Medieval Theories of Conscience

First published Mon Nov 23, 1998; substantive revision Thu Jul 7, 2011

Through conscience and its related notion, synderesis, human beings discern what is right and wrong. While there are many medieval views about the nature of conscience, most views regard human beings as capable of knowing in general what ought to be done and applying this knowledge through conscience to particular decisions about action. The ability to act on the determinations of conscience is, moreover, tied to the development of the moral virtues, which in turn refines the functions of conscience.

1. Background

There are significant discussions of conscience among the Stoics. Seneca the Younger discusses conscience in his Epistulae Morales (43, 97, 105) and attributes several qualities to it. St Paul discusses conscience in various letters (I Corinthians; Romans; Hebrews; Timothy). Whatever the influence of Seneca and St. Paul might be on subsequent discussions of conscience and synderesis, late medieval discussions of conscience derive from Peter Lombard's presentation of the concepts of conscience and synderesis in his Sentences. Lombard cites a passage from St. Jerome, interpreting Ezekiel's vision of four living creatures coming out of a cloud. Each creature was shaped like a man, but each had four faces: the front face was human; the right was that of a lion; the left was that of an ox; and the back was that of an eagle (Ezekiel 1.4–14). Jerome identifies the human face as representing the rational part of man, the lion as the emotional, the ox as the appetitive, and the eagle as that “which the Greeks call synteresis: that spark of conscience which was not even extinguished in the breast of Cain after he was turned out of paradise, and by which we discern that we sin, when we are overcome by pleasures or frenzy and meanwhile are misled by an imitation of reason.” Jerome's comment that synteresis (alternatively, synderesis) is never extinguished in human beings and his remarks elsewhere to the effect that wicked people do cease to have any conscience led Lombard and subsequent thinkers to distinguish synderesis from conscience. While it is unclear that Jerome meant to distinguish the two, the distinction plays a major role in late medieval discussions of conscience.

In these discussions, constant reference was made to certain works by Plato and Aristotle. Neither Plato nor Aristotle explicitly mention conscience, however. It is their discussions of the virtues, practical wisdom, and weakness of will that form the critical backdrop to medieval discussions of conscience. These discussions were heavily influenced by Augustine's modification of these classical authors. For example, Augustine championed Plato's notion of the unity of the virtues, but he argued that love of God provided the unity to them. Moreover, he claimed that what pagan authors regarded as virtues were in fact vices unless they were developed for the love of God.

Two distinct views about the relationship between conscience and synderesis emerged in the late Middle Ages. The first view, a voluntaristic one, can be identified with Franciscan thinkers like Bonaventure. The second, most clearly expounded by Aquinas, is an intellectualistic view. Both seem to derive from Philip the Chancellor's treatise on conscience. In his treatise, Philip chiefly discusses synderesis, and at times he describes it as an unerring intellectual dispositional potentiality that provides general truths to conscience for specific application. At other times, he describes synderesis as the desire for the good, and it is equated with emotional reactions when one follows evil instead of good. This latter description fits well with Bonaventure's views on synderesis and conscience.

2. Bonaventure

Bonaventure discusses both in his Commentary on the Sentences, Book II, distinction 39. He places conscience squarely within the rational faculty, specifying that it is part of practical reason since it is connected to the performance of actions. It is thus also connected to the will as well as the emotions. On the other hand, he places synderesis in the affective part of human beings, for he regards synderesis as that which stimulates us to the good.

Conscience is divided into two general parts by Bonaventure. The first part seems to be a power for discovering the truth of very general practical principles like “obey God,” “honor your parents,” and “do not harm your neighbors.” This part of conscience is innate and unerring; it cannot be lost to any person, no matter how morally corrupt that person may become. The second part of conscience involves the application of the very general principles to situations that may be either general or particular. This second part is also innate, but it can be mistaken since the very general principles of the first part may be misapplied through ignorance or faulty reasoning. The misapplication explains, to a certain extent, how conscience, oriented to good, can be involved in the performance of evil actions. The distinction between the two parts of conscience also opens up the possibility for developing, through experience, practical principles of behavior not directly entailed by the content of the synderesis. By generalizing on activities performed in accordance with the principles of the synderesis, one can formulate new general principles not contained in the synderesis that can guide behavior in a number of contexts. Conscience thus appears to be a dynamic faculty for Bonaventure.

Bonaventure calls synderesis the “spark of conscience,” and he sees it as resting in the affective part of human beings. It is the spark because, as the general drive to do good, synderesis provides the movement that conscience needs to operate. In general, Bonaventure regards conscience and synderesis as interpenetrating one another. The formation of ethical rules by conscience is seen by him as an implementation of a human being's desire for good (the synderesis). He also sees the following of these principles as another aspect of the desire for good. Because we naturally have a desire for the good, we also desire the means to that goal. The principles of conscience are such means, and so we are naturally disposed to carry out the principles of conscience. Similarly, the emotional reaction to doing evil (guilt or remorse) is a reaction to the frustration of the desire for good caused when one fails to adhere to what the conscience has determined will lead to good. Bonaventure, while placing synderesis and conscience in different parts of a human being, does not isolate them. On the contrary, he views conscience as driven by synderesis and at the same time directing synderesis.

3. Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas, the principal advocate of the intellectualistic view of the relationship of conscience and synderesis, explicitly defines ‘conscience’ as the “application of knowledge to activity” (Summa Theologiae, I-II, I) The knowledge he has in mind here comes from the synderesis, which he regards as the natural disposition of the human mind by which we apprehend without inquiry the basic principles of behavior. For Aquinas, then, the conscience applies the first principles of the synderesis to particular situations. The principles of synderesis are rather general in form. Examples are “Do good and avoid evil” and “Obey God.” To be helpful in human activity, conscience requires principles that contain much more content. One can call these “secondary principles” and Aquinas discusses them in several places and suggests that they are derived from experience and instruction through the virtue of prudence. Thus, the function of conscience for Aquinas is to apply the general principles of synderesis and the more content-laden secondary principles developed from prudence to particular circumstances. Prudence is involved in the application to particular circumstances, according to Aquinas, because it is connected to the correct perception of individual circumstances. And this aspect of prudence connects both conscience and prudence to the problem of weakness of will.

In Aquinas's presentation of Aristotle's discussion of weakness of will in his Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, the fourth position offered in Book 7, Chapter 3 of the Nicomachean Ethics is emphasized. According to this position, the incontinent man knows the appropriate general principles of behavior concerning what should be done, e.g., one should not fornicate. If the incontinent man sees a particular action as falling under this general principle, e.g., a man sees that having intercourse with an unmarried woman is a case of fornication, he will not perform the action. However, the incontinent man also holds the general rule that pleasures should be enjoyed. If the incontinent man, driven by his particular desire for a particular unmarried woman, sees the proposed sexual liaison as a case of pleasure, he subsumes it under the general rule about pursuing pleasure and pursues the relationship. The desire he has, as it were, blinds him to the general principle about fornication he still possesses, but only habitually. The actual knowledge he possesses is that the proposed liaison is a case of pleasure to be pursued. He thus has (habitually) the knowledge that he should avoid fornication, but he fornicates nonetheless because he actually sees the fornication as an act of pleasure to be pursued. As a general comment on Aristotle's analysis, Aquinas remarks: “It is not the knowledge of the universal but only the evaluation of the sensible, which is not so excellent, that is dragged about by passion.” (Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, Book 7, lecture 3, paragraph 1352) The point Aquinas is making is that the incontinent man possesses the knowledge of what he should do, but he is driven by the passion he has for a particular; this passion leads him to act contrary to what the knows (habitually) should not be done. The incontinent man so fails because he has failed to cultivate the appropriate virtues that would enable him to size up the situation correctly (synesis) and deliberate well about it (eubulia). This analysis of weakness of will falls in line with Aquinas's general view of the will as a passive potency that always follows the judgments of the intellect. While this view of the will is modified by such disciples of Aquinas as Giles of Rome, perhaps under the impetus of the Condemnations of 1277, Aquinas's linking of conscience with prudence and the virtues in general through his concern with weakness of will is innovative and undoubtedly connected with his interest in the Nicomachean Ethics. Duns Scotus and William of Ockham follow his lead in linking conscience with issues surrounding development of the virtues.

4. Scotus and Ockham

Scotus offers very little explicit discussion of either conscience or synderesis. Yet, from his discussion of issues chiefly concerned with development of the virtues, it is apparent that his view of conscience and synderesis seems to draw from both Bonaventure and Aquinas. Following Aquinas, Scotus thinks that both synderesis and conscience are to be placed in the intellectual order. In agreement with Bonaventure, Scotus gives conscience much more of a dynamic role in the human personality than a mechanical application of general principles. Scotus's close linking of conscience and the development of the virtues allows him to combine the two sources.

According to the virtue tradition, in order to perform a virtuous action, one must have the right dictates associated with the relevant virtue. Yet, one must perform appropriate virtuous actions to develop the habit of the virtue and to know the relevant right dictates. The obvious circularity seems vicious enough to undermine any attempt to cultivate virtues. Scotus regards conscience as offering a way into the circle. Whenever a person formulates what is to be done in some circumstance, this is an exercise of conscience, which has determined proper action from the principles of synderesis. On the basis of the dictates of conscience, a person can perform an action that will provide the basis for the development of the relevant virtues. For the performance of these acts from conscience leads to the type of habit that Scotus thinks of as a virtue. Ideally, the moral virtues are unified since a perfect, virtuous person should possess all virtues. In fact, Scotus's perfect, virtuous person seems very similar to Aristotle's man of practical wisdom. This is the person who has, through long experience, developed the moral virtues and is able to deliberate so well about all moral situations that in Aristotle's view to be moral is to do what a man of practical wisdom would do. Scotus's perfect, virtuous person, like the man of practical wisdom, is skilled at determining what should be done in given circumstances; he takes delight in acting in accord with his virtues, and he possesses all of the moral virtues by developing them through experience.

Ockham's discussion of conscience, prudence, and the virtues indicates that he follows Scotus's turn towards discussing conscience in relation to the virtues. He agrees with Scotus that conscience can provide the entry into the seeming circularity of performing virtuous actions in order to develop intentions that seem to be required for performing the virtuous actions in the first place. Nevertheless, he criticizes Scotus for failing to make a number of necessary distinctions about degrees of virtues and the relationship of conscience to prudence. He never mentions synderesis in his writings and emphasizes the fact that only internal acts have moral worth. According to him, external acts are morally significant only by extrinsic denomination from internal acts. Particularly in these last two claims, Ockham exercised considerable influence on Reformation thinkers like Luther and Calvin in their discussions of conscience. In fact, the topics of conscience and synderesis were discussed in German universities with great attention both before and after the Reformation. Some of the thinkers involved in these discussions adhered in various ways to the views of Bonaventure, Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham while others blended and transformed the various views found among these thinkers. Many of these discussions related conscience to issues about practical reasoning. After Luther, the linking of conscience with practical knowledge found in the writings of Aquinas, Scotus, and Ockham gives way, under the influence of Joseph Butler and Immanuel Kant, to conceiving of conscience as a faculty.

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