Notes to Communitarianism

1. Both Taylor and Walzer identify themselves as liberals in Gutmann 1992. MacIntyre (1991) says ‘In spite of rumors to the contrary, I am not and never have been a communitarian’. Sandel (1998) uses the label republican rather than communitarian.

2. This essay draws on the threefold distinction in Bell 1993. For a similar threefold distinction, see Caney 1992. But for an expanded fivefold classification of arguments, see Mulhall & Swift 1996.

3. This is the language Rawls employs on the last page of the first edition of Rawls 1971.

4. This section draws on the introduction to Bell 2000. Another challenge to Western-style liberal-democracy has of course been mounted by Islamic civilization, though Islamic countries have not been as economically and politically successful (compared to East Asia) and therefore fail to pose as significant a challenge the claims of Western liberal-democrats that only capitalism and liberal democracy can cope with the requirements of modernity.

5. Quoted in the International Herald Tribune, 9-10 November 1991.

6. Quoted in Barbara Crossette, ‘U.N. Survey Finds Rich-Poor Gap Widening’, New York Times, 15 July 1996.

7. Interestingly, this moral outlook still seems to inform the practices of Asian immigrants to other societies. According to the New York Times (11 July 2001), fewer than one in five whites in the US help care or provide financial support for their parents, in-laws or other relatives, compared with 28% of African-Americans, 34% of Hispanic-Americans and 42% of Asian-Americans. Those who provide the most care also feel the most guilt that they are not doing enough. Almost three-quarters of Asian-Americans say they should do more for their parents, compared with two-thirds of Hispanics, slightly more than half the African-Americans and fewer than half the whites.

8. According to Abdullahi An-Naim (1992, p.34), however, the prerequisite conditions for the enforcement of this punishment are extremely difficult to realize in practice and are unlikely to materialize in any Muslim country in the foreseeable future.

9. This section draws on Acts I and III of Bell 1993.

10. The liberal-communitarian debate over the self has been prominent in non-anglophone publications, however, see e.g., Qiang 1998, chs.5-6. It is also interesting to note that adherents of Confucianism have recently advanced arguments against liberal foundations similar to the claims of 1980s communitarians, also with the apparent aim of undermining the foundations of liberal rights. Joseph Chan (1999) reviews these arguments and finds them wanting, with the proviso that Confucianisms understanding of the scope and justification of rights would differ from Western, rights-based perspectives.

11. For book-length treatments of communitarian politics in the US, see, Etzioni 1993, 1996, and 2001. For a book that derives largely from the UK context see Tam 1998. See also Etzioni's edited books, 1995a, 1995b, and 1998.

12. Both Democrats and Republicans have been receptive to communitarian political ideas. The political theorist William Galston, a co-editor of The Responsive Community and author of Liberal Purposes (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), was President Clinton's Domestic Policy Adviser. Shortly after taking office, President Bush unveiled a four-year Communities of Character project that was developed following consultations with Etzioni (Washington Post, 29 July 2001). See also Dana Milbank, ‘Is Bush a Communitarian?’, The Responsive Community (Spring 2001), pp.4-7.

After the September 11th terrorist attacks, the Bush administration cancelled this initiative on the grounds that it was no longer necessary since Americans were supposed to have ‘rediscovered’ civic virtue. Several years later, however, the darker and more pessimistic ‘security first’ vision of the Bush administration had the effect of putting on hold any communitarian initiatives. The Bush administration is often criticized for having undermined international good-will after September 11th, but they did the same to civic virtue at home. Perhaps the Obama administration will help to revive civic virtue.

13. This section draws on Acts III to V Bell 1993. See also Mason 2000. Mason usefully distinguishes between different levels and kinds of communities, though one can question his argument that the ideal of global community is coherent in principle and useful in practice (in my view, communities are particularistic in nature and presume an inside/outside distinction. Even if Mason's ideal is coherent, it is unclear to what extent the ideal of community does much work for defenders of universal liberal principles and global institutions).

14. Though conceptions of the family can also include an imagined component for example, the widespread practice of ancestor worship in East Asian societies with a Confucian heritage suggests that (deceased) ancestors are considered as ongoing participants in the good of the family.

15. For a contrasting account, see Rosenblum 1998, ch.4.

16. Frug 1999, pp.152-53. For an account of an actual example of diverse, mixed-income and mixed race urban housing project that contrasts with homogenous, upper-class walled communities, see D'Antonio 1994.

17. See Bell 1995, for a critique of Etzioni's apparent assumption that rights and particularistic communal commitments always conflict.

18. This argument is developed at length in Bell 2000, ch.4. In the same vein, see Chua 1995, esp. ch.9.

19. These trends have continued, if not “worsened”. In 2001, the veteran opposition leader J.B. Jeyaratnam was declared bankrupt and had to forfeit his Parliamentary seat.

20. Straits Times (Singapore), 11 July 1993.

21. The Singapore state, it must be said, resorts to endlessly creative tactics to curb opposition attempts to reach out to the electorate and communicate alternative ideas and policies. The opposition Singapore Democratic Party was informed by the Singapore police that it needed to engage 13 officers for crowd control purposes for a planned national day rally on 26 August 2001, amounting to several thousand dollars. One wonders if the ruling Peoples Action Party needs to pay for its own security for its rallies (not to mention the question of who pays for the undercover officers at opposition rallies).

22. But for more positive views on the role of the family in contemporary Korean society, see Hahm 2003 and Helgesen 2003.

23. The need for freedom, arguably, is only instrumentally valuable: to the extent we need freedom, it is a means to achieve the things we really care about. Our ties to family, friends, nation, and religion are often the things people really care about, ends regarded as crucial for human flourishing that are not simply valuable because they are means of obtaining other things. In that sense, the need for community is more valuable than the need for freedom.

24. The work of Philip Selznick also points to the importance of context for normative thinking: see Krygier 2002.

Copyright © 2012 by
Daniel Bell <>

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