Notes to Darwinism

1. So described, Darwinism denotes not so much a theory as a ‘research tradition’ (Laudan, 1976) or a ‘scientific practice’ (Kitcher 1993); that is, at any given time in its history Darwinism consists of a family of theories related by a shared ontology, methodology and goals; and through time, it consists of a lineage of such theories. The word ‘theory’ above is being used in the very broad sense in which, from early on in his notebooks, Darwin kept referring to ‘my theory’.

2. The word ‘scientist’ was coined by William Whewell during Darwin's lifetime, but very few of Darwin's contemporaries owned up to it.

3. An entertaining account of the culture of the key members of this group can be found in Uglow 2002.

4. I.e., A Preliminary Discourse on the Study of Natural Philosophy, initially the introductory volume to Dionysius Lardner's Cabinet Cyclopedia. It was published during Darwin's final semester at Cambridge.

5. It is worth noting here that in chapter VI. of his Preliminary Discourse, a chapter devoted to induction and the discovery of causes, Herschel's first two extended examples are taken from the first volume of Lyell's Principles of Geology, which was published in 1830, the same year as the Preliminary Discourse. It is also worth noting that Lyell's work is first and foremost a defense of a new method in geology, a new set of principles for the fledgling science. Thus Lyell's work is held up as exemplary in a treatise on philosophy of science (as we would call it), and its influence on Darwin was as much on the philosophical as on the scientific level (as we would say).

6. Two puzzles are worth noting about Darwin's reaction to Herschel's letter. First, though Darwin's unpublished diary of the Beagle voyage does comment on the personal importance to him of meeting and talking with Herschel at the Cape, the published Journal of Researches, based on the diary, completely omits mention of his days (June 8-15) in Cape Town. Though I can see no relevance to the fact, the published version of the diary appeared in 1839, two years after Babbage's Bridgewater Treatise, and Darwin's ‘Hurrah’. Second, the reference at the beginning of the Origin to ‘one of our greatest philosophers’ would be opaque to all but a group of insiders, those familiar with the excerpts of Herschel's letter to Lyell that had been published in Babbage's Bridgewater Treatise. Given that the passage had been published, why not name the philosopher who called species origins ‘that mystery of mysteries’? It would be interesting to know at what point Darwin decided to use that phrase to introduce his ‘big species book’.

In sum, Darwin appears reluctant to name Herschel in print in connection with ‘the species question’. Whether this is evidence that they discussed the content of that letter when they met in June of1836 I do not know. However, there is strong evidence that they did. One of the early entries (p. 32; p. 38 of the Herbert edition) in ‘The Red Notebook’, which Darwin began the day the Beagle left Cape Town, refers to “Sir J. Herschels [sic] idea of escape of Heat prevented by sedimentary rocks, and hence Volcanic action…”. As Herbert's note to the passage says: “Months before [meeting Darwin] Herschel had described his new notion of the cause of volcanic action in a letter to Charles Lyell dated 20 February 1836. Probably he repeated the same explanation to Darwin in June.” Another possibility is that he showed him a copy of the entire letter; since both were professional geologists who had been reading Lyell carefully, it could have served as the basis for their discussions. (Cf. Herbert 1980, pp. 38, 86.)

7. A more recent phenomenon than is usually appreciated. In Dobzhansky 1937, after describing Ronald Fisher's ‘extreme selectionism’, he quotes, as a ‘good contrast’, the following remark of selection skeptics G. C. Robson and O. W. Richards 1936: “We do not believe that natural selection can be disregarded as a possible factor in evolution. Nevertheless, there is so little positive evidence in its favor…that we have no right to assign to it the main causative role in evolution.”

8. On which see Beatty 1990 and Lennox 1993.

9. Darwin was examined as an undergraduate on John Locke's Essay on Human Understanding. As far as I know he never discusses whether this had any impact on his willingness to articulate the views expressed in this quote.

10. There is a very important, and under explored, tension here at least in Lyell and Herschel, both of whom seem to be in many other respects orthodox followers of Scottish empiricism.

11. Dov Ospovat (1980, 51-53), of course, argues persuasively that Darwin only gradually gave up a roughly Lamarckian view of the origins of variation.

12. Cf. Shanahan 1991, 249-269. Compare Eble 1999, 76-78, who notes a number of the same uses of ‘random’ and ‘chance’ as those discussed here, but sees their relationships quite differently. The ideas in Eble 1999 are nicely elaborated in Millstein (2000, 608-613).

13. Cf. Barrett et al. 1987, 279; and notes 1-4 to notebook page C133.

14. It should be stressed here that this discussion is restricted to explanations of adaptation within the Darwinian framework, i.e. by reference to natural selection. Whether other sorts of explanation in other aspects of biology are teleological or not, and whether, if they are, the explanation would take the same form, is left entirely open. For a good survey of this question, and a defense of a distinct understanding of biological function in the domain of comparative morphology, see Amundson and Lauder,1998.

Copyright © 2010 by
James Lennox <jglennox+@pitt.edu>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free