William Crathorn

First published Fri Aug 12, 2005; substantive revision Wed Oct 7, 2015

William Crathorn (fl. 1330s), like Adam Wodeham (d. 1358) and Robert Holkot (c. 1290–1349), belonged to the first generation of Oxford philosophers after William of Ockham (c. 1285–1347), who sought to criticize and develop Ockham's philosophy. Crathorn is remembered for his theories of language and cognition, and for some anti-skeptical arguments strikingly similar to those found in Descartes' Meditations. The radical ontology of his works is also noteworthy, thought it has not yet been closely studied.

1. Life and Work

Very little is known about Crathorn's life. He might have been born in the village of Crathorne in north Yorkshire. He became a Dominican friar before going to Oxford, where he lectured on the first book of Peter the Lombard's Sentences in the years 1330–32, a work we can date because of a passage in which Crathorn mentions an eclipse that we know occurred on July 16, 1330. His Dominican contemporary, Robert Holkot, also tells us that that he lectured at the same time (1331–33) as a Dominican named Crathorn (Courtenay 1978; Schepers 1970 and 1972)

William Crathorn also lectured on the Bible, and Holkot is presumably responding to Crathorn's arguments in his Sex articuli. A manuscript in Vienna contains what could be Crathorn's forty-two quodlibetal questions (Richter 1972), but most of these questions are similar to the ones contained in his Questions on the Sentences (Quaestiones super librum sententiarum).

2. Relation to Other Scholars

Crathorn's Sentences commentary is of great philosophical and historical interest for the study of the first generation of Oxford thinkers after Ockham because he develops his own provocative positions by discussing the major issues of his day and criticizing the views of his contemporaries (Courtenay 1978, Gelber 2004). His favorite target was Ockham, but he also argued against the views of Thomas Aquinas (Krauss 1933), John Duns Scotus, Richard Fitzralph, and Robert Holkot (Schepers 1970, 1972).

Although Crathorn criticized Ockham, he remained a nominalist (he admits only individuals in his ontology and subscribes to the same kind of theory of predication as Ockham). Above all, he worked out some of the consequences of Ockham's views in epistemology, the philosophy of language, and ontology, to show what problems they created. We do not know whether he knew Ockham personally, or only indirectly, through his younger disciple, Adam Wodeham. Indeed, Wodeham frequently refers to a Dominican socius, who could have been Crathorn himself or a certain John Grafton, another Oxford Dominican of this time.

3. Epistemology

The problem of knowledge is at the very heart of Crathorn's thought. Going back to Roger Bacon, he held that the only way the human mind is able to know the external world is through species that resemble it (I Sent. q. 1, concl. 4). Bacon's theory of the multiplication of species (multiplicatio specierum) was developed to explain causality using the model of optics. A thing c has an effect on another thing e through the multiplication of species s from c towards e, just as light is multiplied through the air when it illuminates an object. According to Bacon, the species s is a representative of c but with a lesser mode of being. Thus, the species is multiplied through the medium of air again and again until it arrives at e. The causal power of c is in this way conserved through the medium until it acts on e. The species is therefore both the cause (i.e., the same thing as the cause but with a diminished mode of being) and a likeness of that cause. Applying Bacon's theory to epistemology, Crathorn asserts that we have no direct access to things in the external world and that we immediately perceive only their mental likenesses or representations, i.e., their species. These mental entities, whether we call them ‘species“ or ‘concepts” (the terms are equivalent for Crathorn), have the same nature as the things they resemble (ibid. concl. 8). Contrary to Bacon, the Dominican considers that the species has the same mode of being — i.e., material being — outside and inside the mind. As a consequence, all the species we have in the mind belong to the category of quality, for no real substance or quantity can exist materially in the human soul. Since concepts can only belong to the category of quality according to Crathorn, they must be mental qualities having the same nature as non-mental qualities and they must exist subjectively in the mind, which is to say that they exist in some part of the brain (Pasnau 1997). Crathorn writes, “the word ‘cognition’ (cognitio) stands for the idea (verbum) of the thing known, and that idea is the quality existing subjectively (subiective existens) in the mind or in some part of the brain” (I Sent. q. 1, concl. 1). Therefore, cognition is nothing but the species itself or the part of the soul where it is received and stored. From an ontological point of view, nothing distinguishes sensible cognition, imagination and intellection except the distinct part of the soul where the species is received. There is no difference between sensible and intelligible species.

Crathorn goes on to describe the different parts of the brain and their functions. As the canonical medieval topology of the brain suggests, there are three main lobes (cellulae) connected by nerves through which the information conveyed by the species can be transferred from one lobe to another. The first lobe corresponds to sensitive imagination (cellula fantastica), the second to conceptualization and discourse (cellula syllogistica) and the third to memory (cellula memoriale) (I Sent. q. 2, concl. 4).

Crathorn thus had to emend Ockham's theory of evident knowledge, because intuitive cognition is no more the guarantee of any certitude regarding the existence of extramental things. In addition, the cognition of the terms of a proposition — even a per se nota proposition — is not sufficient, according to Crathorn, to ensure the causal mechanism that leads to evidence and certitude. Indeed, as we shall see below, Crathorn refuses to treat the species or cognitions as linguistic elements of thought. All languages are conventional by nature. Therefore, it is possible to cognize some terms the signification of which remains unknown to the cognizing subject. As a result, although empirical knowledge of the things signified by the terms is usually needed, it is necessary to argue beyond simple and intuitive cognitions, via syllogisms and demonstrations, to consolidate one's certitude that not only representations exist. Crathorn thus suggests that we substitute for the Ockhamist definition of evident cognition his own definition: evident cognition is a manifest, clear, and not obscure cognition (q. 1, p. 69–70: notitia evidens est notitia manifesta, clara et non obscura), be it simple or complex, intuitive or abstractive.

Incredibly, Crathorn affirms that whenever one is thinking of a white thing, the mind of that person actually becomes white. His notion of similarity is strict and uncompromising. Mental concepts cannot resemble substances but only qualities of substances (I Sent., q. 1, concl. 7) because the species of substance would have to be a substance itself and our minds would turn into a new substance if we thought of it. It also cannot be a pure quantity because in thinking of infinite magnitudes, our minds would become infinite, and the same is true for the other categories besides quality. According to Crathorn, our ability to conceptualize is therefore limited to natural concepts of qualities, which in being conceived become qualities of the soul.

Crathorn had to face up to the skeptical consequences of this odd epistemology. How can we know what is real if our only access to reality is via representations of its qualitative features? His answer to this question is quite radical: we cannot be naturally and directly certain that reality exists as we conceive it since it is not possible to distinguish qualities inside and outside the mind: as qualities, they would have precisely the same nature (ibid. concl. 10–13). The only solution to skeptical doubt here is the principle, which he claims is known per se, that God does not produce an effect supernaturally in order to lie or to lead people into error (ibid. q. 1, concl. 14), a principle more famously used in connection with Descartes' thought experiment of a Dieu trompeur several centuries later.

Crathorn endeavored elsewhere to gather at least a few certitudes, since one could doubt whether the a priori principle that God would never deceive us is itself certain. To rebut the skeptic, he turns back to Augustine's version of the cogito-argument to prove that we can at least be certain of our own mental activity, for if one were to doubt a proposition such as ‘I am’, it would follow that he exists, since he who does not exist does not doubt. Hence, no one can be in doubt concerning the proposition, ‘I am’ (I Sent., q. 1, concl. 14; translated in Tachau 1988, p. 273).

4. Philosophy of Language

One of the most important debates at Oxford around 1320–30 concerned the proper object of scientific knowledge. When we know something scientifically, is our knowledge about external things (the earth interposed between the sun and the moon), propositions (‘The moon is eclipsed’), or some other more complex state of affairs? Crathorn is believed to have participated in the development of the idea that the proper object of science is neither the external thing nor the proposition (as Ockham and Holkot had argued), but the ‘total significate’ of that proposition (Tachau 1987). Typically, the total significate would include not only external things but also the premises and other assumptions that generate our assent to the proposition as the conclusion of a piece of demonstrative reasoning.

Another debate concerned the nature of mental language, specifically whether it is conventional or natural (Gelber 1984; Panaccio 1996) Ockham had argued that thinking occurs in a universally significative language of concepts acquired causally via experience, and that all conventional languages are subordinated to this mental language, which is shared by everyone. But Crathorn could not accept such a position because of his view that only qualities are natural signs of their extra-mental significates. Indeed, languages also contain substance-terms, verbs, and syncategoremata, i.e., logical particles and connectives such as ‘or’, ‘but’, ‘all’, and ‘if’. Accordingly, Crathorn argues that except for natural signs of qualities, no natural likeness in the mind can explain the signification of these terms. Mental language is therefore as conventional as spoken and written languages and is in fact derived from conventional languages (I Sent., q. 2; Cf. Panaccio 1996, Perler 1997, Robert 2009b and 2010b). Just as thought depends on the species or likenesses of external things, mental words are likenesses of conventional words and have exactly the same semantic force. Depending upon which language(s) you learn to speak, your mental language will be a likeness of Latin, English, French, etc. Crathorn was the only thinker of his time to affirm that words are prior to ideas and that ideas are shaped by words. Meaning is first given by a community of speakers; mental language is simply the internalization of these spoken and written languages. We always think in a conventional language or, more precisely, in its mental reflection.

5. Ontology and Categories

In keeping with his views on knowledge and language, Crathorn advocated radical changes to traditional Aristotelian ontology. These are discussed in a sub-treatise on the categories in his Commentary on the Sentences (I Sent. qq. 13–18).

Ockham famously reduced the ten Aristotelian categories to two, substance and quality, treating the other eight as modes of signifying substances and qualities. For Crathorn, however, the entire Aristotelian system has to be revised. The human mind naturally knows nothing but qualities, and we cannot be certain that even they exist without appealing to the principle that God could not deceive us. Thinking and reasoning are of no help because, as we saw above, they are purely conventional.

Instead, Crathorn treats the Aristotelian categories as philosophical conventions. Following the chapters of Aristotle's Categories step by step, he comes to the conclusion that none of the ten categories are valid because the reasons Aristotle uses to distinguish them are inadequate. For example, the category of substance is distinguished from the other categories by the fact that it has no contrary and can successively acquire contrary qualities (Aristotle, Categories 5). But Crathorn claims that when we heat a piece of wood or a man, not only the substance but also its qualities become hot, such that its qualities change from one state to their contrary exactly like a substance. Therefore, this crucial distinction between substance and accidents does not apply. Crathorn writes, “not only the substance of the wood can receive the contraries, but also the accidents of the wood ... but if the wood is hot, not only is the heat attached to the wood hot, but also all the positive coextensive natures of the wood” (I Sent., q. 13, concl. 13). He also affirms that “one and the same thing numerically can truly be said to be substance and accident in relation to different things” (ibid., concl. 5). Indeed, water and fire can be considered as natural substances, but one is the contrary of the other. As a general conclusion, Crathorn asserts that the very same thing can be called a substance, a quality, a quantity, a relation and so forth (q. 17, p. 462 and q. 18, p. 476).

Crathorn develops his position mostly by attacking the views of other philosophers who accepted such distinctions, but unfortunately he is not always clear about his positive reasons for abandoning Aristotelian ontology. But, on one hand it is consistent with his epistemology, for our only direct and natural certitude is that qualities exist. On the other hand, it is also consistent with his frequent tendency to materialism. Indeed, we can discern hints of atomism in his Commentary on the Sentences.

6. Atomism

Crathorn is less well known than other fourteenth-century atomists such as the Oxford thinkers Henry of Harclay (d. 1317) and Walter Chatton (c. 1285–1344), or the Parisians Gerard of Odo (1290–1349), Nicolas Bonet (d. 1343), and Nicolas of Autrecourt (1299–1369) (Murdoch 1974, 1982; Grellard and Robert 2009), yet we find several questions on the divisibility of the continuum in his Sentences commentary (particularly I Sent., q. 3, but also qq. 4 and 14–16). He affirms that a continuum is divisible into a finite number of atoms that are not mathematical points but its real, physical parts (I Sent., q. 3; for discussion, see Wood 1988, Robert 2009a). Atoms are thus real singular entities with discrete magnitude or quantity and a proper nature. For example, he says that there are atoms of gold and atoms of lead, and that these are different kinds of things (I Sent., q. 14). Crathorn's atomism is far from that of Democritus.

The most difficult problem for atomists arises from book VI of Aristotle's Physics, where it becomes necessary to define the contiguity of atoms. Since an atom by definition has no parts, how can we say that they touch each other? If they are actually in contact, they should be in one and the same place (if not, then there is no continuity since continuity requires contiguity). Crathorn replies by saying that this is a problem only for those who think of atoms as mathematical points. But since he holds that atoms have a proper magnitude and that they are defined by the fact that they occupy a single location (situs or locus), a quantity that is simply the place occupied by the quantified thing (I Sent., qq. 3 and 14–15), the contiguity and continuity of atoms can be explained in terms of the contiguity of places. Atoms can form a continuous magnitude if all of them are contiguous, i.e., if they all occupy contiguous atomic places.

The implications of Crathorn's atomism are truly astonishing. First, every movement boils down to local motion of atoms in the void. Thus, Crathorn affirms that a continuous motion has only one possible speed, which is the greatest speed it could ever reach (Murdoch 1984). In other words, movement is continuous when an atom changes from one atomic place to another contiguous atomic place. The proportion of time and place (i.e., the speed) is always equal to one. So how can he explain the fact that things appear to move at different speeds? The answer is quite simple: to every varying speed there corresponds a discontinuous motion, with times of rest between some of the atomic places occupied by the moving atoms (I Sent., q. 16, concl. 6). For example, the normal speed of an atom a corresponds to its local motion from a place p1 to another contiguous place p2 in a given atomic time. Variation of speed occurs if a moves from p1 to p2 but with a time of rest equivalent to two atoms of time. We may infer that speed can also vary if a goes from p1 to another place p3 that is not directly contiguous with p1.

Although Crathorn does not describe himself this way, he seems to be one of the most radical atomists of the fourteenth century (Robert 2010a), sharing with his Parisian contemporary Nicholas of Autrecourt much of the same anti-Aristotelian bent in his metaphysics and natural philosophy. Combined with his epistemology and philosophy of language, his philosophy is certainly one of the most original forms of reductionism in later medieval philosophy.


Primary Literature

  • Quaestiones super librum sententiarum, ed. F. Hoffmann in Quästionen Zum ersten Sentenzenbuch, Beiträge zur Geschichte der Philosophie und Theologie des Mittelalters, Band 29, Aschendorff: Münster, 1988.


  • I Sent., q. 1, tr. R. Pasnau in Pasnau (ed.), The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Vol. III: Mind and Knowledge, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.

Secondary Literature

  • Alisade, H. F. X., 2014, “Wilhelm Crathorn OP”, in Biographisch-bibliographisches Kirchenlexicon, Bd. 35, Nordhausen: Bautz, 1537–1543.
  • Courtenay, W. J., 1978, Adam Wodeham: An Introduction to His Life and Writings (Studies in Medieval and Reformation Thought 21), Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Gelber, H. G., 1984, “I Cannot Tell a Lie: Hugh Lawton's Critique of Ockham on Mental Language,” Franciscan Studies, 44: 141–79.
  • Gelber, H. G., 2004, It Could Have Been Otherwise: Contingency and Necessity in Dominican Theology, 1300–1350, Leiden: E. J. Brill.
  • Grellard, C. and A. Robert, 2009, Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden-Boston: E.J. Brill.
  • Hoffmann, F., 1971, “Der Satz als Zeichen der Theologischen Aussage bei Holcot, Crathorn und Gregor von Rimini,” in Der Bergriff der Repraesentatio im Mittelalter, Miscellanea Medievalia, 8: 296–313.
  • Hoffmann, F., 1995, “Der Wandel in der Scholastischen Argumentation vom 13 Zum 14 Jahrhundert aufgezeigt an zwei Beispielen: Robert Holcot und William (Johannes?) Crathorn,” in A. Speer (ed.), Die Bibliotheca Amploniana, Miscellanea Medievalia, 23: 301–322.
  • Kirjavainen, H., 2000, “Transcendental Elements in the Semantics of Crathorn,” in G. Holmström-Hintikka (ed.), Medieval Philosophy and Modern Times, Dordrecht-Boston-London: Kluwer.
  • Krauss, J., 1933, “Die Stellung des Oxforder Dominikanerlehrers Crathorn zu Thomas von Aquin,” Zeitschrift für Katholische Theologie, 57: 66–68.
  • Murdoch, J. E., 1974, “Naissance et développement de l'atomisme au bas Moyen Âge latin,” in La science de la nature: théories et pratiques (Cahiers d’Études Médiévales 2), Montréal: Bellarmin.
  • Murdoch, J. E., 1982, “Infinity and Continuity,” in N. Kretzmann, A. Kenny and J. Pinborg (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge-New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Murdoch, J. E., 1984, “Atomism and Motion in the Fourteenth Century,” in E. Mendelsohn (ed.), Transformation and Tradition in the Sciences: Essays in Honor of I. B. Cohen, Cambridge-New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Panaccio, C., 1996, “Le langage mental en discussion: 1320–1335,” Les Études Philosophiques, 3: 323–39.
  • Pasnau, R., 1997, Theories of Cognition in the Later Middle Ages, Cambridge-New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Perler, D., 1997, “Crathorn on Mental Language,” in Costantino Marmo (ed.), Vestigia, Imagines, Verba. Semiotics and logic in medieval theological texts (XIIth-XIVth century). Acts of the XIth European Symposium on Medieval Logic and Semantics. San Marino, 24–28 May 1994, Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 337–54.
  • Richter, V., 1972, “Handschriftliches zu Crathorn,” Zeitschrift für Katholische Theologie, 94: 445–49.
  • Robert, A., 2009a, “William Crathorn's Mereotopological Atomism”, in C. Grellard and A. Robert (eds.), Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden-Boston: E.J. Brill, pp. 127–162.
  • Robert, A., 2009b, “Les deux langages de la pensée: à propos de quelques réflexions médiévales”, in J. Biard (ed.), Le langage mental du Moyen Âge à l'âge classique, Louvain-la-Neuve: Peeters, pp. 145–168.
  • Robert, A., 2010a, “Atomisme et géométrie à Oxford au XIVe siècle”, in S. Rommevaux (ed.), Mathématiques et connaissance du réel avant Galilée, Omniscience: Paris, pp. 15–85.
  • Robert, A., 2010b, “William Crathorn on Predication and Mental Language”, Analytica, 14(2): 227–258.
  • Schepers, H., 1970, “Holkot contra dicta Crathorn: I. Quellenkritik und Biographische Auswertung der Bakkalareatsschriften zweier Oxforder Dominikaner des XIV Jahrunderts,” Philosophisches Jahrbuch, 77: 320–54.
  • Schepers, H., 1972, “Holkot contra dicta Crathorn: II. Das significatum per propositionem. Aufbau und Kritik einer Nominalistischen Theorie über den Gegenstand des Wissens,” Philosophisches Jahrbuch, 79: 106–136.
  • Sprengard, K. A., 1968, “Crathorn. Ein Oxforder modernus des XIV. Jahrhunderts,” Systematische-Historische Untersuchungen zur Philosophie des XIV Jahrhunderts (Band 2), Bonn: Mainzer Philosophische Forschungen.
  • Tachau, K. H., 1987, “Wodeham, Crathorn, and Holcot: The Development of the complexe significabile,” in L. M. de Rijk and H. Braakhuis (eds.), Logos and Pragma, Nijmegen: Ingenium Publishers, pp. 161–87.
  • Tachau, K. H., 1988, Vision and Certitude in the Age of Ockham, Studien und Texte zur Geistesgeschichte des Mittelalters, Leiden-New York-København-Köln: E. J. Brill.
  • Wood, R., 1988, Adam Wodeham, Tractatus de indivisibilibus. Introduction, translation, and notes (Synthese Historical Library), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1988.

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