Creation and Conservation

First published Thu Jul 12, 2007; substantive revision Tue Dec 2, 2014

In Western monotheism, especially the monotheisms of the Abrahamic tradition, God is conceived to be both the creator and sustainer of all that exists. Such a conception yields doctrines of creation and conservation, where the first concerns the origin of things and the second the continued existence of things. Though the doctrine of creatio ex nihilo (creation out of nothing) has longstanding centrality in this understanding, by the time of Aquinas, concerns over the possibility of the universe itself existing from eternity led to thinking of creation out of nothing as the generic category of which initial creation and continued sustenance are species.

These doctrines and developments involve several areas of philosophical concern. These will be discussed under the following topic headings. First, there is the concern of separating theism from deism and the relationship between each and a scientific conception of the world. Second, there is a question of the relationship between the two doctrines: whether they are logically distinct doctrines or simply different descriptions of the same fundamental divine activity. Third, there is the matter of whether created objects have a hand in their own continued existence and, in this case, what the character of God's sustaining activity must be.

1. Science and the Theology of Creation

Though it is clear that the historical understanding of creation involved a beginning in time (or with time), the fear of conflict with scientific approaches to understanding the cosmos has downplayed this historical understanding. The issue of a temporal beginning for the universe became of secondary importance through the influence of Aquinas's work, but further distancing has occurred with the rise of modern science and the desire to avoid theologies that generate empirical predictions. This tendency is especially marked in Schleiermacher, the father of modern theology, who argued that the historical understanding was tied to the mythological understanding of creation contained in the Mosaic account, and that once we move beyond mythology, there is no reason to retain the distinction between creation and conservation, since the distinction plays no role whatsoever in our feeling of absolute dependence on God.

This attitude exalts the doctrine of conservation while it deflates the significance of the doctrine of creation. At the other end of the spectrum is the Deist challenge, where the role of the doctrine of conservation is relegated merely to an effect across time of creation itself. According to Deists, the continued existence of created things required no activity by God in addition to that of creating them (or their ultimate constituents) in the first place. Moreover, such future activity beyond creation itself was unwanted, since it posed a concern for the success of scientific attempts to understand the cosmos.

Such a conception gains philosophical traction through an argument from analogy with human engineering of complex machines. A good watchmaker, for example, doesn't need to continue to intervene into the product of his efforts, and the need to do so is a mark of imperfection in the watchmaker. Such arguments from analogy, however, are defective. There is a causal and spatiotemporal structure in place which human engineers can exploit to develop machines that continue apart from the continued involvement of the engineer. Without such a structure in place, it is difficult if not impossible to make sense of the idea of a thing continuing to function completely on its own. As a result, it is not clear that a Deist understanding of God's relation to the world has any advantage over theistic understandings.

Even so, the first concern remains, a concern about the degree to which the doctrines of creation and conservation should be formulated to avoid the possibility of conflict with science. Though the general issues involved in the relationship between science and religion are too far afield here, it is worth noting that a substantive account of creation (i.e., one on which God exists independently of the cosmos) is most attractive when scientific accounts of the origin of the cosmos are congenial to it and when there is a strong apologetic strain to the theological perspective in question. In such a case, the diminution of the influence of a strong distinction between creation and conservation coupled with a temporal understanding of creation may be lamented as a lost opportunity to provide evidence for a traditional theistic understanding of the world. On the other hand, a perspective that insists on the essentiality of a doctrine of creation requiring some notion of temporal origin, as opposed to a doctrine emphasizing ontological dependence only, is difficult to defend on philosophical or hermeneutical grounds concerning the interpretation of sacred texts. As a result, the approaches to creation and conservation that treat them as metaphysical in nature have an initial advantage, at least, over approaches that begin by insisting that theological understandings of the doctrines involve empirical predictions that can be confirmed or disconfirmed by our best science.

2. Accounts of Creation and Conservation

Accounts of creation and conservation can be divided roughly into two different camps. The first camp focuses on the transition from non-being to being, attempting first to characterize the notion of creation and then to develop an account of conservation in terms of preservation of being. The second camp focuses, as noted above, on the notion of ontological dependence itself, attempting to clarify a way in which everything depends on God. This camp, in contrast to the former camp, attempts to honor the idea that there is no fundamental difference between the activity of God in creation and the activity of God in conservation.

The transitional account begins by claiming that the act of creation involves God bringing about the existence of all (contingent) things. Such an account says that coming into being should be understood in terms of there being some moment of time that is the first moment at which the entity in question exists. No such reference to an initial moment of existence is required on the alternative approach. The doctrine of creation then proposes that such initial existence is due to God's creative activity.

In order to complete this story, we need an explanation of the notion of divine causation encoded in the language of bringing about the existence of a thing. The traditional understanding of the creation of the universe not only claims that God is responsible for the cosmos but that he is solely responsible for it. One might account for this unique role of God by adding it to the doctrine of creation already described, thereby holding that God is the creator of all and moreover that he is the sole creator as well. But there are some reasons to prefer requiring the account of creation itself to imply this unique role. For one thing, if it is possible that God is not the sole creator, it is not clear that the conception of God involved in this possibility is sufficient exalted to satisfy the traditional Anselmian motivations according to which God is a being than which none greater can be conceived. Furthermore, if God's creative activity doesn't guarantee uniqueness, that could only be because that activity is not metaphysically sufficient to produce the effect in question, or some sort of overdetermination is left open. The first option is theologically unsatisfying, appearing to involve some sort of lack in God's power to make things happen as he chooses, and the second threatens monotheism itself. For if the doctrine of creation leaves open the possibility that some other being is overdetermining the existence of the cosmos, then the addition of the claim that such overdetermination has not actually occurred does not completely assuage the concern that God may be only one of multiple supernatural powers in existence. One can try to calm theological anxieties here by insisting that God is not only the sole creator but that it is metaphysically impossible that he not be the sole creator, but such a position has the same implications as a revision of the doctrine of creation itself so that such a metaphysical implication is carried by the doctrine itself rather than by this additional claim.

We reach the point, then, at which the best approach is to treat the notion of bringing about as being both complete and irresistible. The initial existence of the universe is due to the creative activity of God, where it is metaphysically impossible that the relevant action of God occur and yet the universe fail to come into being, and this creative activity of God is complete, in that the existence of the universe is solely due to the creative activity of God. The doctrine of creatio ex nihilo is thus understood to apply to the origin of the cosmos in its entirety, quantifying over everything (apart from God) that exists, and employing a notion of divine causation that provides a total explanation for the transition from non-being to being in virtue of an irresistible display of divine power.

The complete doctrine of creation applies, however, not only to the universe itself, but to all contingent things, and once we consider the application of the doctrine to other things, conflict with science is inevitable when we generalize such an account of creation to the coming into existence of every contingent thing. Our reproductive sciences, for example, attribute causal responsibility to parents for the existence of their children, but such responsibility is incompatible with the claim that God is solely responsible for the coming into being of the individuals in question.

Such difficulties drive the transitional account of creation back to the initial stages of the cosmos only, so that the doctrine of creation applies only to the origin of the cosmos and the initial conditions involved in this origin. On this account of creation, it is not only the existence of things that is the sole product of the divine creative activity but also the character of things as well. Thus, the temporal doctrine of creation accounts not only for the temporal origin of contingent things, but for every feature of contingent reality at its beginning. If such an account is allowed to be generalized to all of space and time, we get the strongest occasionalism, according to which there is no power of any sort except God's power, and God's power is incapable of being shared with anything else whatsoever.

One virtue of such an occasionalist view is the pleasing symmetry between the doctrine of creation and the doctrine of conservation. According to occasionalism, the doctrine of conservation is simply the result of generalizing the temporal account of initial creation to every moment of time, so that God is solely responsible not only for the coming into being of every contingent thing but also for every feature of every contingent thing. In this conception, there is no such thing as parents bearing causal responsibility either for the existence or character of their offspring, nor is there any room for causation in nature itself, where such causation is conceived to involve any notion of one thing or event or process making to exist or happen some other thing or event or process, since all power belongs to God. There could be, of course, ersatz causation of a sort, perhaps understandable in terms of regularities in nature or definable in terms of counterfactual relationships. But it would be a mistake, according to the occasionalist, to think of any notion definable in terms of such conditional relationships as involving an implication of any real power to make anything happen, since such power is God's alone.

Though such an occasionalism has a strong presence in the history of western monotheism, especially in Islam, the view has been opposed by medieval and modern theories according to which there is at least secondary causation in nature itself, where such secondary causation involves the presence of real power and ability in things themselves. Moreover, since the rise of modern science, it is primarily viewed as a rather desperate maneuver to solve the mind-body interaction problem that plagues Descartes' metaphysics. In addition, to the extent that it is developed to grant to God the honor due him as ruler of the universe, the angle of the incline toward pantheism is steep indeed. If it detracts from the honor due to God to conceive him as sharing power with the created order, it is mysterious why the same should not be said of being itself, so that it detracts from the honor due to God to conceive of him as sharing being with the created order. We therefore find here one of the few places in philosophy where one can find near unanimity of opinion, that whatever we wish to say about the relationship between God and the created order, we should not utter occasionalist sentiments.

In order to avoid occasionalism, the transitional account of creation, which sustains the unique role of God in creation and thereby applies equally both to the coming into being of whatever is created as well as the features of whatever is thus created, must be applied selectively rather than fully generalized. Where generalization breeds occasionalism, however, such selectivity breeds Deism. Deistic accounts restrict God's activity to only the beginning of the cosmos, and any doctrine of conservation that is embraced must be of the most completely remote sort. One might, for example, appeal to some closure principle about causal power, claiming that if A causes B and B logically implies C, then A causes C. So if God causes the initial state of the cosmos and everything else that happens is a logical result of this initial creative act, then God also causes the existence of everything else that comes to be, and thus conserves the universe in a most remote way, since it is in virtue of the original creative act that the universe avoids falling into non-being.

A more plausible version of Deism avoids any commitment to a doctrine of conservation, however. Notice that the above closure principle implies occasionalism when the notion of causation is treated univocally in it. The divine causation involved in the origin of the universe is both complete and irresistible, and if the remainder of history is nothing but logical implication, then everything is the result of the initial creative act of God and in no way the causal result of anything else.

Moreover, the appeal to the closure principle itself is problematic. It is within the scope of divine power both to create and to destroy, so the end of the cosmos at some moments in its history (and perhaps at any moment of its history) is a metaphysical possibility. If so, however, it is metaphysically impossible for the initial creative activity of God to logically imply the unfolding of the cosmos. Furthermore, if per impossible diachronic changes could be logical implications in virtue of, say, instantiating some law of nature, then any law-governed causation would be transitive. That is, if A caused B in a law-governed fashion, and B caused C in a law-governed fashion, then A would have caused C in a law-governed fashion as well (since it would be a matter of logic that once A occurs, C occurs). Transitivity for causation is, however, a controversial doctrine in itself (see, e.g., Steven Yablo (2002) and Christopher Hitchcock (2001)). For these reasons, the more plausible, and more typical, versions of Deism simply refuse any commitment to a doctrine of conservation.

The transitional account thus abandons full generality to the account of creation in order to avoid occasionalism and therefore opens the door to Deism. In light of these difficulties with the transitional account, one may be led to prefer an account of conservation and creation in terms of ontological dependence, one which downplays or eliminates the distinction between conservation and creation, thereby hoping to develop a package view in which creation and conservation are either accepted together or rejected together.

A common approach along these lines takes the fundamental notion to be that of bringing about existence, which is conceived of as a relation between two things. This relation is common to both creation and conservation, with the distinction between the two involving only the fact that creation occurs when there was no previous time at which the thing in question existed. The persistence of objects through time can then be conceived, if one wishes, in terms of a particular compilation of creations of the thing in question at each instant of its existence, thereby allowing one to explain persistence through time in terms of a unity of continuous creations.

One motivation for such an ontological dependence approach to the doctrines is to avoid any deistic temptation to splitting the question in such a way as to affirm the doctrine of creation while leaving room for denying the doctrine of conservation. There is also the motivation, however, to avoid occasionalism as well, and here the approach suggested does not succeed. The problem is that once we quantify in an unrestricted way over whatever exists, letting the primitive relation of bringing about the existence of such things apply always and everywhere, occasionalism follows quite quickly. For among the things that exist are not only objects, but also events, processes, facts, states of affairs, and anything else one might be inclined to take as the primitive relata in causation. For simplicity, assume that causation is a relation on events. If the notion of bringing about is complete and irresistible, as discussed previously, and if God brings about the existence of all events, then we have a complete causal explanation of the entire story of the cosmos, with no room remaining for any causal power to be exerted by anything distinct from God. An approach to the doctrines of creation and conservation that applies the notion of ontological dependence in a completely unrestricted fashion, then, risks occasionalism no less than does the unrestricted version of the transitional approach.

In order to avoid this consequence, we must restrict the notion of continuous creation to objects alone. By so doing, we leave some room for God to be responsible for the persistence of objects by continuously creating them at each instant of their existence, but with no implication that events persist or have their particular natures in virtue of continuous creation. Perhaps some justification can be given for this restriction if we develop a metaphysics on which objects themselves are ontologically fundamental, with events, processes, facts and states of affairs being derived entities. In doing so, we generate some hope of explaining why the notion of ontological dependence applies selectively rather than universally, and also some hope of finding a place for secondary causes in nature to account for the sequence of events so as to avoid the spectre of occasionalism.

3. Conservation, Concurrence, and Divine Causation

It is not clear, however, how satisfactory such a theory is. Note that the notion of bringing about has to be both complete and irresistible, so that God's activity of bringing about rules out some cooperative activity by other powers, and in a way that is metaphysically sufficient for the effect in question. These two commitments place the account at odds with the usual understanding of scientific explanations of the cosmos. Scientific theories of reproduction are usually understood, for example, to explain not only the events involved in reproduction but also the existence of the offspring in question. Moreover, the central place of conservation laws and inertial principles in scientific theories suggests a role for nature to play not only in the character of the future of the cosmos but in its continued existence.

There is thus strong pressure to limit this robust notion of bringing about to the initial creative act of bringing the cosmos into existence out of nothing, and employing some weaker notion of bringing about when describing God's continued activity in the course of nature in terms of conservation (if one wishes to avoid both deism and occasionalism). One might extend the reach of the doctrine of creation to cover aspects of existence that science has no hope of explaining (such as the coming into existence of persons with souls, where such things are intrinsically outside the explanatory purview of science). Or one might extend the account to every object in the entire history of the cosmos provided that the only objects that exist are ones that are created in the initial creative act itself.

Both of these latter options present difficulties of their own. First, it isn't very plausible to suppose that every object is everlasting in the sense of existing at every moment of time if it exists at any moment of time. Moreover, even though there are strong theological motivations to affirm a dualism that makes certain objects in the universe distinctive in virtue of being partly non-physical, it is an advantage to an account of creation and conservation to avoid such implications from these doctrines themselves. That is, the doctrines of creation and conservation should not be thought of in a way that, by themselves, rules out physicalist and materialist accounts of created beings, including human beings. Thus, the most attractive way to develop the ontological dependence approach is to adopt a different account of bringing about for the creation of the cosmos from that involved in post-creation existence. Such an account need not distinguish between objects and events with respect to what God brings about, for if the notion of bringing about leaves room for secondary causation regarding the existence of things, there is no reason to worry that occasionalism threatens if God is responsible both for the existence of objects and events.

The cost of such a revision, however, is a renewed threat from Deism. For one account of the difference between the strong bringing about at work in the initiation of the cosmos and the weaker bringing about at work in later stages is through the way in which initial activity carries through time in virtue of the causal and spatiotemporal structure of the world. For example, it may be true that the Protestant Reformation is a partial cause of World War II, in virtue of some causal chain leading from the former to the latter. If the weaker notion of bringing about is interpreted along these lines, then the doctrines of creation and conservation that result may be fully compatible with deistic assumptions about God's relationship to ongoing history.

To avoid such Deistic threats, the notion of bringing about in question must be clarified so that it involves some activity on the part of God that is an immediate, even if only partial, cause of existence. Such an account can still distinguish between strong bringing about at the initiation of the cosmos from the divine role in creating and sustaining the universe at its later stages. In addition, with respect to the later stages, it has the additional virtue of explaining how the same generic divine activity is responsible for the existence as well as the persistence of things. Divine conservation of a sort that can have present effects on the basis of things done in the remote past must be supplemented or replaced with the idea of divine concurrence concerning present effects, a concurrence that implies causal responsibility of a certain sort together with immediacy of activity in producing the present effect. (For an instructive account of a notion of concurrence with such a result, see Freddoso (1991).)

The avoidance of Deism thus becomes as problematic for the ontological dependence approach as for the transitional approach. To avoid it, an account of divine concurrence must be added, but if one adds it without some argument as to why it is implicit in the notion of ontological dependence itself, the ontological dependence approach has no advantage over the transitional approach. The best hope here is on the basis of further work on the nature of causation itself that would bar a Deistic account of remote responsibility for the entire unfolding of the history of the cosmos in virtue of some initial creative activity of God, and though there are some glimmers of hope on this score, the work remains to be done.


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