Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Proposition 2.17

Proposition 2.17 (Aumann 1976)
Let M be the meet of the agents' partitions Hi for each iN. A proposition E ⊆ Ω is common knowledge for the agents of N at ω iff M(ω) ⊆ E. In Aumann (1976), E is defined to be common knowledge at ω iff M(ω) ⊆ E.

(⇐) By Lemma 2.16, M( ω ) is common knowledge at ω, so E is common knowledge at ω by Proposition 2.4.

(⇒) We must show that K*N(E) implies that M(ω) ⊆ E. Suppose that there exists ω′ ∈ M(ω) such that ω′ ∉ E. Since ω′ ∈ M(ω), ω′ is reachable from ω, so there exists a sequence 0, 1, … , m−1 with associated states ω1, ω2, … , ωm and information sets Hikk) such that ω0 = ω, ωm = ω′, and ωkHikk+1). But at information set Hikm), agent ik does not know event E. Working backwards on k, we see that event E cannot be common knowledge, that is, agent i1 cannot rule out the possibility that agent i2 thinks that … that agent im−1 thinks that agent im does not know E. □

Return to Common Knowledge

Copyright © 2013 by
Peter Vanderschraaf <>
Giacomo Sillari <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free

The SEP would like to congratulate the National Endowment for the Humanities on its 50th anniversary and express our indebtedness for the five generous grants it awarded our project from 1997 to 2007. Readers who have benefited from the SEP are encouraged to examine the NEH’s anniversary page and, if inspired to do so, send a testimonial to