosophical Method (1933) and An Essay on Metaphysics (1940), contain substantial and sympathetic discussions of it. Collingwood's rehabilitation of the ontological argument is baffling because it seems to be incompatible both with the doctrine of the overlap of classes as developed in An Essay on Philosophical Method and with the project of providing a metaphysics without ontology in the form of a theory of absolute presuppositions in An Essay on Metaphysics. It is incompatible with the doctrine of the overlap of classes because this doctrine entails that philosophical concepts are to be understood in purely intensional terms. Collingwood's sympathetic treatment of the ontological argument is also clearly incompatible with the project of developing a metaphysics without ontology, precisely because a metaphysics of absolute presuppositions is concerned with methodologically necessary claims, not with ontologically necessary truths. Collingwood's emotional attachment to the ontological proof, therefore, is problematic whether one interprets his epistemological reform of metaphysics as remaining loyal to the idea of epistemology as a normative enquiry or whether one believes that Collingwood sought to develop an historicist epistemology that rejects a conception of philosophy as ‘first science’.

Collingwood's discussion of the ontological argument in An Essay on Philosophical Method gave rise to a lively epistolary exchange with Ryle in 1935. The correspondence was triggered by the publication of an article in Mind by Ryle which clearly attacked Collingwood's sympathetic appraisal of the ontological proof on the grounds that there are no such things as propositions which are necessary and existential, i.e., no such things as metaphysical propositions, like that asserting the necessary existence of God. Ryle's main reason for rejecting the ontological proof lies in the endorsement of the Humean fork, according to which there are only two kinds of propositions, propositions concerning relations of ideas, which are necessary and hypothetical, and propositions concerning matters of fact, which are existential and contingent. In the correspondence Collingwood replies to Ryle by claiming that that there is a third kind of proposition, propositions which employ philosophical concepts. Such propositions are necessary but not merely hypothetical because they are necessarily instantiated in the judgments employed by the practitioners of a given science. The concept of mind, for example, necessarily exists for historians because when we try to understand an action historically, we understand it as an expression of mind or of a rational process. In other words, the concept of mind is necessarily instantiated in the reconstruction of every occurrence as an action. The historian presupposes it every time he or she reconstructs what occurs as intelligent behaviour. This is why, Collingwood claims, there is a kernel of truth in the ontological argument that is worth restating, even if we must accept that the ontological argument is incapable of establishing either the necessary existence of God or that of any other entity. It simply involves the claim that there are concepts which cannot be verified empirically and which are nonetheless necessary in order to make empirical knowledge claims in any given area of enquiry. The main bone of contention in the correspondence between Ryle and Collingwood is thus not strictly speaking the ontological argument in its traditional form, but whether or not there is a third kind of propositions which are neither about relations of ideas nor about matters of fact, but are “synthetic a priori” in the sense that they express methodologically necessary claims rather than existentially necessary ones.

Ryle and Collingwood often talk at cross purposes. Ryle refuses to acknowledge that the ontological proof could properly be interpreted as Collingwood suggests, i.e., as an argument which establishes purely methodological claims. Collingwood, for his part, instead of seeking to establish the point that there are methodologically necessary propositions identifiable independently of the ontological proof, continues to try to salvage the proof by providing an epistemologically implausible reading of it. The correspondence is nonetheless very interesting for it offers a window onto the origins of early analytic philosophy. Early analytic philosophers such as Ryle, Ayer and Russell, rejected the metaphysical project, a project which they associated with classical rationalism and its revival at the hands of Hegel and the British Idealists. But not only did early analytic philosophers reject this kind of metaphysics, they also refused to acknowledge the possibility of another kind of metaphysics, a ‘metaphysics of experience’ or what Collingwood calls, in An Essay on Metaphysics, a metaphysics of absolute presuppositions. Ryle's refusal to accept Collingwood's revision of the ontological argument may therefore be merely a foil for a commitment to a Humean epistemology and an unwillingness to acknowledge anything other than relations of ideas and matters of fact. If this is the case then the Collingwood-Ryle correspondence, in spite of the misunderstandings it involved, clearly reveals some of the issues which truly troubled philosophers in the first half of the twentieth century.

5.3 Intellectual influences and affiliations

Another problem of interpretation which has been at the centre of recent scholarship concerns the issue of intellectual influences. Which thinkers exercised a major influence on Collingwood? Was it the Italian idealists? Was it Hegel or was it Kant? Collingwood was reading Kant's Groundwork by the time he was eight years old and it seems very possible that his reading of Kant's moral philosophy informed, however indirectly, his own reflections on ethics and the repeated drafting of the introductions to his lectures on moral philosophy, introductions which eventually took on a life of their own and became An Essay on Philosophical Method. Collingwood's work is full of implicit and explicit references, both sympathetic and unsympathetic, to Hegel, which show he had read his work carefully. And he was also familiar with the work of Italian idealists such as Croce, De Ruggiero and Gentile. The relationship of Collingwood's philosophy to Italian idealism has been relatively under-explored. The issue of Collingwood's relation to Hegel has been the subject of a recent monograph by Gary Browning (Browning 2004), which argues for a strong Hegelian influence against the neo-Kantian reading of D'Oro (D'Oro 2002). The issue of Collingwood's relationship to Kant and Hegel is complex, but important since it forces us to reflect carefully on the precise nature of Collingwood's ‘idealism’, whether Collingwood's idealism is, like Kant's, a merely conceptual idealism, committed to developing a metaphysics without ontology, or whether it stands nearer to the absolute idealism of Hegel, and is thus ultimately continuous with the project of classical rationalism, as his fondness for the ontological proof has led some to suspect.

Bibliography

Primary Literature

Collingwood's Published Works

[RP] Religion and Philosophy, London: Macmillan Press, 1916.
[SM] Speculum Mentis, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1924.
[EPM] An Essay on Philosophical Method, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1933; revised edition, with an introduction by James Connelly and Giuseppina D'Oro, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.
[PA] The Principles of Art, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1938.
[AA] An Autobiography, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1939.
[EM] An Essay on Metaphysics, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1940; revised edition, with an introduction by Rex Martin, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998.
[NL] The New Leviathan, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1942; revised edition, edited and introduced by David Boucher, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.
[IN] The Idea of Nature, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1945.
[IH] The Idea of History, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1946; revised edition, with an introduction by Jan Van der Dussen, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1993.
[EPP] Essays in Political Philosophy, D. Boucher (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
[PH] The Principles of History, W. H. Dray and Jan Van der Dussen (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.
[PE] The Philosophy of Enchantment, David Boucher, Wendy James and Philip Smallwood (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2005.

Collingwood's Unpublished Manuscripts

Several of Collingwood's manuscripts have been published alongside new or recent re-editions of his work, notably, The Idea of History (edited by J. Van der Dussen), The Principles of History (edited by W.H. Dray and J. Van der Dussen), The New Leviathan (edited by D. Boucher), An Essay on Metaphysics (edited by R. Martin), An Essay on Philosophical Method (edited by J. Connelly and G. D'Oro) and The Philosophy of Enchantment (edited by David Boucher, Wendy James and Philip Smallwood). However, a significant number of Collingwood's manuscripts are still unpublished. They are deposited in the Bodleian library where copies of the originals can be viewed on microfilm. The originals can also be consulted with the permission of R.G. Collingwood's daughter, Teresa Smith. Of particular relevance amongst the unpublished materials are the 1919 Lectures on the Ontological Proof, the Central Problems of Metaphysics and the Lectures on Moral Philosophy. The first is a substantial and quite polished discussion of the ontological argument (almost 100 pages), the second is also a very substantial piece dealing with the realism/idealism antinomy. The material on moral philosophy is very extensive. Collingwood wrote and rewrote the Lectures on Moral Philosophy through the 1920s and very early 30s. Each time he added a methodological introduction. The methodological introductions eventually took on a life of their own and they were eventually published as An Essay on Philosophical Method in 1933. The 1929 and 1932 versions of the methodological introductions deserve a special mention as they shed a great deal of light on Collingwood's conception of philosophical method.

For a complete list of the unpublished manuscripts by R. G. Collingwood see C. Dreisbach, R. G. Collingwood: A Bibliographical Checklist, Bowling Green, Ohio: The Philosophy Documentation Center, 1993. The following is a very selective list of material which is still unpublished and is currently available in the Bodleian library.

1919 Lectures on the Ontological Proof of the Existence of God, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 2.
1923 Lectures on Moral Philosophy Collingwood dep 3.
1928? Commentary on the preface to the Critique of Pure Reason, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 22/4.
1929 Lectures on Moral Philosophy, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 10.
1932 Lectures on Moral Philosophy, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 10.
1933 Lectures on Moral Philosophy, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 8.
1935 The Central Problems of Metaphysics: Realism and Idealism, Bodleian library, Collingwood dep. 20/1.

Secondary Literature

Main Commentaries

  • Boucher, D., 1989, The Social and Political Thought of R. G. Collingwood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Browning, G., 2004, Rethinking R. G. Collingwood, Basingstoke: Palgrave and New York: Palgrave.
  • Connelly, J., 2003, Metaphysics, Method and Politics: The Political Philosophy of R.G. Collingwood, Exeter: Imprint Academic.
  • Donagan, A., 1962, The Later Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • D'Oro, G., 2002, Collingwood and the Metaphysics of Experience, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Dray, W. H., 1957, Laws and Explanation in History, London: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1995, History as Re-enactment: R. G. Collingwood's Idea of History, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Martin, R., 1977, Historical Explanation: Re-enactment and Practical Inference, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Mink, L. O., 1987, Mind, History and Dialectic, Bloomington: University of Indiana Press, 1969; republished by Middletown Conn.
  • Rubinoff, L., 1970, Collingwood and the Reform of Metaphysics: a Study in the Philosophy of Mind, Toronto: University of Toronto Press.
  • Saari, H., 1984, Re-Enactment: A Study in R.G. Collingwood's Philosophy of History, (Acta Academiae Aboensis, Ser. A, Vol. 63, No. 2), Abo: Abo Akademi.
  • Van der Dussen, J., 1981, History as a Science: the Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff publishers.

Secondary and Cited Sources

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  • –––, 1989, The Social and Political Thought of R. G. Collingwood, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
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  • –––, 1995, “The Principles of History and the Cosmology Conclusion to The Idea of Nature”, Collingwood Studies, 2: 140–170.
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  • Cebick, L. B., 1970, “Collingwood: Action, Re-enactment and Evidence”, Philosophical Forum, 2: 68–90.
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  • –––, 1990b, “Metaphysics and Method: A Necessary Unity in the Philosophy of R. G. Collingwood”, in Storia, Antropologia e Scienze del Linguaggio, 5 (1–2): 33–156 (Rome: Bulzoni editore).
  • –––, 1995, “Art Thou the Man? Croce, Gentile or De Ruggiero”, in Philosophy, History and Civilization: Essays on R.G. Collingwood, J. Connelly, T. Modood and D. Boucher (eds.), Cardiff: University of Wales Press, 1995, pp. 92–114.
  • –––, 1997a, “Art, Magic and Propaganda in The Principles of Art”, in J. Stanyer & G. Stoker (eds.), Contemporary Political Studies (Volume 2), Nottingham: Political Studies Association, pp. 850–861.
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  • –––, 1998, “Natural Science, History and Christianity: the Origins of Collingwood's Later Metaphysics”, Collingwood Studies IV, 1998, pp.101–132.
  • –––, 2002, “A Mistake in the Interpretation of Collingwood”, Collingwood and British Idealism Studies, IX: 72–9.
  • ––– 2005a, “The Hesitant Hegelian: Collingwood, Hegel and inter-war Oxford”, Hegel Society Bulletin, 51-52: 57–73.
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Acknowledgments

In this coauthored entry, Section 1 (Biographical Sketch) was contributed by James Connelly, while the rest of the entry was written by Giuseppina D'Oro.

Copyright © 2010 by
Giuseppina D'Oro <g.d'oro@keele.ac.uk>
James Connelly <J.Connelly@hull.ac.uk>

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