‘David’ is named in certain manuscripts of three works of philosophy as their author: a set of introductory lectures on philosophy, a commentary on Porphyry's Introduction, and a commentary on Aristotle's Categories that nowadays is attributed to Elias. The name is commonly taken, on the basis of evidence internal to these works, to refer to a Christian Neoplatonic philosopher and commentator who presumably worked in Alexandria in the middle or the second half of the 6th century, or even later. This ‘David’ is also commonly identified with David the Invincible, an important figure in the early history of Armenian philosophy, but biographical identifications of this kind are extremely precarious.
Byzantium in the 6th century witnessed at once a last flourishing and a dramatic decline of the tradition of composing philosophical commentaries on the works of Plato and Aristotle, a tradition which began in earnest in the 2nd century CE. David, together with the almost equally enigmatic Elias, and Stephanus, belong to the very end of this tradition that reached its pinnacle in the century's first half with the great commentaries of Ammonius Hermeiou and his pupils Simplicius and John Philoponus in the East, and with Boethius in the West. If we discount a commentary on the Categories which the manuscript tradition uniformly attributes to ‘David’ but which, in style and doctrine, is more closely related to works attributed to ‘Elias’, there remain two texts we have to consider as his works, one entitled ‘Prolegomena philosophiae’ (‘Introduction to Philosophy’), the other lectures on Porphyry's ‘Introduction to Aristotle's Categories’. The author of these texts refers to Olympiodorus four times and may have been his pupil. Olympiodorus, who was a pagan, held the chair of philosophy at Alexandria as a successor to Ammonius and Eutocius for well over 30 years, from around 530 to about 565. These are the only pieces of evidence that provide us with a rough estimate as to the time of composition.
Both the ‘Introduction to Philosophy’ and the commentary on Porphyry arose out of the author's teaching activity, presuambly at the school of Alexandria. The text is divided throughout into more or less self-contained ‘lectures,’ called ‘praxeis,’ a formal structure that was first used by Olympiodorus. The ‘Introduction to Philosophy’ consists of 24 such lectures. In fact, the texts we have state in their title that they were written down "from the voice" of David; this means that while the teacher lectured, a student would take copious notes that were then copied out and circulated, a practice that was not uncommon in the Alexandrian school.
Giving introductory lectures to beginners in philosophy was a standard part of higher education at Alexandria; Ammonius and Olympiodorus taught such lectures, and as time went on, the ritual became more and more elaborate: Elias' ‘Introduction to Philosophy’ is about twice as long as that of Ammonius, David's about four times as long. As today, a lecture of this kind offered an occasion to inspire students with a love for philosophy. Whereas Ammonius' lectures were pretty dry and to the point, Elias wore the cloak of an entertaining intellectual, and David comes across as a serious man passionate about philosophy. Here are the opening lines of his first lecture:
Those who passionately love philosophical arguments and have tasted the pleasure that derives from them with their fingertips, having said farewell to all of life's concerns, are evidently pulled towards these arguments by some kind madness and in their souls evoke the love for them by the knowledge of the things that are. As we shall learn with god's help, philosophy is just this knowledge. Now, since wise love and great desire have driven us into this struggle, let us tackle the divine struggle of philosophy without regarding the task before us as difficult; rather in looking towards the end of the divine promise of philosophy, we shall regard any effort as inferior and secondary to it.
Somewhat surprising is that these words are generally supposed to have been uttered by a Christian. Although it is most certainly wrong to reckon with a clear dichotomy between the intellectual commitments and sentiments of ‘Christians’ and ‘pagans’ in late antiquity, it is striking that David's text gives us no firm indication that the author was indeed a Christian. On the contrary, there are many features that belong to the old world of pagan polytheism: the world is eternal, the soul immortal, the celestial bodies divine, and we hear of irrational avenging spirits and long-living nymphs. Moreover, ‘David’ seems to proselytize among his students, trying to turn their minds and souls towards pagan Greek philosophy understood as a commitment to a certain way of life. For example, he makes heavy weather of the Platonic idea that philosophy is an assimilation to god and claims at one point that "the complete philosopher is similar to god because he is characterized by the same things as god, in particular universal knowledge" (p. 17, 1ff). He finishes his lectures with a resounding exhortation that philosophy "adorns human souls and transfers the soul from the dim corporeality of this life to what is divine and immaterial", citing a line from Homer in support (p. 79, 2-5).
In the sequence of courses, the ‘Prolegomena’ were followed by lectures on Porphyry's seminal ‘Introduction to Aristotle's Categories’. Porphyry, who started the neoplatonic tradition of commentaries on Aristotle at the end of the 3rd century, was once approached by a Roman senator, Chrysarius, who had great difficulty understanding Aristotle's ‘Categories’; Elias and David tell their students how Porphyry seized the opportunity to write what should turn out to be an extremely popular and influential text, the so-called ‘Isagogê’ (‘Introduction’). The text deals with a detailed explanation of the five logical-ontological key concepts: genus, species, differentia, essential attribute and accidental attribute.
David explains that an understanding of this text is in fact not only requisite for an understanding of Aristotle's Categories, but serves also as a preparation for philosophy in general — in addition to providing a training in dialectical method (87, 2-5). His view is that the terms Porphyry explicates are the building blocks of any kind of philosophical discourse.
In the two texts we still possess, the author also refers to his own exegesis of the Categories, the De interpretatione, and the Physics, but these commentaries have not been discovered. Whether or not David lectured also on Plato we do not know.
We do not know whether the texts transmitted under the name of ‘David’ were written at a time when Olympiodorus was still alive and active, or whether they date to the last decades of the 6th, beginning of the 7th, centuries. The inability precisely to date these texts compounds the difficulties that surround the attribution to a philosopher named ‘David’. These difficulties are threefold:
First, in the Greek tradition, we nowhere find evidence of an Alexandrian philosopher named David; neither the Suda nor Hesychius nor Photius nor anyone else seems to know of any such person. Second, the texts we have were evidently widely distributed and read, and an abbreviated and simplified version of the ‘Prolegomena to Philosophy’ was translated at some point into Armenian (our earliest manuscripts date from the 14th century). The Armenian version was given a new title and attributed to ‘David, the Invincible’, who, according to the Armenian tradition, however, was a theologian of the 5th century. It is impossible to believe that the Armenian theologian and the (Alexandrian) philosopher a century later were one and the same. There is also no reason to believe that the latter David was of Armenian origin. Here, the cross-fertilization of intellectual traditions has given rise to a great deal of confusion which, in the absence of earlier manuscripts, is quite impossible to clear up completely.
The third difficulty concerns the Greek manuscript tradition. All of our older manuscripts (from the 11th century onwards) are either anonymous or attribute the texts either to Elias, to the saint David of Thessaloniki (who died around 530), or to the 10th century Byzantine scholar Nicetas of Paphlagonia who called himself by the monastic name ‘David’. Only the 16th century manuscripts and one from the 14th century name ‘David’ at all as author, and it seems imprudent to put too much, if any, weight on this attribution. It is quite possible that the texts we have now under the name of David first circulated as anonymous lecture notes and were only later attributed to an author with a good Christian name so as to enhance its importance and authority among Christian readers.
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