# Computability and Complexity

*First published Thu Jun 24, 2004; substantive revision Wed Sep 2, 2015*

A mathematical problem is *computable* if it can be solved in
principle by a computing device. Some common synonyms for
“computable” are “solvable”,
“decidable”, and “recursive”. Hilbert believed
that all mathematical problems were solvable, but in the 1930’s
Gödel, Turing, and Church showed that this is not the case. There
is an extensive study and classification of which mathematical
problems are computable and which are not. In addition, there is an
extensive classification of computable problems into computational
complexity classes according to how much computation—as a
function of the size of the problem instance—is needed to
answer that instance. It is striking how clearly, elegantly, and
precisely these classifications have been drawn.

- 1. What can be computed in principle? Introduction and History
- 2. Turing Machines
- 3. Primitive Recursive Functions
- 4. Computational Complexity: Functions Computable in Practice
- Bibliography
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. What can be computed in principle? Introduction and History

In the 1930’s, well before there were computers, various mathematicians from around the world invented precise, independent definitions of what it means to be computable. Alonzo Church defined the Lambda calculus, Kurt Gödel defined Recursive functions, Stephen Kleene defined Formal systems, Markov defined what became known as Markov algorithms, Emil Post and Alan Turing defined abstract machines now known as Post machines and Turing machines.

Surprisingly, all of these models are exactly equivalent: anything computable in the lambda calculus is computable by a Turing machine and similarly for any other pairs of the above computational systems. After this was proved, Church expressed the belief that the intuitive notion of “computable in principle” is identical to the above precise notions. This belief, now called the “Church-Turing Thesis”, is uniformly accepted by mathematicians.

Part of the impetus for the drive to codify what is computable came
from the mathematician David Hilbert. Hilbert believed that all of
mathematics could be precisely axiomatized. He felt that once this was
done, there would be an “effective procedure”, i.e., an algorithm that
would take as input any precise mathematical statement, and, after a
finite number of steps, decide whether the statement was true or false.
Hilbert was asking for what would now be called a *decision
procedure* for all of mathematics.

As a special case of this decision problem, Hilbert considered the
validity problem for first-order logic. First-order logic is a
mathematical language in which most mathematical statements can be
formulated. Every statement in first-order logic has a precise meaning
in every appropriate logical structure, i.e., it is true or false in
each such structure. Those statements that are true in every
appropriate structure are called *valid*. Those statements that
are true in some structure are called *satisfiable*. Notice that
a formula, \(\varphi\), is valid iff its negation, \(\neg \varphi\), is not
satisfiable.

Hilbert called the validity problem for first-order logic, the
*entscheidungsproblem*. In a textbook, *Principles of
Mathematical Logic* by Hilbert and Ackermann, the authors wrote,
“The Entscheidungsproblem is solved when we know a procedure that
allows for any given logical expression to decide by finitely many
operations its validity or satisfiability.… The
entscheidungsproblem must be considered the main problem of
mathematical logic.” (Böerger, Grädel, & Gurevich
1997).

In his 1930 Ph.D. thesis, Gödel presented a complete
axiomatization of first-order logic, based on the *Principia
Mathematica* by Whitehead and Russell (Gödel 1930). Gödel proved his
Completeness Theorem, namely that a formula is provable from the axioms
if and only if it is valid. Gödel’s Completeness theorem was a
step towards the resolution of Hilbert’s
*entscheidungsproblem*.

In particular, since the axioms are easily recognizable, and rules
of inference very simple, there is a mechanical procedure that can list
out all proofs. Note that each line in a proof is either an axiom, or
follows from previous lines by one of the simple rules. For any given
string of characters, we can tell if it is a proof. Thus we can
systematically list all strings of characters of length 1, 2, 3, and so
on, and check whether each of these is a proof. If so, then we can add
the proof’s last line to our list of theorems. In this way, we can list
out all theorems, i.e., exactly all the valid formulas of first-order
logic, can be listed out by a simple mechanical procedure. More
precisely, the set of valid formulas is the range of a computable
function. In modern terminology we say that the set of valid formulas
of first-order logic is *recursively enumerable (r.e.)*.

Gödel’s Completeness theorem was not sufficient, however, to
give a positive solution to the *entscheidungsproblem*. Given a
formula, \(\varphi\), if \(\varphi\) is valid then the above procedure would
eventually list it out and thus could answer, “Yes, \(\varphi\) is valid.”
However, if \(\varphi\) were not valid then we might never find this fact
out. What was missing was a procedure to list out all the non-valid
formulas, or equivalently to list out all satisfiable formulas.

A year later, in 1931, Gödel shocked the mathematical world by proving his Incompleteness Theorem: there is no complete and computable axiomatization of the first-order theory of the natural numbers. That is, there is no reasonable list of axioms from which we can prove exactly all true statements of number theory (Gödel 1931).

A few years later, Church and Turing independently proved that the
*entscheidungsproblem* is unsolvable. Church did this by using
the methods of Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorem to show that the set
of satisfiable formulas of first-order logic is not r.e., i.e., they
cannot be systematically listed out by a function computable by the
lambda calculus. Turing introduced his machines and proved many
interesting theorems some of which we will discuss in the next section.
In particular, he proved the unsolvability of the *halting
problem*. He obtained the unsolvability of the
*entscheidungsproblem* as a corollary.

Hilbert was very disappointed because his program towards a decision procedure for all of mathematics was proved impossible. However, as we will see in more detail in the rest of this article, a vast amount was learned about the fundamental nature of computation.

## 2. Turing Machines

In his 1936 paper, “On Computable Numbers, with an Application to the Entscheidungsproblem”, Alan Turing introduced his machines and established their basic properties.

He thought clearly and abstractly about what it would mean for a machine to perform a computational task. Turing defined his machines to consist of the following:

- a finite set, \(Q\), of possible states, because any device must be in one of finitely many possible states;
- a potentially infinite tape, consisting of consecutive cells,
\(\sigma_{1}, \sigma_{2}, \sigma_{3}\), from
some finite alphabet, \(\Sigma\);

\((\Sigma\) may be any finite set containing at least two symbols. It is convenient to fix \(\Sigma = \{0, 1, b\}\) consisting of the binary alphabet plus the blank cell symbol. We usually assume that a finite initial segment of the tape contains binary symbols, and the rest is blank.) - a read/write tape head, \(h \ge 1\), scanning tape cell \(\sigma_{h}\); and finally,
- a transition function, \(\delta : Q \times \Sigma \rightarrow Q \times \Sigma \times \{-1,0,1\}\).

(The meaning of the transition function is that from any given state, \(q\), looking at any given symbol, \(\sigma_{h}, \delta\) tells us the new state the machine should enter, the new symbol that should be written in the current square, and the new head position, \(h' = h + d\), where \(d \in \{-1,0,1\}\) is the displacement given by \(\delta\).)

The linear nature of its memory tape, as opposed to random access memory, is a limitation on computation speed but not power: a Turing machine can find any memory location, i.e., tape cell, but this may be time consuming because it has to move its head step by step along its tape.

The beauty of Turing machines is that the model is extremely simple, yet nonetheless, extremely powerful. A Turing machine has potentially infinite work space so that it can process arbitrarily large inputs, e.g., multiply two huge numbers, but it can only read or write a bounded amount of information, i.e., one symbol, per step. Even before Turing machines and all the other mathematical models of computation were proved equivalent, and before any statement of the Church-Turing thesis, Turing argued convincingly that his machines were as powerful as any possible computing device.

### 2.1 Universal Machines

Each Turing machine can be uniquely described by its transition
table: for each state, \(q\), and each symbol, \(\sigma ,
\delta(q,\sigma)\) is the new state, the new symbol, and the
head displacement. These transition tables, can be written as a finite
string of symbols, giving the complete set of instructions of each
Turing machine. Furthermore, these strings of symbols can be listed in
lexicographic order as follows: \(M_{1},
M_{2}, M_{3},\ldots\), where
\(M_{i}\) is the transition table, i.e., the complete set
of instructions, for Turing machine number \(i\). The transition
table for \(M_{i}\) is the program for Turing machine
\(i\), or more simply, the \(i\)^{th} program.

Turing showed that he could build a Turing machine, \(U\), that
was *universal*, in the sense that it could run the program of
any other Turing machine. More explicitly, for any \(i\), and any
input \(w, U\) on inputs \(i\) and \(w\) would
do exactly what \(M_{i}\) would do on input \(w\), in
symbols,

Turing’s construction of a universal machine gives the most fundamental insight into computation: one machine can run any program whatsoever. No matter what computational tasks we may need to perform in the future, a single machine can perform them all. This is the insight that makes it feasible to build and sell computers. One computer can run any program. We don’t need to buy a new computer every time we have a new problem to solve. Of course, in the age of personal computers, this fact is such a basic assumption that it may be difficult to step back and appreciate it.

### 2.2 The Halting Problem

Because they were designed to embody all possible computations, Turing machines have an inescapable flaw: some Turing machines on certain inputs never halt. Some Turing machines do not halt for silly reasons, for example, we can mis-program a Turing machine so that it gets into a tight loop, for example, in state 17 looking at a 1 it might go to state 17, write a 1 and displace its head by 0. Slightly less silly, we can reach a blank symbol, having only blank symbols to the right, and yet keep staying in the same state, moving one step to the right, and looking for a “1”. Both of those cases of non-halting could be easily detected and repaired by a decent compiler. However, consider the Turing machine \(M_{F}\), which on input “0”, systematically searches for the first counter-example to Fermat’s last theorem, and upon finding it outputs the counter-example and halts. Until Andrew Wiles relatively recently proved Fermat’s Last Theorem, all the mathematicians in the world, working for over three centuries, were unable to decide whether or not \(M_{F}\) on input “0” eventually halts. Now we know that it never does.

### 2.3 Computable Functions and Enumerability

Since a Turing machine might not halt on certain inputs, we have to be careful in how we define functions computable by Turing machines. Let the natural numbers, \(\mathbf{N}\), be the set \(\{0,1,2,\ldots \}\) and let us consider Turing machines as partial functions from \(\mathbf{N}\) to \(\mathbf{N}\).

Let \(M\) be a Turing machine and \(n\) a natural number.
We say that \(M\)’s tape *contains* the number
\(n\), if \(M\)’s tape begins with a binary
representation of the number \(n\) (with no unnecessary leading
0’s) followed by just blank symbols from there on.

If we start the Turing machine \(M\) on a tape containing
\(n\) and it eventually halts with its tape containing \(m\),
then we say that \(M\) on input \(n\), computes \(m:
M(n) = m\). If, when we start \(M\) on
input \(n\), it either never halts, or when it halts, its tape
does not contain a natural number, e.g., because it has leading 0’s, or
digits interspersed with blank symbols, then we say that
\(M(n)\) is undefined, in symbols: \(M(n)
=\nearrow\).
We can thus
associate with each Turing machine, \(M\), a *partial*
function, \(M: \mathbf{N} \rightarrow \mathbf{N} \cup \{\nearrow\}\). We say that
the function \(M\) is *total* if for all
\(n\in \mathbf{N}\), M\((n) \in \mathbf{N}\), i.e., M\((n)\) is always defined.

Now we can formally define what it means for a set to be
*recursively enumerable* (r.e.) which we earlier described
informally. Let \(S \subseteq \mathbf{N}\). Then \(S\)
is r.e. if and only if there is some Turing machine, \(M\), such
that \(S\) is the image of the function computed by \(M\), in
symbols,

Thus, \(S\) is r.e. just if it can be listed out by some Turing machine. Suppose that \(S\) is r.e. and its elements are enumerated by Turing machine \(M\) as above. We can then describe another Turing machine, \(P\), which, on input \(n\), runs \(M\) in a round-robin fashion on all its possible inputs until eventually \(M\) outputs \(n\). If this happens then \(P\) halts and outputs “1”, i.e., \(P(n)=1\). If \(n \not\in S\), then \(M\) will never output \(n\), so \(P(n)\) will never halt, i.e., \(P(n)=\nearrow\).

Let the notation \(P(n)\downarrow\) mean that Turing
machine \(P\) on input \(n\) eventually halts. For a Turing
machine, \(P\), define \(L(P)\), the *set
accepted by* \(P\), to be those numbers \(n\) such that
\(P\) on input \(n\) eventually halts,

The above argument shows that if a set \(S\) is r.e. then it is accepted by some Turing machine, \(P\), i.e., \(S = L(P)\). The converse of this statement holds as well. That is, \(S\) is r.e. if and only if it is accepted by some Turing machine, \(P\).

We say that a set, \(S\), is *decidable* if and only if there
is a total Turing machine, \(M\), that decides for all \(n \in
\mathbf{N}\) whether or not \(n \in S\). Think of “1” as
“yes” and “0” as “no”. For all
\(n\in \mathbf{N}\), if \(n \in S\), then \(M(n) = 1\), i.e., \(M\) on
input \(n\) eventually halts and outputs “yes”, whereas if
\(n \not\in S\), then \(M(n) = 0\), i.e., \(M\) on input \(n\)
eventually halts and outputs “no”. Synonyms for decidable
are:
*computable*, *solvable*, and *recursive*.

For \(S \subseteq \mathbf{N}\), the *complement* of
\(S\) is \(\mathbf{N} - S\), i.e., the set of all
natural numbers not in \(S\). We say that the set \(S\) is
*co-r.e.* if and only if its complement is r.e. If a set,
\(S\), is r.e. and co-r.e. then we can list out all of its
elements in one column and we can list out all of its non-elements in a
second column. In this way we can decide whether or not a given
element, \(n\), is in \(S\): just scan the two columns and
wait for \(n\) to show up. If it shows up in the first column then
\(n \in S\). Otherwise it will show up in the second
column and \(n \not\in S\).
In fact, a set is recursive iff it is r.e. and co-r.e.

### 2.4 The Unsolvability of the Halting Problem

Turing asked whether every set of natural numbers is decidable. It is easy to see that the answer is, “no”, by the following counting argument. There are uncountably many subsets of \(\mathbf{N}\), but since there are only countably many Turing machines, there can be only countably many decidable sets. Thus almost all sets are undecidable.

Turing actually constructed a non-decidable set. As we will see, he did this using a diagonal argument. The diagonal argument goes back to Georg Cantor who used it to show that the real numbers are uncountable. Gödel used a similar diagonal argument in his proof of the Incompleteness Theorem in which he constructed a sentence, \(J\), in number theory whose meaning could be understood to be, “\(J\) is not a theorem.”

Turing constructed a diagonal halting set, \(K\), as follows:

\[ K = \{n \mid M_{n}(n)\downarrow \}. \]That is, \(K\) consists of those Turing machines that eventually halt when input their own programs.

It is not hard to see that \(K\) is r.e. Suppose for the sake of a contradiction that \(K\) is also co-r.e., and let \(d\) be the number of a Turing machine that accepts the complement of \(K\). That is, for any \(n\),

\[ n \not\in K \Leftrightarrow M_{d}(n)\downarrow \]But consider what happens when we substitute \(d\) for \(n\) in the above equation:

\[ d \not\in K \Leftrightarrow M_{d}(d)\downarrow. \]However, the definition of \(K\) tells us that:

\[ d \in K \Leftrightarrow M_{d}(d)\downarrow . \]Thus we have that

\[ d \in K \Leftrightarrow d \not\in K, \]which is a contradiction. Thus our assumption that \(K\) is co-r.e. is false. Thus \(K\) is not recursive. It follows that it is not a computable problem to be given a Turing machine and its input and to decide whether or not the Turing machine will eventually halt on that input, i.e., the halting problem is unsolvable.

## 3. Primitive Recursive Functions

We next define the class of *Primitive Recursive Functions*.
This is a very interesting class of functions defined by Gödel as
part of his proof of the Incompleteness Theorem. We are interested in
functions \(f\) from \(\mathbf{N}^{r}\) to
\(\mathbf{N}\), for \(r = 0, 1, 2,\ldots\) . Here
\(r\) is called the arity of the function \(f\), i.e., the
number of arguments that it takes. Gödel started with three very
simple functions, the initial functions, and two natural closure
operations, composition and primitive recursion, each of which take
some already defined functions and use them to define a new one. We
next explain his definitions in detail. This section is technical and
can be safely skipped. The important idea is that the primitive
recursive functions comprise a very large and powerful class of
computable functions, all generated in an extremely simple way.

We begin with the three *initial* primitive recursive
functions:

- \(\zeta\), the zero function of arity \(0, \zeta\)( ) \(= 0\);
- \(\eta\), the identity function of arity \(1, \eta(n) = n\); and,
- \(\sigma\), the successor function of arity \(1, \sigma(n) = n +1\).

Now consider the following two operations:

**Composition**: if \(f\) is a primitive recursive function of arity \(a\), and \(g_{1}, \ldots ,g_{a}\) are primitive recursive functions of arities \(r_{1}, \ldots ,r_{a}\), and \(k\in \mathbf{N}\), then the following is a primitive recursive function of arity \(k\): \[ h(x_{1}, \ldots ,x_{k}) = f(g_{1}(w_{1}), \ldots ,g_{a}(w_{a})), \]where each \(w_{i}\) is a list of \(r_{i}\) arguments, perhaps with repetition, from \(x_{1}, \ldots ,x_{k}\); and,

**Primitive recursion**: if \(f\) and \(g\) are primitive recursive functions of arity \(k\) and \(k+2\), respectively, then there is a primitive recursive function, \(h\), of arity \(k+1\) satisfying the following conditions: \[\begin{align} h(0,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}) &= f(x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}); \text{ and,} \\ h(n+1,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}) &= g(h(n,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}), n,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}). \end{align}\]

Here composition is the natural way to combine functions, and primitive recursion is a restricted kind of recursion in which \(h\) with first argument \(n+1\) is defined in terms of \(h\) with first argument \(n\), and all the other arguments unchanged.

Define the *primitive recursive functions* to be the smallest
class of functions that contains the Initial functions and is closed
under Composition and Primitive Recursion. The set of primitive
recursive functions is equal to the set of functions computed using
bounded iteration (Meyer & Ritchie 1967), i.e. the set of
functions definable in the language Bloop from (Hofstadter 1979).

The primitive recursive functions have a very simple definition and yet they are extremely powerful. Gödel proved inductively that every primitive recursive function can be simply represented in first-order number theory. He then used the primitive recursive functions to encode formulas and even sequences of formulas by numbers. He finally used the primitive recursive functions to compute properties of the represented formulas including that a formula was well formed, a sequence of formulas was a proof, and that a formula was a theorem.

It takes a long series of lemmas to show how powerful the primitive recursive functions are. The following are a few examples showing that addition, multiplication, and exponentiation are primitive recursive.

Define the addition function, \(P(x,y)\), as follows:

\[\begin{align} P(0,y) &= \eta(y) \\ P(n+1,y) &= \sigma(P(n,y)) \end{align}\](Note that this fits into the definition of primitive recursion because the function \(g(x_{1},x_{2},x_{3}) = \eta(\sigma(x_{1}))\) is definable from the initial functions \(\eta\) and \(\sigma\) by composition.)

Next, define the multiplication function, \(T(x,y)\), as follows:

\[\begin{align} T(0,y) &= \zeta(\ ) \\ T(n+1,y) &= P(T(n,y),y). \end{align}\]Next, we define the exponential function, \(E(x,y)\). (Usually \(0^{0}\) is considered undefined, but since primitive recursive functions must be total, we define \(E\)(0,0) to be 1.) Since primitive recursion only allows us to recurse on the first argument, we use two steps to define the exponential function:

\[\begin{align} R(0,y) &= \sigma(\zeta(\ )) \\ R(n+1,y) &= T(R(n,y),y). \end{align}\]Finally we can define \(E(x,y) = R(\eta(y),\eta(x))\) by composition. (Recall that \(\eta\) is the identity function so this could be more simply written as \(E(x,y) = R(y,x)\).)

The exponential function, \(E\), grows very rapidly, for example, \(E\)(10,10) is ten billion, and \(E\)(50,50) is over \(10^{84}\) (and thus significantly more than the estimated number of atoms in the universe). However, there are much faster growing primitive recursive functions. As we saw, \(E\) was defined from the slowly growing function, \(\sigma\), using three applications of primitive recursion: one for addition, one for multiplication, and then one more for exponentiation. We can continue to apply primitive recursion to build a series of unimaginably fast growing functions. Let’s do just one more step in the series defining the hyper-exponential function, \(H(n,m)\) as 2 to the 2 to the 2 to the … to the \(m\), with a tower of \(n\) 2s. \(H\) is primitive recursive because it can be defined from \(E\) using one more application of primitive recursion:

\[\begin{align} H(0,y) &= y \\ H(n+1,y) &= E(2,H(n,y)) \end{align}\]Thus \(H(2,2) = 2^{4} = 16, H(3,3) = 2^{256}\) is more than \(10^{77}\) and comparable to the number of atoms in the universe. If that’s not big enough for you then consider \(H(4,4)\). To write this number in decimal notation we would need a one, followed by more zero’s than the number of particles in the universe.

### 3.1 Recursive Functions

The set of primitive recursive functions is a huge class of computable functions. In fact, they can be characterized as the set of functions computable in time that is some primitive recursive function of \(n\), where \(n\) is the length of the input. For example, since \(H(n,n)\) is a primitive recursive function, the primitive recursive functions include all of TIME[\(H(n,n)\)]. (See the next section for a discussion of computational complexity, including TIME.) Thus, the primitive recursive functions include all functions that are feasibly computable by any conceivable measure of feasible, and much beyond that.

However, the primitive recursive functions do not include all functions computable in principle. To see this, we can again use diagonalization. We can systematically encode all definitions of primitive recursive functions of arity 1, calling them \(p_{1}, p_{2}, p_{3}\), and so on.

We can then build a Turing machine to compute the value of the following diagonal function, \(D(n) = p_{n}(n) + 1\).

Notice that \(D\) is a total, computable function from \(\mathbf{N}\) to \(\mathbf{N}\), but it is not primitive recursive. Why? Suppose for the sake of a contradiction that \(D\) were primitive recursive. Then \(D\) would be equal to \(p_{d}\) for some \(d\in \mathbf{N}\). But it would then follow that

\[ p_{d}(d) = p_{d}(d) +1, \]which is a contradiction. Therefore, \(D\) is not primitive recursive.

Alas, the above diagonal argument works on any class of total functions that could be considered a candidate for the class of all computable functions. The only way around this, if we want all functions computable in principle, not just in practice, is to add some kind of unbounded search operation. This is what Gödel did to extend the primitive recursive functions to the recursive functions.

Define the unbounded minimization operator, \(\mu\), as follows. Let \(f\) be a perhaps partial function of arity \(k+1\). Then \(\mu[f\)] is defined as the following function of arity k. On input \(x_{1}, \ldots ,x_{k}\) do the following:

For \(i = 0\) to \(\infty\) do \(\{\)

if \(f(i,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}) = 1\), then output \(i\)

\(\}\)

Thus if \(f(i,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k}) = 1\), and for all \(j \lt i, f(j,x_{1},\ldots ,x_{k})\) is defined, but not equal to 1, then \(\mu [f](x_{1}, \ldots ,x_{k}) = i\). Otherwise \(\mu[f](x_{1}, \ldots ,x_{k})\) is undefined.

Gödel defined the set of *Recursive functions* to be the
closure of the initial primitive recursive functions under composition,
primitive recursion, and \(\mu\) . With this definition, the Recursive
functions are exactly the same as the set of partial functions
computable by the Lambda calculus, by Kleene Formal systems, by Markov
algorithms, by Post machines, and by Turing machines.

## 4. Computational Complexity: Functions Computable in Practice

During World War II, Turing helped design and build a specialized computing device called the Bombe at Bletchley Park. He used the Bombe to crack the German “Enigma” code, greatly aiding the Allied cause [Hodges, 1992]. By the 1960’s computers were widely available in industry and at universities. As algorithms were developed to solve myriad problems, some mathematicians and scientists began to classify algorithms according to their efficiency and to search for best algorithms for certain problems. This was the beginning of the modern theory of computation.

In this section we are dealing with complexity instead of computability, and all the Turing machines that we consider will halt on all their inputs. Rather than accepting by halting, we will assume that a Turing machine accepts by outputting “1” and rejects by outputting “0”, thus we redefine the set accepted by a total machine, \(M\),

\[ L(M) = \{n \mid M(n) = 1\}. \]The time that an algorithm takes depends on the input and the machine on which it is run. The first important insight in complexity theory is that a good measure of the complexity of an algorithm is its asymptotic worst-case complexity as a function of the size of the input, \(n\).

For an input, \(w\), let \(n = \lvert w\rvert\) be the length of
\(w\). Following [Hartmanis, 1989] we say that a Turing machine
\(M\) *runs in time* \(T(n)\) if for all \(w\) of length \(n,
M(w)\) takes at most \(T(n)\) steps and then halts. This is called
worst-case complexity because \(T(n)\) must be as large as the time
taken by any input of length \(n\).

For any function \(T : \mathbf{N} \rightarrow \mathbf{N}\), let

\[ \TIME[T(n)] = \{ A \mid A = L(M) \text{ for some } M \text{ that runs in time } T(n)\}. \]Alan Cobham and Jack Edmonds identified the complexity class, \(\P\), of problems recognizable in some polynomial amount of time, as being an excellent mathematical wrapper of the class of feasible problems—those problems all of whose moderately-sized instances can be feasibly recognized,

\[ \P = \bigcup_{i=1,2,\ldots} \TIME[n^{i}] \]Any problem not in \(\P\) is certainly not feasible. On the other hand, natural problems that have algorithms in \(\P\), tend to eventually have algorithms discovered for them that are actually feasible.

Many important complexity classes besides P have been defined and studied; a few of these are \(\NP\), \(\PSPACE\), and \(\EXPTIME\). \(\PSPACE\) consists of those problems solvable using some polynomial amount of memory space. \(\EXPTIME\) is the set of problems solvable in time \(2^{p(n)}\) for some polynomial, \(p\).

Perhaps the most interesting of the above classes is NP:
nondeterministic polynomial time. The definition comes not from a real
machine, but rather a mathematical abstraction. A nondeterministic
Turing machine, \(N\), makes a choice (guess) of one of two
possible actions at each step. If, on input \(w\), some sequence
of these choices leads to acceptance, then we say that
\(\mathbf{N}\) accepts \(w\), and we say the
*nondeterministic time* taken by \(\mathbf{N}\) on input
\(w\), is just the number of steps taken in the sequence that
leads to acceptance. A nondeterministic machine is not charged for all
the other possible choices it might have made, just the single sequence
of correct choices.

NP is sometimes described as the set of problems, \(S\), that have short proofs of membership. For example, suppose we are given a list of \(m\) large natural numbers: \(a_{1}, \ldots ,a_{m}\), and a target number, \(t\). This is an instance of the Subset Sum problem: is there a subset of the \(m\) numbers whose sum is exactly \(t\)? This problem is easy to solve in nondeterministic linear time: for each \(i\), we guess whether or not to take \(a_{i}\). Next we add up all the numbers we decided to take and if the sum is equal to \(t\) then accept. Thus the nondeterministic time is linear, i.e., some constant times the length of the input, \(n\). However there is no known (deterministic) way to solve this problem in time less than exponential in \(n\).

There has been a large study of algorithms and the complexity of
many important problems is well understood. In particular reductions
between problems have been defined and used to compare the relative
difficulty of two problems. Intuitively, we say that \(A\) is
*reducible* to \(B\) \((A \le B)\) if there
is a simple transformation, \(\tau\), that maps instances of \(A\) to
instances of \(B\) in a way that preserves membership, i.e.,
\(\tau\)(w) \(\in B \Leftrightarrow\) w \(\in A\).

Remarkably, a high percentage of naturally occurring computational problems turn out to be complete for one of the above classes. (A problem, \(A\), is complete for a complexity class \(C\) if \(A\) is a member of \(C\) and all other problems \(B\) in \(C\) are no harder than \(A\), i.e., \(B \le A\). Two complete problems for the same class have equivalent complexity.)

The reason for this completeness phenomenon has not been adequately explained. One plausible explanation is that natural computational problems tend to be universal in the sense of Turing’s universal machine. A universal problem in a certain complexity class can simulate any other problem in that class. The reason that the class NP is so well studied is that a large number of important practical problems are NP complete, including Subset Sum. None of these problems is known to have an algorithm that is faster than exponential time, although some NP-complete problems admit feasible approximations to their solutions.

A great deal remains open about computational complexity. We know that strictly more of a particular computational resource lets us solve strictly harder problems, e.g. \(\TIME[n]\) is strictly contained in \(\TIME[n^{1.01}]\) and similarly for \(\SPACE\) and other measures. However, the trade-offs between different computational resources is still quite poorly understood. It is obvious that \(\P\) is contained in \(\NP\). Furthermore, \(\NP\) is contained in \(\PSPACE\) because in \(\PSPACE\) we can systematically try every single branch of an \(\NP\) computation, reusing space for the successive branches, and accepting if any of these branches lead to acceptance. \(\PSPACE\) is contained in \(\EXPTIME\) because if a \(\PSPACE\) machine takes more than exponential time, then it has exactly repeated some configuration so it must be in an infinite loop. The following are the known relationships between the above classes:

\[ \P \subseteq \NP \subseteq \PSPACE \subseteq \EXPTIME \]However, while it seems clear that \(\P\) is strictly contained in \(\NP\), that \(\NP\) is strictly contained in \(\PSPACE\), and that \(\PSPACE\) is strictly contained in \(\EXPTIME\), none of these inequalities has been proved. In fact, it is not even known that \(\P\) is different from \(\PSPACE\), nor that \(\NP\) is different from \(\EXPTIME\). The only known proper inclusion from the above is that \(\P\) is strictly contained in \(\EXPTIME\). The remaining questions concerning the relative power of different computational resources are fundamental unsolved problems in the theory of computation.

There is an extensive theory of computational complexity. This entry briefly describes the area, putting it into the context of the question of what is computable in principle versus in practice. For readers interested in learning more about complexity, there are excellent books, for example, [Papadimitriou, 1994] and [Arora and Barak, 2009]. There is also the entry on Computational Complexity Theory.

### 4.1 Significance of Complexity

The following diagram maps out all the complexity classes we have discussed and a few more as well. The diagram comes from work in Descriptive Complexity [Immerman, 1999] which shows that all important complexity classes have descriptive characterizations. Fagin began this field by proving that NP = SO\(\exists\), i.e., a property is in NP iff it is expressible in second-order existential logic [Fagin, 1974].

Vardi and the author of this entry later independently proved that P = FO(LFP): a property is in P iff it is expressible in first-order logic plus a least fixed-point operator (LFP) which formalizes the power to define new relations by induction. A captivating corollary of this is that P = NP iff SO = FO(LFP). That is, P is equal to NP iff every property expressible in second order logic is already expressible in first-order logic plus inductive definitions. (The languages in question are over finite ordered input structures. See [Immerman, 1999] for details.)

The World of Computability and Complexity

The top right of the diagram shows the recursively enumerable (r.e.) problems; this includes r.e.-complete problems such as the halting problem (Halt). On the left is the set of co-r.e. problems including the co-r.e.-complete problem \(\overline{{\rm Halt}}\) -- the set of Turing Machines that never halt on a given input. We mentioned at the end of Section 2.3 that the intersection of the set of r.e problems and the set of co-r.e problems is equal to the set of Recursive problems. The set of Primitive Recursive problems is a strict subset of the Recursive problems.

Moving toward the bottom of the diagram, there is a region marked with a green dotted line labelled “truly feasible”. Note that this is not a mathematically defined class, but rather an intuitive notion of those problems that can be solved exactly, for all the instances of reasonable size, within a reasonable amount of time, using a computer that we can afford. (Interestingly, as the speed of computers has dramatically increased over the years, our expectation of how large an instance we should be able to handle has increased accordingly. Thus, the boundary of what is “truly feasible” changes more slowly than the increase of computer speed might suggest.)

As mentioned before, P is a good mathematical wrapper for the set of feasible problems. There are problems in P requiring \(n^{1,000}\) time for problems of size \(n\) and thus not feasible. Nature appears to be our friend here, which is to say naturally occurring problems in P favor relatively simple algorithms, and “natural” problems tend to be feasible. The number of steps required for problems of size \(n\) tends to be less than \(c n^k\) with small multiplicative constants \(c\), and very small exponents, \(k\), i.e., \(k\leq 2\).

In practice the asympototic complexity of naturally occurring problems tends to be the key
issue determining whether or not they are feasible. A problem with complexity \(17n\) can be handled
in under a minute on modern computers, for *every* instance of size a billion. On the other hand, a
problem with worst-case complexity \(2^n\) cannot be handled in our lifetimes for *some* instance of
size a hundred.

Remarkably, natural problems tend to be complete for important complexity classes, namely the ones in the diagram and only a very few others. This fascinating phenomenon means that algorithms and complexity are more than abstract concepts; they are important at a practical level. We have had remarkable success in proving that our problem of interest is complete for a well-known complexity class. If the class is contained in P, then we can usually just look up a known efficient algorithm. Otherwise, we must look at simplifications or approximations of our problem which may be feasible.

There is a rich theory of the approximability of NP optimization problems (See [Arora & Barak, 2009]). For example, the Subset Sum problem mentioned above is an NP-complete problem. Most likely it requires exponential time to tell whether a given Subset Sum problem has an exact solution. However, if we only want to see if we can reach the target up to a fixed number of digits of accuracy, then the problem is quite easy, i.e., Subset Sum is hard, but very easy to approximate.

Even the r.e.-complete Halting problem has many important feasible subproblems. Given a program, it is in general not possible to figure out what it does and whether or not it eventually halts. However, most programs written by programmers or students can be automatically analyzed, optimized and even corrected by modern compilers and model checkers.

The class NP is very important practically and philosophically. It is the class of problems, \(S\), such that any input \(w\) is in \(S\) iff there is a proof, \(p(w)\), that \(w\in S\) and \(p(w)\) is not much larger than \(w\). Thus, very informally, we can think of NP has the set of intellectual endeavors that may be in reach: if we find the answer to whether \(w \in S\), we can convince others that we have done so.

The boolean satisfiability problem, SAT, was the first problem proved NP complete [Cook, 1971], i.e., it is a hardest NP problem. The fact that SAT is NP complete means that all problems in NP are reducible to SAT. Over the years, researchers have built very efficient SAT solvers which can quickly solve many SAT instances -- i.e., find a satisfying assignment or prove that there is none -- even for instances with millions of variables. Thus, SAT solvers are being used as general purpose problem solvers. On the other hand, there are known classes of small instances for which current SAT solvers fail. Thus part of the P versus NP question concerns the practical and theoretical complexity of SAT [Nordström, 2015].

## Bibliography

- Arora, Sanjeev and Boaz Barak, 2009,
*Computational Complexity: A Modern Approach*, New York: Cambridge University Press. - Church, Alonzo, 1933, “A Set of Postulates for the
Foundation of Logic (Second Paper)”,
*Annals of Mathematics*(Second Series), 33: 839–864. - –––, 1936, “An Unsolvable Problem of Elementary Number
Theory,”
*American Journal of Mathematics*, 58: 345–363.. - –––, 1936, “A Note on the Entscheidungsproblem,”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 1: 40–41; correction 1, 101–102. - Böerger, Egon, Erich Grädel, and Yuri Gurevich, 1997,
*The Classical Decision Problem*, Heidelberg: Springer. - Cobham, Alan, 1964, “The Intrinsic Computational Difficulty of
Functions,”
*Proceedings of the 1964 Congress for Logic, Mathematics, and Philosophy of Science*, Amsterdam: North-Holland 24–30. - Cook, Stephen, 1971, “The Complexity of Theorem Proving
Procedures,”
*Proceedings of the Third Annual ACM STOC Symposium*, Shaker Heights, Ohio, 151–158. - Davis, Martin, 2000,
*The Universal Computer: the Road from Leibniz to Turing*, New York: W. W. Norton & Company. - Edmonds, Jack, 1965, “Paths, Trees and Flowers,”
*Canadian Journal of Mathematics*, 17: 449–467. - Enderton, Herbert B., 1972,
*A Mathematical Introduction to Logic*, New York: Academic Press. - Fagin, Ronald, 1974, “Generalized First-Order Spectra and
Polynomial-Time Recognizable Sets,” in
*Complexity of Computation*, R. Karp(ed.),*SIAM-AMS Proc*, 7: 27–41. - Garey, Michael and David S. Johnson, 1979,
*Computers and Intractability*, New York: Freeman. - Gödel, Kurt, 1930, “The Completeness of the Axioms of the Functional Calculus,” in van Heijenoort 1967, 582–591.
- –––, 1931, “On Formally Undecidable Propositions of Principia Mathematica and Related Systems I,” in van Heijenoort, 1967, 592–617.
- Hartmanis, Juris, 1989, “Overview of computational Complexity
Theory” in J. Hartmanis (ed.),
*Computational Complexity Theory*, Providence: American Mathematical Society, 1–17. - Hilbert and Ackermann, 1928/1938,
*Grundzüge der theoretischen Logik*, Springer. English translation of the 2nd edition:*Principles of Mathematical Logic*, New York: Chelsea Publishing Company, 1950. - Hodges, Andrew, 1992,
*Alan Turing: the Enigma*, London: Random House. - Hofstadter, Douglas, 1979,
*Gödel, Escher, Bach: an Eternal Golden Braid*, New York: Basic Books. - Hopcroft, John E., 1984, “Turing Machines”,
*Scientific American*, 250(5): 70–80. - Immerman, Neil, 1999,
*Descriptive Complexity*, New York: Springer. - Karp, Richard, 1972, “Reducibility Among Combinatorial Problems”, in
*Complexity of Computations*, R.E. Miller and J.W. Thatcher (eds.), New York: Plenum Press, 85–104. - Kleene, Stephen C., 1935, “A Theory of Positive Integers in
Formal Logic,”
*American Journal of Mathematics*, 57: 153–173, 219–244. - –––, 1950,
*Introduction to Metamathematics*, Princeton: Van Nostrand. - Levin, Leonid, 1973, “Universal search
problems,”
*Problemy Peredachi Informatsii*, 9(3): 265–266; partial English translation in B.A.Trakhtenbrot, 1984, “A Survey of Russian Approaches to Perebor (Brute-force Search) Algorithms,”*IEEE Annals of the History of Computing*, 6(4): 384–400. - Markov, A.A., 1960, “The Theory of
Algorithms,”
*American Mathematical Society Translations*(Series 2), 15: 1–14. - Meyer, Albert and Dennis Ritchie, 1967, “The Complexity of
Loop Programs.”
*Proc. 22nd National ACM Conference*, Washington, D.C., 465–470. - Nordström, Jakob, 2015 “On the Interplay Between Proof Complexity and SAT Solving,” SIGLOG News, 2(3):18–44.
- Papadimitriou, Christos H., 1994,
*Computational Complexity*, Reading, MA: Addison-Wesley. - Péter, Rózsa. 1967,
*Recursive Functions*, translated by István Földes, New York: Academic Press. - Post, Emil, 1936, “Finite Combinatory Processes – Formulation I”
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 1: 103–105. - Rogers, Hartley Jr., 1967,
*Theory of Recursive Functions and Effective Computability*, New York: McGraw-Hill. - Turing, A. M., 1936–7, “On Computable Numbers, with an Application
to the Entscheidungsproblem”,
*Proceedings of the London Mathematical Society*, 2(42): 230–265 [Preprint available online]. - van Heijenoort, Jean , ed., 1967,
*From Frege To Gödel: A Source Book in Mathematical Logic, 1879–1931*, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press. - Whitehead, Alfred North and Bertrand Russell, 1910,
*Principia Mathematica*, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

## Academic Tools

How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

## Other Internet Resources

- Descriptive Complexity: a webpage describing research in Descriptive Complexity which is Computational Complexity from a Logical Point of View (with a diagram showing the World of Computability and Complexity). Maintained by Neil Immerman, University of Massachusetts, Amherst.
- Mass, Size, and Density of the Universe, from the National Solar Observatory/Sacramento Peak.