Notes to Confucius

1. Unless otherwise indicated all dates given in this entry are BCE. All of the works referred to in these notes are found in the bibliography.

2. This is the opinion of the Qing dynasty authority Cui Shu (1740-1816). Even when one relies exclusively on these three sources it is doubtful that one can reconstruct an accurate and historically true version of the events in Confucius' life.

3. Makeham 1998 describes in more detail the differences between these two portraits of Confucius.

4. Durrant 1995 contains an insightful study of Sima Qian's biography of Confucius. The recent study of the biography by Nylan & Wilson 2010 is less scholarly and insightful.

5. Sima Qian borrows this genealogy from the Zuozhuan account of Confucius' forebears. It emphasizes their knowledge of ritual and canonical literature.

6. For more on the significance of Confucius' year of birth, see Boodberg 1940. Li Ling 1970 is also interested in the connection between Confucius and dogs.

7. This is according to the Mencius which, as observed earlier, is the early biographical source most concerned with charting Confucius' official career.

8. The Lunyu we have today is divided into twenty “books” that are further divided into “chapters” (that are in fact most often a few sentences or a short paragraph in length). References to the Lunyu in this entry take the form of “book.chapter,” i.e., Lunyu 3.15 refers to book 3, chapter 15, in the text. The translations by Lau 1979, Waley 1938, and Slingerland 2003, are highly recommended. Van Norden 2002 is a good collection of essays on the Analects and Confucius that emphasizes their reception in later ages.

9. See Rubin 1965 for a study of Zi Chan. Confucius also praises Zi Chan at Lunyu 4.19.

10. Lunyu 17.1 records an anecdote in which Kongzi accepts employment from a rebellious Ji family retainer named Yang Huo. The passage contradicts the more usual portrayal of Confucius in the Analects as not motivated by a desire to hold office. But it occurs in the last five books of the text and these are widely recognized as especially doubtful sources of biographical material.

11. In his biography of Confucius, Sima Qian claims that in 502 Duke Ding of Lu granted Confucius two posts in succession—that of steward of Zhongdu and director of public works (sikong)—and that these led to his appointment as director of crime.

12. Sima Qian's version of the meeting at Jiagu is much fuller than the Zuozhuan account and states explicitly that the duke of Qi arranged for an entertainment in order to find an opportunity to seize or harass the Lu ruler.

13. Other sources provide conflicting reasons for Confucius' departure from Lu. Analects 18.4, for example, says that the head of the Ji family stayed away from court for three days, dallying with a troupe of singing and dancing girls sent as a present by the court of Qi, Confucius left Lu in disgust. Mencius, ever interested in Confucius' official career, says that Confucius was dismayed because, though director of crime, his advice was ignored and he was treated rudely. “For his part, Confucius preferred to have a reason to leave, no matter how slight, rather than to leave for no reason at all. The doings of a gentleman are naturally above the understanding of the ordinary man.” (See Mengzi 6B6.)

14. See Mengzi 5A8. In Sima Qian's embroidered version of the time Confucius spent in Song he says that, when Confucius and his disciples were practicing their ritual ceremonies beneath a tree, Huan Tui (i.e., Marshal Huan), with murder intent, uprooted the tree. His name Tui, which means “a fierce, bear-like wild animal,” and his uprooting the tree suggest he was more of a monster like Grendel or Mara than an ordinary mortal.

15. See Lunyu 13.16 and 7.19.

16. The passage in the Mozi occurs in its “Fei Ru” or “Condemn the Ru” chapter of the text, a chapter noteworthy for its ad hominem attacks on Confucius and his followers.

17. See Lunyu 5.23 and 11.2.

18. For this view of the Analects, see (E. and A.) Brooks 1998. In a detailed review of their work, Makeham 1999, however, points out significant flaws in their methodology and its application.

19. Schwartz 1985, p. 61.

20. Makeham 2003 provides an authoritative study of the commentarial tradition surrounding the Analects.

21. See Riegel 2008.

22. Zi Lu was outraged by Confucius saying that the first thing he would do in governing a state was “to correct the use of names,” calling it “wide of the mark.” He was not, however, objecting because he regarded the correct use of names as an odd priority in and of itself, as many interpreters have wrongly concluded, but because he saw no need for it given Wei's political circumstances: though illegitimate, its ruler had already been in power for a few years and the rightful ruler was ensconced elsewhere. Confucius, exasperated with Zi Lu—he calls him “boorish”—explains the various disasters that befall a state when its rulers do not employ the correct use of names.

23. Ivanhoe 2000 includes a good summary of Confucius' methods of self-cultivation.

Copyright © 2013 by
Jeffrey Riegel <>

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