Notes to Convention

1. An exception to this trend is John Searle, who discusses money in The Social Construction of Reality (1995). Searle analyzes money not through convention but rather through his proprietary framework of constitutive rules.

2. Whether or not they are true is another matter. Liam Murphy and Thomas Nagel advocate conventionalism about property in The Myth of Ownership (2002), a book whose title suggests that claims about property rights are, strictly speaking, false. In the body of the text, however, Murphy and Nagel seem to argue instead that claims about property rights are made true by convention, which presumably entails that such claims are true. A similar ambivalence sometimes seems to inform Hume’s exposition.

3. Kurt Gödel’s incompleteness theorems seemed to many philosophers to undercut conventionalism about mathematics. Quine argued along these lines in “Carnap on Logical Truth.” When Carnap tries to specify a precise sense in which arithmetic is a “consequence” of a conventionally stipulated linguistic framework, the first incompleteness theorem forces him to employ a meta-language containing mathematics that goes beyond arithmetic (so as to ensure the bivalence of arithmetical truth). Quine argues that this meta-linguistic appeal renders Carnap’s procedure circular. In a posthumously published paper (1995), Gödel himself advances a different argument based on the second incompleteness theorem. Briefly, Gödel argues that Carnap can treat arithmetic as fixed by convention only if he shows that the relevant convention does not generate a contradiction. By the second incompleteness theorem, we can show this only if we assume mathematics not captured by the relevant convention. The need for that assumption undercuts the claim that arithmetic results solely from convention. Michael Friedman (1999) presses both Gödelian objections. Warren Goldfarb and Thomas Ricketts (1992) defend Carnap against such objections.

4. The logical positivists urged that Einsteinian relativity theory supports geometric conventionalism. For instance, Schlick (1917/1920) argued that general relativity treats all coordinate systems as equally admissible, and hence that we must arbitrarily choose a coordinate system, thereby conventionally fixing our metric geometry. Friedman (1983, 1999) forcefully maintains that such positivist arguments typically rested upon serious misunderstandings of general relativity. In particular, general relativity posits a determinate, non-conventional metric that is related in a determinate way to the mass-energy distribution, as described by Einstein’s field equations.

5. One of Lewis’s goals in developing his theory of linguistic convention was to rebut Quinean skepticism about analyticity. In this connection, he offered the following definition:

sentence \(s\) is analytic as used by members of a population \(G\) iff there is a language \(L\) such that \(L\) is the language used by \(G\) and \(s\) is true in \(L\) in all possible worlds,

where “language \(L\) is used by population \(G\)” is explicated in terms of Lewisian convention, as described in section 7.1, Conventional theories of meaning. Lewis argues on the basis of this definition that Quine’s skepticism about analyticity is unwarranted. To this, Quine replies that Lewis has not broken out of the “intensional circle”, since he helps himself to the notion of a possible world (1969). In our post-Kripkean era, most philosophers would doubtless urge that, at best, Lewis’s definition vindicates metaphysical necessity rather than analyticity.

6. David Gauthier (1979) argues that Hume’s own theory of government is a species of “hypothetical contractarianism,” of the kind made famous by John Rawls.

7. Other notable developments in this area include the “hypothesis testing” model, offered by Dean Foster and H. Peyton Young (2003), and the “regret testing” model, also offered by Foster and Young (2006).

Copyright © 2015 by
Michael Rescorla <>

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