Notes to Hasdai Crescas

1. On the situation of the Jewish community of Spain during his period, see Baer 1992

2. On the utilization of scholastic sources by Rabbi Nissim of Gerondi see Harvey 1992.

3. On this subject see Harvey 2010, pp. 63–67; Harvey 1990.

4. On this pogrom see Netanyahu 1995, pp. 127–168.

5. On this book see Ravitzky 1989. On the debate about the date of his writing see also Harvey 1989.

6. The origin of this opinion in Avicenna and Rabbi Abraham Ibn Ezra is the view that man can acquire enough knowledge to achieve an ontological degree that allows him to tell nature what to do.

7. Or Hashem, pp. 189–193. On prophecy in the thought of Crescas, see Kreisel 2001, pp. 425–485.

8. There exists a modern critical edition by D. J. Lasker.

9. Rabbi Josef Ibn Shem Tov, the Hebrew translator, says that Crescas wrote another polemical book in Catalan based on quotations from the Bible. He apologizes for not translating this book and explains that there exist other books in this style.

10. On this subject see Lasker 1992, pp. 21–23.

11. We do not currently have a critical edition; the most modern edition is that of Rabbi Fisher. In the first manuscript (Firenze 417) the name of the book is אור יי. In the rest of the manuscripts the name is אור השם (for example Parma 3020; London Mon 281), אור ה (for examle Paris 737; JTS 2251; JTS 2514) or אור יהוה (Vatican 261). The book is quoted according to his name in the Fisher edition.

12. On this subject see Harvey 1980, Ofir 1993.

13. On the critique of Crescas on this subject see Kellner 1986, pp. 108–139. It is interesting to note that Crescas's pupil Rabbi Josef Albo wrote a major book, Book on the Principles, using the same plan. Albo does not accept all of his master opinions on this subject either. Rabbi Isaac Abrabanel, in his book The Pinnacle of Faith, responds to these criticisms of Maimonides' principles.

14. On this subject see Or Hashem, pp. 9–12.

15. Or Hashem, pp. 98–99. Spinoza quotes this proof of Crescas in his twelfth letter. On this proof in Avicenna, see Davidson 1987, pp. 281–310; on the utilization of this proof in Crescas (different than in Avicenna), see p. 385.

16. This we can see in the second essay, pp. 141–148.

17. On the subject of God's attributes, see Wolfson 1916; Pines 1967; Schweid 1970, pp. 26–37; Harvey 1983, pp. 88–91; and Harvey 2000.

18. This opinion is common to Gersonides and some scholastic authors like Scotus, but Crescas quotes him from Gersonides. Like the other Jewish philosophers of Spain in the Middle Ages, Crescas does not name his Christian sources.

19. On this subject see Wolfson 1929; Pines 1967; Rabinovitch 1970; Davidson 1979; Harvey 1980; Levy 1992; Harvey 1998; Maccoby 2003; Fraenkel 2008; Sadik 2008; and Harvey 2010, pp. 54–62.

20. On this subject see especially Or Hashem, pp. 71–74. Crescas deals with infinity in a few other places in the second part of the first essay.

21. On the influence of Crescas on Spinoza vis a vis this topic see Wolfson 1934, pp. 223ff; and Fraenkel 2009.

22. On this subject see especially Or Hashem, pp. 66–69 and 81–82.

23. On this subject see especially Or Hashem, pp. 64–67 and 83–84.

24. On this subject see Ravitzky 1982; Touati 1983; Ackerman 1994; Bleich 1997; Feldman 1984 and 1982; and Harvey 1980, 1985.

25. Ravitzky 1982 argues that these two chapters were written under the influence of Duns Scotus. According to this opinion, after years of being under the influence of Abner's book, Ofrenda de Zelos, Crescas built a more deterministic opinion and tried to harmonize it with his earlier thinking. Harvey 1989 critiques this position of Ravitzky and said that it is no probable that Crescas, as a Jewish philosopher, know the difficult Latin works of Dun Scott before the Hebrew book of the very knows apostate Abner. New studies (Sadik 2008) about the influence of Abner on Crescas that prove the influence of Abner to the early stage of Crescas thinking (especially about his critiques of the Aristotelian science) reinforce the opinion of Harvey.

26. Ravitzky (1982) asks a question about the breakdown of determinism in these chapters, as does Rosenberg (forthcoming), and even Harvey (2010, pp. 107–113) on the question of beliefs. See Harvey 2010, pp. 120–126 and Harvey 1985.

27. That is the opinion of Abner according to Ravitzky 1982. For another interpretation of Abner, which is closer to the second understanding of Crescas, see Sadik 2011.

28. Crescas devotes the fourth part of the fourth essay (Or Hashem, pp. 396–399) to this subject.

29. Or Hashem, pp 239–251. Crescas touches on this subject in some other places, for example in the second and third part of the third essay. On this subject, see Harvey 1973.

30. Especially from Gersonides's presentation of the Aristorelian commentators.

31. For a list of the people in his circle see Ofir 1993, pp. 321–349. Ofir gives a list of fourteen important rabbis.

32. Rabbi Josef Ibn Shem Tov mentions the influence of Abner on Crescas (on the subject of determinism) in his commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics.

33. A good example of this relation is the quotation in the twelfth letter on the subject regarding the proof of God's existence.

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Shalom Sadik <>

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