Photo of Richard Dedekind

Dedekind's Contributions to the Foundations of Mathematics

First published Tue Apr 22, 2008; substantive revision Tue Sep 6, 2011

Richard Dedekind (1831–1916) was one of the greatest mathematicians of the nineteenth-century, as well as one of the most important contributors to number theory and algebra of all time. Any comprehensive history of mathematics will mention him for his invention of the theory of ideals and his investigation of the notions of algebraic number, field, module, lattice, etc. (see, e.g., Dieudonné 1985, Boyer & Merzbach 1991, Stillwell 2000, Kolmogorov & Yushkevich 2001). Dedekind's more foundational work in mathematics is also widely known, at least in parts. Often acknowledged in that connection are: his analysis of the notion of continuity, his introduction of the real numbers by means of Dedekind cuts, his formulation of the Dedekind-Peano axioms for the natural numbers, his proof of the categoricity of these axioms, and his contributions to the early development of set theory (Grattan-Guinness 1980, Ferreirós 1996, 1999, Jahnke 2003).

While many of Dedekind's contributions to mathematics and its foundations are thus common knowledge, they are seldom discussed together. In particular, his mathematical writings are often treated separately from his foundational ones. This entry provides a broad survey of his contributions. The main focus will be on his foundational writings, but they will be related to his other mathematical work. Indeed, it will be argued that foundational concerns are at play throughout Dedekind's work, so that any attempt to distinguish sharply between his “mathematical” and “foundational” writings is artificial and misleading. Another goal of the entry is to establish the continuing relevance of his contributions to the philosophy of mathematics whose full significance has only started to be recognized. This is especially so with respect to methodological and epistemological aspects of Dedekind's work, which ground the logical and metaphysical views that emerge in his writings.


1. Biographical Information

Richard Dedekind was born in Brunswick (Braunschweig), a city in northern Germany, in 1831. Much of his education took place in Brunswick as well, where he first attended school and then, for two years, the local technical university. In 1850, he transferred to the University of Göttingen, a center for scientific research in Europe at the time. Carl Friedrich Gauss, one of the greatest mathematicians of all time, taught in Göttingen, and Dedekind became his last doctoral student. He wrote a dissertation in mathematics under Gauss, finished in 1852. As was customary, he also wrote a second dissertation (Habilitation), completed in 1854, shortly after that of his colleague and friend Bernhard Riemann. Dedekind stayed in Göttingen for four more years, as an unsalaried lecturer (Privatdozent). During that time he was strongly influenced by P.G. Lejeune-Dirichlet, another renowned mathematician in Göttingen, and by Riemann, then a rising star. (Later, Dedekind did important editorial work for Gauss, Dirichlet, and Riemann.) In 1858, he moved to the Polytechnic in Zurich (later ETH Zürich), Switzerland, to take up his first salaried position. He returned to Brunswick in 1862, where he became professor at the local university and taught until his retirement in 1896. In this later period, he published most of his major works; he also had further interactions with important mathematicians. Thus, he was in correspondence with Georg Cantor, collaborated with Heinrich Weber, and developed an intellectual rivalry with Leopold Kronecker. He stayed in his hometown until the end of his life, in 1916.

Dedekind's main foundational writings are: Stetigkeit und irrationale Zahlen (1872) and Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen? (1888a). Equally important, according to historians of mathematics, is his work in algebraic number theory. That work was first presented in an unusual manner: as supplements to Dirichlet's Vorlesungen über Zahlentheorie. The latter was edited by Dedekind in the form of lecture notes, initially under Dirichlet's supervision, and published in several editions. It is in his supplements to the second edition, from 1871, that Dedekind's famous theory of ideals was introduced. He then modified and expanded it several times, until the fourth edition of 1893 (Lejeune-Dirichlet 1893, Dedekind 1964); an intermediate version of Dedekind's theory was also published separately in a French translation (Dedekind 1877). Further works by Dedekind include: a long article on the theory of algebraic functions, written jointly with Heinrich Weber (Dedekind 1882); and a variety of shorter pieces in algebra, number theory, complex analysis, probability theory, etc. All of these were re-published, with selections from his Nachlass, in Dedekind (1930–32). Finally, lecture notes from some of his own classes were made available later (Dedekind 1981, 1985), as were additional selections from his Nachlass (Dedekind 1982, see also Dugac 1976, Sinaceur 1990, and Schlimm 2000).

As this brief chronology indicates, Dedekind was a wide-ranging and very creative mathematician, although he tended to publish slowly and carefully. It also shows that he was part of a distinguished tradition in mathematics, extending from Gauss and Dirichlet through Riemann, Dedekind himself, Cantor, and Weber in the nineteenth century, on to David Hilbert, Emmy Noether, B.L. van der Waerden, Nicolas Bourbaki, and others in the twentieth century. With the partial exceptions of Riemann, Cantor, and Hilbert, these mathematicians did not publish explicitly philosophical treatises. On the other hand, all of them were very sensitive to foundational issues understood in a broad sense, including the choice of basic concepts, the kinds of reasoning to be used, and the presuppositions build into them. As a consequence, one can find philosophically pregnant remarks sprinkled through their mathematical works, as exemplified by Dedekind (1872) and (1888a).

Not much is known about other intellectual influences on Dedekind. He did not align himself explicitly with a particular philosopher or philosophical school. Indeed, little is known about which philosophical texts he might have read. A rare piece of information we have in this connection is that he became aware of Gottlob Frege's most philosophical work, Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik (published in 1884), only after having settled on his own basic ideas (Dedekind 1888a, preface to the second edition). In his short biography of Riemann (Dedekind 1876a) he also brings up the post-Kantian philosopher and educator J.F. Herbart, professor in Göttingen from 1833 to 1841, as an influence on Riemann; and in his correspondence, Dedekind mentions the German Idealist J.G. Fichte, although only in passing (Scharlau 1981). Then again, German intellectual life at the time was saturated with Kantian views, including claims about the essential role of intuition for mathematics, and there is evidence that Dedekind was familiar with at least some corresponding discussions.

Literature: No book-length biography of Dedekind exists so far. For shorter accounts, see Jourdain (1916), Landau (1917), Biermann (1971), Dugac (1976), Scharlau (1981), Mehrtens (1982), Ewald (1996b), Stein (1998), Ferreirós (1999), Hawking (2005b), and Harborth (2007).

2. Overtly Foundational Work

2.1 The Foundations of Analysis

The issues addressed in Dedekind's Stetigkeit und irrationale Zahlen (Continuity and Irrational Numbers) grow out of the “rigorization” and “arithmetization” of analysis (the mathematical theory) in the first half of the nineteenth century. The roots of these issues go deeper, however, all the way down, or back, to the discovery of incommensurable magnitudes in Ancient Greek geometry (Jahnke 2003, ch. 1, Cooke 2005). The Greeks' response to this startling discovery culminated in Eudoxos' theory of ratios and proportionality, presented in Chapter V of Euclid's Elements. This theory brought with it a sharp distinction between discrete quantities (numbers) and continuous quantities (magnitudes), thus leading to the traditional view of mathematics as the science of number, on the one hand, and of magnitude, on the other hand. Dedekind's first foundational work concerns, at bottom, the relationship between the two sides of this dichotomy.

An important part of the dichotomy, as traditionally understood, was that magnitudes and ratios of them were not thought of as numerical entities, with arithmetic operations defined on them, but in a more concrete geometric way (as lengths, areas, volumes, angles, etc. and as relations between them). More particularly, while Eudoxos' theory provides a contextual criterion for the equality of ratios, it does not provide for a definition of the ratios themselves, so that they are not conceived of as independent entities (Mueller 1981, Stein 1990, Cooke 2005). Such features do little harm with respect to empirical applications of the theory. But they lead to inner-mathematical tensions when solutions to various algebraic equations are considered (some of which could be represented numerically, but others only geometrically). This tension came increasingly to the fore in the mathematics of the early modern period, especially after Descartes' integration of algebra and geometry. What was called for, in response, was a unified treatment of discrete and continuous quantities.

More directly, Dedekind's essay was tied to the arithmetization of analysis in the nineteenth century—pursued by Cauchy, Bolzano, Weierstrass, and others—which in turn was a reaction to tensions within the differential and integral calculus, introduced earlier by Newton, Leibniz, and their followers (Jahnke 2003, chs. 3–6). As is well known, the inventors of the calculus relied on appeals to “infinitesimal” quantities, typically backed up by geometric or even mechanical considerations. But this came to be seen as problematic. The early “arithmetizers” found a way to avoid infinitesimals (in terms of the epsilon-delta characterization of limit processes familiar from current introductions to the calculus). Yet this again, or even more, led to the need for a systematic characterization of various quantities conceived of as numerical entities, including a unified treatment of rational and irrational numbers.

Dedekind faced this need directly, also from a pedagogical perspective, when he started teaching classes on the calculus at Zurich in 1858 (Dedekind 1872, preface). Moreover, the goal for him, from early on, was not just to supply an explicit, rigorous, and unified account of rational and irrational numbers—he also wanted to do so in a way that established the independence of analysis from mechanics and geometry, indeed from intuitive considerations more generally. This reveals a further philosophical motivation for Dedekind's work on the foundations of analysis, although one not unconnected with the mathematics involved; and it is not hard to see an implicit anti-Kantian thrust in it. Finally, the way in which to achieve all of these objectives was to relate arithmetic and analysis closely to each other, indeed to reduce the latter to the former.

While the basic idea of reducing analysis to arithmetic, as opposed to geometry, was not new at the time—Dedekind shared it with, and adopted it from, his teachers Gauss and Dirichlet (Ferreirós 1999, ch. 4)—the particular manner in which he proceeded was quite original. The crucial issue, or the linchpin, for him was the notion of continuity. To get clearer about that notion, Dedekind compared the system of rational numbers with the system of points on a geometric line. Once a point of origin, a unit length, and a direction have been picked for the latter, the two systems are directly relatable: each rational number can be correlated, in a unique and order-preserving way, with a point on the line. But a further question then arises: Does each point on the line correspond to a rational number? Crucially, that question can be reformulated in terms of Dedekind's idea of “cuts” defined directly on the rational numbers, so that any geometric intuition concerning continuity can be put aside. Namely, if we divide the whole system of rational numbers into two disjoint parts, thereby preserving their order, is each such division determined by a rational number? The answer is no, since some correspond to irrational numbers (e.g., the cut consisting of {x : x2 < 2} and {x : x2 > 2} corresponds to √2). In this sense, the system of rational numbers is not continuous, i.e. not line-complete.

For our purposes several aspects of Dedekind's procedure, at the start and in the next few steps, are important (compare Ferreirós 1999, ch. 4, and Cooke 2005). As indicated, Dedekind starts by considering the system of rational numbers seen as a whole. Noteworthy here are two aspects: Not only does he accept this system as an “actual infinity”, in the sense of a complete infinite set that is treated as a mathematical object in itself; he also considers it “structurally”, as an example of a linearly ordered set closed under addition and multiplication (an ordered field). In his next step—and proceeding further along set-theoretic and structuralist lines—Dedekind introduces the set of arbitrary cuts on his initial system, thus working essentially with the bigger and more complex infinity of all subsets of the rational numbers (the full power set). It is possible to show that the set of those cuts can, in turn, be endowed with a linear ordering and with operations of addition and multiplication, thus constituting a totally new “number system”.

It is not the cuts Dedekind wants to work with in the end, however. Instead, for each cut—those corresponding to rational numbers, but also those corresponding to irrational quantities—he “creates” a new object, a “real number”, determined by the cut. It is those objects, together with an order relation and with arithmetic operations defined on them (in terms of the corresponding cuts), that form the crucial system for him. Next, two properties of that new system are established: The rational numbers can be embedded into it, in a way that respects the order and the arithmetic operations defined on those numbers (a corresponding field homomorphism exists); and the new system is continuous, or line-complete, with respect to its order. What we get, overall, is the long missing unified criterion of identity for rational and irrational numbers, both of which can now be treated as elements in an encompassing number system (isomorphic to, but distinct from, the system of cuts). Finally Dedekind indicates how, along such lines, explicit and straightforward proofs of various facts about the real numbers can be given, including ones that had been accepted without satisfactory proof so far. These include: basic rules of operation with square roots; and the theorem that every increasing bounded sequence of real numbers has a limit value (a result equivalent, among others, to the more well-known intermediate value theorem.)

Dedekind's published this treatment of the real numbers only in 1872, fourteen years after developing the basic ideas on which it relies. It was not the only treatment proposed at the time. Various mathematicians addressed this issue, including: Weierstrass, Thomae, Méray, Heine, Hankel, Cantor, and somewhat later, Frege (Dieudonné 1985, ch. 6, Boyer & Merzbach 1991, ch. 25, and Jahnke 2003, ch. 10). Most familiar among those alternative accounts is probably Cantor's, also published in 1872. Instead of using “Dedekind cuts”, Cantor works with (equivalence classes of) Cauchy sequences of rational numbers. The system of such (classes of) sequences can also be shown to have the desired properties, including continuity. Cantor, like Dedekind, starts with the infinite set of rational numbers; and Cantor's construction again relies essentially on the full power set of the rational numbers, here in the form of arbitrary Cauchy sequences. In such logical or set-theoretic respects the two treatments are thus equivalent. What sets apart Dedekind's treatment of the real numbers, from Cantor's and all the others, is the clarity he achieves with respect to the central notion of continuity. His treatment is also more maturely and elegantly structuralist, in a sense to be spelled out further below.

Literature: For another summary of Dedekind (1872), see Cooke (2005). Compare also Dugac (1976), Mueller (1981), Dieudonné (1985), Grattan-Guinness (1980), Gardies (1984), Stein (1990), Boyer & Merzbach (1991), Ferreirós (1996, 1999), Jahnke (2003), and Reck (2003a).

2.2 The Foundations of Arithmetic

Providing an explicit, systematic, and fruitful definition of the real numbers constitutes a major step towards completing the arithmetization of analysis. Further reflection on Dedekind's procedure (and similar ones) leads to a new question, however: What exactly is involved in it if it is thought through fully, i.e., what does his account of the real numbers rely on ultimately? As noted, Dedekind starts with the system of rational numbers; and he uses a set-theoretic procedure to construct, in a central step, the new system of cuts out of them. This suggests two sub-questions: First, how exactly are we to think about the rational numbers in this connection? Second, can anything further be said about the relevant set-theoretic procedures and the assumptions behind them?

In his published writings Dedekind does not provide a direct and full answer to our first sub-question. What suggests itself, from a contemporary point of view, is that he relied on the idea that the rational numbers can be dealt with in terms of the natural numbers together with some set-theoretic techniques. And in fact, in Dedekind's Nachlass explicit sketches of two now familiar constructions can be found: that of the positive and negative integers as (equivalence classes of) pairs of natural numbers; and that of the rational numbers as (equivalence classes of) pairs of integers (Sieg & Schlimm 2005, earlier Dugac 1976). It seems that these constructions were familiar enough at the time for Dedekind not to feel the need to publish his sketches. (There is also a direct parallel to the construction of the complex numbers as pairs of real numbers, known to Dedekind from William Rowan Hamilton's work, and more indirectly, to the use of residue classes in developing modular arithmetic, including in Dedekind 1857. For the former see Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7, for the latter also Dugac 1976.)

This leads to the following result: All the material needed for analysis, including all rational and irrational numbers, can be constructed out of the natural numbers by set-theoretic means. But now the question arises: Do we have to take the natural numbers themselves as simply given, or can anything further be said about those numbers, perhaps by reducing them to something even more fundamental? Many mathematicians in the nineteenth century were willing to assume the former. A well-known example is Leopold Kronecker, for whom the natural numbers are “given by God” while the rest of arithmetic and analysis is “made by mankind” (Ferreirós 1999, ch. 4). In contrast Dedekind, and independently Frege, pursued the latter option—they attempted to reduce the natural numbers and arithmetic to “logic”. This is the main goal of Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen? (The Nature and Meaning of Numbers, or more literally, What are the numbers and what are they for?). Another goal is to answer the second sub-question left open above: whether more can be said about the set-theoretic procedures used. For Dedekind, again like for Frege, these procedures are founded in “logic”. But then, what are the basic notions of logic?

Dedekind's answer to this last question is: basic for logic are the notions of object (“Ding”), set (or system, “System”), and function (mapping, “Abbildung”). These notions are, indeed, fundamental for human thought—they are applicable in all domains, indispensable in exact reasoning, and not genuinely reducible further (Ferreirós 1999, ch. 4, Reck 2003a). While not definable in terms of anything more basic, the fundamental logical notions are nevertheless capable of being elucidated, thus of being understood better. Part of their elucidation consists in observing what can be done with them, including how arithmetic can be developed in terms of them (more on other parts below). For Dedekind, that development starts with the consideration of infinite sets, as in the case of the real numbers, but now in a generalized and more systematic manner.

Dedekind does not just assume, or simply postulate, the existence of infinite sets—he tries to prove it. He considers “the totality of all things that can be objects of my thought” and argues that this “set” is infinite (Dedekind 1888a, section v). He also does not just presuppose the concept of infinity—he defines it (in terms of his three basic notions of logic, as well as the definable notions of subset, union, intersection, etc.). The definition is this: A set of objects is infinite—“Dedekind-infinite”, as we now say—if it can be mapped one-to-one onto a proper subset of itself. (A set can then be defined to be finite if it is not infinite.) Moving a step closer to arithmetic, we are led to the notion of a “simple infinity” (or “inductive set”). A rigorous introduction of that notion involves Dedekind's original idea of a“chain”. As one would say in contemporary terminology, a chain is the minimal closure of a set A in a set B containing A under a function f on B (where being “minimal” is conceived of in terms of the general notion of intersection).

What it means to be simply infinite can now be captured in four conditions: Consider a set S and a subset N of S (possibly equal to S). Then N is called simply infinite if there exists a function f on S and an element 1 of N such that: (i) f maps N into itself; (ii) N is the chain of {1} in S under f; (iii) 1 is not in the image of N under f; and (iv) f is one-to-one. While at first perhaps unfamiliar, it is not hard to show that these Dedekindian conditions are a notational variant of Peano's axioms for the natural numbers. In particular, condition (ii) is a version of the axiom of mathematical induction. These axioms are thus properly called the Dedekind-Peano axioms. (Peano, who published his corresponding work in 1889, acknowledged Dedekind's priority; see Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7, and Ferreirós 2005.) As is also readily apparent, any simple infinity will consist of a first element 1, a second element f(1), a third f(f(1)), then f(f(f(1))), and so on, just like any model of the Dedekind-Peano axioms.

Given these preparations, the introduction of the natural numbers can proceed as follows: First, Dedekind proves that every infinite set contains a simply infinite subset. Then he shows, in contemporary terminology, that any two simply infinite systems, or any two models of the Dedekind-Peano axioms, are isomorphic (so that the axiom system is categorical). Third, he notes that consequently exactly the same arithmetic truths hold for all simple infinities; or closer to Dedekind's actual way of stating this point, any truth about one of them can be translated, via the isomorphism, into a corresponding truth about the other. In that sense, each simply infinity is as good as any other. (As one may put it, all models of the Dedekind-Peano axioms are “logically equivalent”, which means that the axiom system is “semantically complete”; compare Awodey & Reck 2002 and Reck 2003a).

As an additional step, Dedekind again appeals to the notion of “creation”. Starting with some simple infinity constructed initially—it doesn't matter which one we start with, given their isomorophism—he “creates” new objects corresponding to all of its elements, thus introducing a special simple infinity, “the natural numbers”. As we already saw, this last move has an exact parallel in the case of the real numbers. But in the present case Dedekind is clearer and more explicit about some crucial aspects. In particular, the identity of the newly created objects is determined completely by the arithmetic truths, i.e., by those truths that are transferable, or invariant, in the sense explained above. The natural numbers as introduced by Dedekind are thus characterized by their “relational” or “structural” properties alone—unlike the elements in other simply infinite systems, they have no non-arithmetic or “foreign” properties (Reck 2003a, 2003b).

What Dedekind has introduced, along such lines, is the natural numbers conceived of as finite “ordinal” numbers (or counting numbers: the first, the second, etc.). Later he adds an explanation of how the usual employment of the natural numbers as finite “cardinal” numbers (answering to the question: how many?) can be recovered. This is done by using initial segments of the number series as tallies: for any set we can ask which such segment, if any, can be mapped one-to-one onto it, thus measuring its “cardinality”. (A set turns out to be finite, in the sense defined above, if and only if there exists such an initial segment of the natural numbers series.) Dedekind rounds off his essay by establishing how several basic, and formerly unproven, arithmetic facts can be proved along such lines. Especially significant is his purely “logical” justification of the methods of proof by mathematical induction and of definition by recursion (based on his theory of chains).

Literature: In Ferreirós (2005), Dedekind (1888a) is compared to Peano's work. See also Sinaceur (1974), Dugac (1976), Gillies (1982), Feferman & Hellman (1995), Belna (1996), Tait (1997), Ferreirós (1996, 1999), Potter (2000), Awodey & Reck (2002), Reck (2003a, 2003b), and Sieg & Schlimm (2005).

2.3 The Rise of Modern Set Theory

As indicated above, set-theoretic assumptions and procedures already inform Dedekind's Stetigkeit und irrationale Zahlen. Namely, the system of rational numbers is assumed to be composed of an infinite set; the collection of arbitrary cuts of rational numbers is also treated as an infinite set; and when supplied with an order relation and arithmetic operations on its elements, the latter gives rise to a new number system. Parallel moves can be found in the sketches, from Dedekind's Nachlass, for how to introduce the integers and the rational numbers. Here again, we start with an infinite system, that of all natural numbers; and new number systems are constructed out of it set-theoretically (although in those cases the full power set is not needed). Finally, Dedekind uses the same kinds of techniques in his other mathematical work as well (in his treatment of modular arithmetic, also in his construction of ideals as infinite sets, to be discussed more below, etc.). It should be emphasized that the application of such techniques was quite novel and bold at the time. While a few other mathematicians, such as Cantor, used similar ones, many others, like Kronecker, rejected them. In fact, by working seriously with actual infinities Dedekind took a stance incompatible with that of his teacher Gauss, who had allowed for the infinite only as a “manner of speaking” (Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7, earlier Edwards 1983).

What happens in Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?, in the context of Dedekind's logicist treatment of the natural numbers, is that this adoption of set-theoretic techniques is raised to a new level of clarity and explicitness. Dedekind not only presents set-theoretic definitions of further mathematical notions, he also adds a systematic reflection on the means used thereby (and he expands that use in certain respects). Consequently, this essay constitutes an important step in the rise of modern set theory. We already saw that Dedekind presents the notion of set, together with those of object and function, as fundamental for human thought. Here an object is anything for which it is determinate how to reason about it, including having definite criteria of identity (Tait 1997, Reck 2003a). Sets are a certain kind of objects, ones about which we reason by considering their elements, and this is all that matters about sets. In other words, sets are to be identified extensionally, as Dedekind is one of the first to emphasize. (Even as important a contributor to set theory as Bertrand Russell struggles with this point well into the twentieth century; see Reck 2003b.) Dedekind is also among the first to consider, not just sets of numbers, but sets of other objects as well.

Functions are to be conceived of extensionally too, as ways of correlating the elements of sets. But unlike in contemporary set theory, Dedekind does not reduce functions to sets. (Not unreasonably, he takes the ability to map one thing onto another, or to represent one by the other, to be fundamental for human thought; see Dedekind 1888a, preface). Another important aspect of Dedekind's views about functions is that, with respect to the intended range of functions, he allows for arbitrary functional correlations between sets of numbers, indeed between sets of objects in general. (For the gradual development of his views in this connection, see Sieg & Schlimm 2005.) He thus rejects restrictions of the notion of function to cases presented by familiar formulas, representable in intuition (via their graphs), or decidable by a formal procedure. In other words, he works with a general notion of function. In this respect he adopts, and expands on, the position of another of his teachers: Dirichlet (Stein 1988, Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7). Dedekind's notion of set is general in the same sense.

Such general notions of set and function, combined with the acceptance of the actual infinite that gives them bite, were soon attacked by finitistically and constructively oriented mathematicians such as Kronecker. Dedekind defended this feature of his approach by pointing towards its fruitfulness (Dedekind 1888a, first footnote, compare Edwards 1983, Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7). However, he came to see another feature as problematic in the end: his implicit acceptance of a general comprehension principle (another sense in which his notion of set is unrestricted). We already touched on a specific way in which this comes up in Dedekind's work. Namely, Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen? relies on introducing “the totality of all things that can be objects of my thought” (his “universal set”); and subsequently, arbitrary subsets of that totality are considered (a general “Aussonderungsaxiom” is used); but then, any collection of objects counts as a set.

As noted, Dedekind has gone beyond considering only sets of numbers in his essay on the natural numbers. This is a significant extension of the notion of set, or of its application, but it is not a problem in itself. A more worrisome aspect is the way in which Dedekind's all-encompassing totality is introduced, namely by reference to “human thought”. This leads to the question of whether unacceptable psychologistic features are involved (more on that topic later). The most problematic aspect—and the one Dedekind came to take rather seriously himself—is a third one: his set theory is subject to the set-theoretic antinomies, including Russell's antinomy. (If any collection of objects counts as a set, then also Russell's collection of all sets that do not contain themselves; but this leads quickly to a contradiction.) Dedekind seems to have found out about the latter aspect in the 1890s, from Cantor (who informed him that the collection of all ordinal numbers was an “inconsistent totality”, as was the collection of all “objects of thought”). The discovery shocked Dedekind. Not only did he delay republication of Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?; pending a resolution, he even expressed doubts about “whether human thinking is fully rational” (Dedekind 1930–32, Vol. 3, p. 449, Dedekind 1996a, p. 836).

Russell's antinomy and related issues establish that Dedekind's original conception of sets is untenable. However, this does not invalidate his other contributions to set theory. Dedekind's analysis of continuity, the use of Dedekind cuts in the characterization of the real numbers, the definition of being Dedekind-infinite, the formulation of the Dedekind-Peano axioms, the proof of their categoricity, the analysis of the natural numbers as finite ordinal numbers, the corresponding justification of mathematical induction and recursion, and more basically, the insistence on extensional, general notions of set and function, and the acceptance of the actual infinite—all of these contributions can be isolated from the set-theoretic antinomies. As such, they are all built centrally into contemporary axiomatic set theory, model theory, recursion theory, and other parts of logic.

And there were further contributions to set theory by Dedekind. These do not appear in his published writings, but in his correspondence. Especially significant here is his exchange of letters, from 1882 on, with Cantor (Noether & Cavaillès 1937, Meschkowski & Nilson 1991). These letters contain a discussion of Cantor's and Dedekind's respective treatments of the real numbers. But more than that, they amount to a joint exploration of the notions of set and infinity. Among the contributions Dedekind makes in this context are the following (Ferreirós 1993, 1996, and 1999, ch. 7): He impressed Cantor with a proof that not only the set of rational numbers, but also the set of all algebraic numbers is countable. This led, at least in part, to Cantor's further study of infinite cardinalities and to his discovery, soon thereafter, that the set of all real numbers is not countable. Dedekind also provided a proof of the Cantor-Bernstein Theorem (that between any two sets which can be embedded one-to-one into each other there exists a bijection, so that they have the same cardinality), another basic result in the modern theory of transfinite cardinals.

Finally, in the further development of set theory in the twentieth century it became clear that several of Dedekind's original results and procedures can be generalized in important ways. Perhaps most significantly, Zermelo and von Neumann succeeded in extending Dedekind's analysis of mathematical induction and recursion to the higher infinite, thus expanding on, and establishing more firmly, Cantor's theory of transfinite ordinals and cardinals. Looking back at all of these contributions, it is no wonder that Zermelo—who knew the relevant history well—considered the modern theory of sets as having been “created by Cantor and Dedekind” (quoted in Ferreirós 2007).

Literature: For rich studies of the rise of modern set theory, including Dedekind's role in it, see Ferreirós (1996, 1999), and more briefly, Ferreirós (2007). Compare also Dugac (1976), Grattan-Guinness (1980), Edwards (1983), Ferreirós (1993, 1995), Ewald (1996b), Tait (1997), and Reck (2003a, 2003b).

3. Logicism and Structuralism

So far Dedekind's contributions in his overtly foundational writings were in focus. We reviewed his set-theoretic approach to the natural and real numbers; we also sketched his role in the rise of modern set theory. Along the way, philosophical issues have come up. A more extended reflection on them seems called for, however, especially a reflection on Dedekind's “logicism” and “structuralism”.

Like for Frege, the other important logicist in the nineteenth century, “logic” is more encompassing for Dedekind than often assumed today (as comprising only first-order logic). Both thinkers take the notions of object, set, and function to be fundamental for human thought and, as such, to fall within the range of logic. Each of them develops a version of set theory (a theory of “systems”, “extensions”, or “classes”) as part of logic. Also for both, logic, in this encompassing sense, is independent of intuitive considerations, and specifically of geometry (understood itself as grounded in intuition). What reducing analysis and arithmetic to logic is meant to establish, then, is that those fields too are independent of intuition (Reck 2003a, Demopoulos & Clark 2005).

The view that analysis and arithmetic are not dependent of geometry, since they fall within the realm of purely logical thought, was not entirely new at the time—Gauss and Dirichlet already held such a view, as mentioned above. Dedekind's and Frege's original contributions consisted in particular, detailed reductions of, on the one hand, analysis to arithmetic and, on the other hand, arithmetic to logic. Moreover, they complemented these reductions by, or grounded them in, systematic elaborations of logic. And as Dedekind's work was better known than Frege's at the time, perhaps because of his greater reputation as a mathematician, he was seen as the main representative of “logicism” by interested contemporaries, such as Charles Sanders Peirce and Ernst Schröder (Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7).

Besides these commonalities between Dedekind's and Frege's versions of logicism, the two thinkers also agreed on a more general methodological principle, encapsulated in the following remark by Dedekind: In science, and especially in mathematics, “nothing capable of proof ought to be accepted without proof” (Dedekind 1888a, preface). This principle ought to be adhered to not so much because it increases certainty. Rather, it is often only by providing an explicit, detailed proof for a result that the assumptions on which it depends become evident and, thus, its range of applicability established. Both of them had learned this lesson from the history of mathematics, especially from nineteenth-century developments in geometry, algebra, and the calculus (Ferreirós 1999, Detlefsen 2011, more generally also Wilson 1992, and Tappenden 1995, 2006).

Beyond where they are in agreement, it is instructive to consider also some of the differences between Dedekind and Frege. First and put in modern terminology, a major difference is that, while Frege's main contributions to logic concern syntactic, proof-theoretic aspects, Dedekind tends to focus on semantic, model-theoretic aspects. Thus, nothing like Frege's revolutionary analysis of deductive inference, by means of his “Begriffsschrift”, can be found in Dedekind. In turn, Dedekind is much more explicit and clear than Frege about issues such as categoricity, completeness, independence, etc., which puts him in proximity with a “formal axiomatic” approach as championed later by Hilbert and Bernays (Hallett 1994, 1995, Reck 2003a, and Sieg & Schlimm 2005).

Compared to Frege, Dedekind also has much more to say about the infinite, not just by formulating his explicit definition of that notion, but also by exploring the possibility of different infinite cardinalities with Cantor. And he shows more awareness of the challenge posed by Kroneckerian computational and constructivist strictures to logicism. In addition, the differences between Frege's and Dedekind's respective treatments of the natural and real numbers are noteworthy. As we saw, Dedekind conceives of the natural numbers primarily as ordinal numbers; he also identifies them purely “structurally”. Frege makes their application as cardinal numbers central; and he insists on building this application into the very nature of the natural numbers, thus endowing them with non-relational, “intrinsic” properties (Reck 2003b). The case of the real numbers is similar.

Apart from Frege, it is instructive to compare Dedekind's approach further with later set-theoretic ones as well. We noted in the last section that many of his innovations are built into contemporary axiomatic set theory. Yet here too, several significant differences emerge if we look more closely. To begin with, Dedekind does not start with an axiom of infinity, as a fundamental principle; instead, he tries to prove the existence of infinite sets. This can be seen as another application of the methodological rule to prove everything “capable of proof”. (Dedekind's argument in this connection is also similar to an earlier one in Bernard Bolzano's posthumously published work; cf. Ferreirós 1999, ch. 7.) But few set theorists today will want to adopt this aspect of Dedekind's approach.

A second marked difference between Dedekind and later set theory has also already come up, but deserves further comment. This is his appeal to “creation”, and with it to “abstraction”, in the last step of his introduction of both the natural and the real numbers (“Dedekind-abstraction”, as it is called in Tait 1997). For the real numbers, the standard procedure in current set theory is to follow Dedekind up to this last step, but then to work with the Dedekind-cuts themselves as “the real numbers”. While being aware of this option (Dedekind 1876b, 1888b), Dedekind tells us to “abstract away” from the cuts, insofar as they consist of complex sets, and to “create” additional mathematical objects determined by, but not identical with, them. Likewise, in the case of the natural numbers it is standard today to construct a particular simple infinity, usually the set of finite von Neumann ordinals, and to identify the natural numbers with them (thus: 0 = ∅, 1 = {0}, 2 = {0, 1}, etc.). Once again, the step involving “abstraction” and “creation” distinctive of Dedekind's procedure is avoided.

In current treatments it is sometimes added that any other set-theoretically constructed system that is isomorphic to the system of Dedekind cuts or to the system of finite von Neumann ordinals, respectively, would do as well, i.e., be usable, for all mathematical purposes, as “the real numbers” or “the natural numbers”. This means that contemporary set theory is, often implicitly and without further elaboration, supplemented by a “set-theoretic structuralist” view about the nature of mathematical objects (Reck & Price 2000). While not unrelated, the resulting philosophical position is different from Dedekind's. (Nor does Dedekind's position coincide with several other forms of structuralism prominent in contemporary philosophy of mathematics, e.g., those defended by Geoffrey Hellman, Michael Resnik, and Stewart Shapiro; cf. Reck 2003a.)

Why do most mathematicians and philosophers not follow Dedekind more closely in this respect? Here the following difficulty seems to play a role (compare Boolos 1990, among others): How exactly should his notions of “abstraction” and “creation” be understood, if they can be made sense of at all? Also, why did he insist on their use in the first place, since we seem to be able to do without them? A partial answer to the latter question is: For Dedekind, the real numbers should not be identified with the corresponding cuts because those cuts have “wrong properties”; namely, as sets they contain elements, something that seems “foreign” to the real numbers themselves. Similarly, the natural numbers should not be ascribed set-theoretic or other “foreign” properties; they too should be conceived of “purely arithmetically” (Dedekind 1876b, 1888b, cf. Tait 1997, Reck 2003a). Can anything further be said in this connection?

By his critics, Dedekind's procedure is often interpreted as follows: As his language of “abstraction” and “creation” suggests, he must be appealing to psychological processes; and thus, the resulting entities—“the real number” and “the natural numbers”—must be psychological entities (existing in people's minds). If this is correct, then his position amounts to a form of psychologism about mathematics that is deeply problematic, as Frege, Husserl, and others have taught us (Reck 2003a). Partly to avoid such a damning conclusion, partly also to attribute more philosophical depth to Dedekind, the following reply can be found in the literature: While Dedekind does not say so explicitly, his psychologistic-sounding language indicates a commitment to Kantian assumptions, in particular to Kant's transcendental psychology (Kitcher 1986, McCarty 1995). Then again, it is not clear that this takes care of the charge of psychologism (often directed against Kant too); and it leaves mysterious the precise form of Dedekind's “abstraction” and “creation”.

Recently another suggestion for how to get clearer about the nature of “Dedekind abstraction” and, at the same time, avoid problematic forms of psychologism has been offered. Instead of taking such abstraction to be essentially a psychological process, it should be understood as a logical procedure (Tait 1997, Reck 2003a, also Yap 2009b). Consider again the case of the natural numbers where Dedekind is most explicit about the issue. What we are provided with by him is this: First, the language and logic to be used are specified, thus the kinds of assertions and arguments that can be made concerning the natural numbers; second, a particular simple infinity is constructed; third, this simple infinity is used to determine the truth values of all arithmetic sentences (by equating them with the truth values of corresponding sentences for the given simple infinity); and fourth, this determination is justified by showing that all simple infinities are isomorphic (so that, if a sentence holds for one of them, it holds for all).

The core of the procedure just described is the following: Something is true for the natural numbers exactly when the corresponding statement holds for all simple infinities (i.e., is a semantic consequence of the Dedekind-Peano axioms). What, then, are the natural numbers? They are those mathematical objects whose properties are determined completely by all arithmetic truths (and only by those—we “abstract away” from everything else). Along such lines, all that matters about mathematical objects, indeed all that is built into their identity and nature, is what the corresponding mathematical truths determine. Consequently, it is by specifying those truths that we “create”, or better characterize, them. The resulting position seems clearly not psychologistic, and it might be called “logical structuralism” (Reck 2003a, Yap 2009a).

Interpreted along such lines, Dedekind's approach is related to that of the “American Postulate Theorists”: E. Huntington, O. Veblen, etc. There is also again a close connection to, and a clear influence on, the formal axiomatics developed by Hilbert and Bernays later (Awodey & Reck 2002, Sieg & Schlimm 2005, Ferreirós 2009, also Hallett 1994, 1995, 2003). For all of these thinkers, what is crucial in, and sufficient for, mathematics is that the completeness and consistency of certain basic concepts, or of the corresponding systems of axioms, are established. In Dedekind's case, completeness is to be understood in a semantic sense, as based on categoricity; similarly, consistency is to be understood semantically, as satisfiability by a system of objects (Dedekind 1890, cf. again Reck 2003a, Sieg & Schlimm 2005).

The syntactic study of these notions, especially of consistency, which became a core part of Hilbertian “proof theory” is not present in Dedekind's work. As already noted, the proof-theoretic side of logic is not pursued much in his work. Nor is the “finitism” characteristic of Hilbert and Bernays' later work present in Dedekind (an aspect developed in response both to the set-theoretic antinomies and to intuitionist challenges), especially if it is understood in a metaphysical sense. Such finitism might have been acceptable to Dedekind as a methodological stance, but in other respects his position is strongly infinitary. In fact, the finite is explained in terms of the infinite in his work (the notion of finitude by that of infinity, the natural numbers in terms of infinite sets).

The analysis of Dedekind's position in this section highlighted logical issues (his basic logical notions and procedures, compared both to Frege and to contemporary set theory) and metaphysical issues (Dedekindian abstraction and creation, the structural nature of mathematical objects). However, there is another side to his position—another sense in which Dedekind is a logicist and structuralist—that has not yet been brought to light fully. That side involves primarily methodological and epistemological issues. Some of those have already played a role in our discussions of Dedekind's overtly foundational writings. But in order to shed further light on them we need to turn to his other mathematical work, starting with algebraic number theory.

Literature: Kitcher (1986), Boolos (1990), Wilson (1992), Hallett (1994, 1995, 2003), McCarty (1995), Tait (1997), Ferreirós (1999, 2009), Reck & Price (2000), Awodey & Reck (2002), Reck (2003a), Demopoulos & Clark (2005), Sieg & Schlimm (2005), Tappenden (2005a, 2006), Yap (2009a, 2009b), and Detlefsen 2011.

4. Other Mathematical Work

4.1 Algebraic Number Theory

While historians of mathematics have long emphasized the influence Dedekind's contributions to algebraic number theory had on the development of twentieth-century mathematics, the philosophical significance of these contributions has only started to be probed recently (with some early exceptions: Dugac 1976, Sinaceur 1979, Edwards 1980, 1983, and Stein 1988). We should begin here by reviewing two related aspects: the roots of Dedekind's number-theoretic investigations in the works of Gauss, Dirichlet, and Ernst Eduard Kummer; and the contrast between Dedekind's approach in this area and that of Leopold Kronecker.

The starting point for all of the number theorists mentioned is the solution of various algebraic equations, especially their solution in terms of integers. A famous example is Fermat's Last Theorem, which concerns the (non-) solubility of the equation xn + yn = zn by integers, for different exponents n. The approach to the problem developed by Gauss, clarified and refined by Dirichlet, and pushed further by Kummer involves considering extensions of the (field of) rational numbers, as well as of the (ring of) “integers” contained in such extensions. Thus, Gauss studied the “Gaussian integers” (a + bi, where a and b are regular integers and i = √−1), within the complex numbers; Kummer considered more complicated “cyclotomic integers”, within corresponding cyclotomic number fields (Edwards 1977, Stillwell 2000).

What became clear along such lines is that in some of these extensions the Fundamental Theorem of Arithmetic—asserting the unique factorization of all integers into powers of primes—fails. Had such factorization been available generally, solutions to important problems would have been within reach, including Fermat's Last Theorem. The question became then whether a suitable alternative to the Fundamental Theorem could be found. Kummer's response, obtained in a close study of certain cases, was to introduce “ideal numbers” in terms of which unique factorization could be recovered. While this move led to striking progress, the precise nature of these new mathematical objects was left unclear, as were the basis for their introduction and the range of applicability of the technique.

Dedekind and Kronecker knew this earlier work well, especially Kummer's, and they both tried to refine and extend the latter. Kronecker's strategy was to study in concrete detail, and by exploiting computational aspects, certain kinds of extensions of the rational numbers, or of the integers contained in them. Crucial for him was to proceed finitistically and constructively, thus in a self-consciously restricted way. This led to his “divisor theory”, an extension of Gauss' and Kummer's “theory of forms” (Edwards 1980, 1990). Dedekind approached the issue in a more encompassing, abstract, and non-constructive way. He considered algebraic number fields in general, thereby introducing the mathematical notion of a “field” for the first time (Edwards 1983, Haubrich 1992, Stillwell 1996, 2000).

Dedekind also replaced Kummer's “ideal numbers” by his “ideals”—set-theoretically constructed objects intended to play the same role with respect to unique factorization. Dedekindian ideals are infinite subsets of the number fields in question, or of the ring of integers contained in them, thus giving his approach again an infinitary character. (An ideal I in a ring R is a subset such that the sum and difference of any two elements of I and the product of any element of I with any element of R are again in I.) This led him to the introduction of other fruitful notions, such as that of a “module”. A particular problem Dedekind struggled with for quite a while, in the sense of finding a general and fully satisfactory solution, was to find a suitable version, not only of the notion of “integer”, but also of “prime number” (Ferreirós 1999, ch. 3, Avigad 2006).

Both Kronecker, with his divisor theory, and Dedekind, with his theory of ideals, produced immediate results. Each theory also had a strong influence on later developments—Dedekind's by shaping the approaches to modern algebra (field theory, ring theory, etc.) of Hilbert, Emmy Noether, B.L. van der Waerden, Nicolas Bourbaki, and others (Alten et al. 2003, Corry 2004, McLarty 2006, Gray 2008); Kronecker's by partly influencing Hilbert's work as well and by being revived later in, among others, Alexander Grothendieck's work (class field theory, algebraic geometry, etc.) (Edwards 1990, Reed 1995, Corfield 2003). Apart from that, the contrast between their approaches provides a clear example—historically the first significant example—of the opposition between “classical” and “constructivist” conceptions of mathematics, as they came to be called.

Not infrequently this opposition is debated in terms of which approach is “the right one”, with the implication that only one but not the other is legitimate. (To some degree this started with Dedekind and Kronecker themselves. We already noted that Dedekind explicitly rejected constructivist strictures on his work, although he did not rule out corresponding projects as illegitimate in themselves. Kronecker, with his strong opposition to the use of set-theoretic and infinitary techniques, went further in the other direction.) But another question is more basic: Can the contrast between the two approaches to algebraic number theory, or to mathematics in general, be captured more sharply; and more pointedly, what is its epistemological significance?

An initial and rough answer to this last question is contained in our discussion so far: Dedekind's approach is set-theoretic and infinitary, while Kronecker's is constructivist and finitary. However, this leaves us with a further, deeper problem: What exactly is it that a set-theoretic and infinitary methodology allows one to accomplish that Kronecker's doesn't, and vice versa? The specific strength of a Kroneckerian approach is often summed up as follows: It provides us with computational, algorithmic information (Edwards 1980, 1990, Avigad 2008). But what is the characteristic virtue of a Dedekindian approach? Here an answer is harder to come by, especially one that is really satisfying.

What tends to get in the way in this connection is that the set-theoretic and infinitary methodology Dedekind championed was so successful, and shaped twentieth-century mathematics so much, that it is hard to reach the analytic distance needed. Often all one can find, then, are platitudes: that it is “general” and “abstract”. Or one is stuck with negative characterizations: that it fails to be finitistically and constructively acceptable. Beyond that, there is the suggestion that Dedekind's approach is “structuralist”. But as this term is now used to characterize a methodology, rather than a metaphysical position, one wonders what exactly it implies. Before attempting an elaboration, let us briefly consider some of Dedekind's other mathematical works, since this will make certain crucial features stand out more.

Literature: Edwards (1977, 1980, 1983, 1990), Dieudonné (1985), Sinaceur (1979), Stein (1988), Haubrich (1992), Reed (1995), Stillwell (1996, 2000), Ferreirós (1999), Alten et al. (2003), Corfield (2003), Corry (2004), Avigad (2006), McLarty (2006), Horborth (2007), and Gray (2008).

4.2 Functions, Groups, Lattices

In this context, it suggests itself to consider three related areas in which Dedekind also applied his set-theoretic, infinitary, and structuralist approach: the theory of algebraic functions, group theory, and lattice theory.

Dedekind realized early on that several of the notions and techniques he had introduced in algebraic number theory could be transferred to, and fruitfully applied in, the study of algebraic functions (algebraic function fields, in later terminology). This realization came to fruition in “Theorie der algebraischen Funktionen einer Veränderlichen”, a long, substantive article co-written with Heinrich Weber and published in 1882. The approach taken in it led to a better understanding of Riemann surfaces and, especially, to a purely algebraic proof of the celebrated Riemann-Roch Theorem (Geyer 1981, Kolmogorov & Yushkevich 2001, ch. 2). As these were issues of wide interest among mathematicians, the success of Dedekind's approach gave it significant legitimacy and publicity (see Edwards 1983, Dieudonné 1985).

Second, Dedekind's approach to algebraic number theory could also be connected, in a natural and fruitful way, with Evariste Galois' revolutionary group-theoretic approach to algebra. In fact, Dedekind's early and systematic study of Galois theory—he was the first to lecture on it at a German university, already during his time as a Privatdozent in Göttingen—led to a transformation of that theory itself. It turned from the study of substitutions in formulas and of functions invariant under such substitutions into the study of field extensions and corresponding automorphisms (Stein 1988, earlier Mehrtens 1979b). Moreover, Dedekind introduced additional applications of Galois theory, e.g., in the study of modular equations and functions (Gray 2000, ch. 4, Alten et al. 2003, ch. 8).

As a third spin-off, Dedekind's number-theoretic investigations led to the introduction of the notion of a “lattice” (under the name “Dualgruppe”), at first implicitly and then explicitly. Dedekind studied that notion further, as a topic in itself, in two relatively late articles: “Über Zerlegungen von Zahlen durch ihre größten gemeinsamen Teiler” (1897) and “Über die von drei Moduln erzeugte Dualgruppe” (1900). And while these articles did not have the same immediate and strong impact that several of his other works had, they were subsequently recognized as original, systematic contributions to lattice theory, especially to the study of modular lattices (Mehrtens 1979a, ch. 2, Burris 1983, Alten et al. 2003, ch. 10, and Schlimm 2009).

None of these mathematical contributions by Dedekind can be treated in any detail here (and many others have to be ignored completely). But one general observation about them is especially relevant for us. Namely, while they again exemplify a set-theoretic and infinitary perspective, they also display the following related features: the focus on entire systems of objects and on general laws, in such a way that results can be transferred from one case to another; the move away from particular formulas, or from particular symbolic representations, and towards more general characterizations of the underlying systems of objects, specifically in terms of relational and functional properties; more particularly, the consideration of homomorphisms, automorphisms, isomorphisms, and features invariant under such mappings; and very generally, the investigation of novel, abstract concepts, introduced in connection with specific cases, but then studied in themselves.

In fact, these features are characteristic for Dedekind's works overall, including his studies in algebraic number theory, on the one hand, and his foundational investigations, on the other hand. It is by taking them into account that calling his methodology, not just “general” and “abstract”, but “structuralist” starts to acquire further content. It also makes evident in which way Dedekind's approach played a crucial role in the emergence of “modern” mathematics. Looking back on the corresponding history of algebra, B.L. van der Waerden, himself a major contributor to this field, concluded: “It was Evariste Galois and Richard Dedekind who gave modern algebra its structure; that is where its weight-bearing skeleton comes from” (Dedekind 1964, foreword, quoted in Mehrtens 1979b; cf. Gray 2008).

Literature: Mehrtens (1979a, 1979b), Sinaceur (1979, 1990), Geyer (1981), Scharlau (1981b), Burris (1983), Edwards (1983), Dieudonné (1985), Stein (1988), Haubrich (1992), Gray (2000), Kolmogorov & Yushkevich (2001), Alten et al. (2003), Corry (2004), Gray 2008, and Schlimm (2009).

5. Methodology and Epistemology

In earlier sections we considered Dedekind's overtly foundational writings. This led to a discussion of the logicist and metaphysical structuralist views that emerge in them. In the last few sections, the focus shifted to his other mathematical writings, and in particular, to the methodological structuralism they embody. We are finally in a position to provide a more systematic elaboration of the latter (although much will remain to be said). Beyond just calling Dedekind's approach set-theoretic, infinitary, and non-constructive, the structuralist methodology that informs it can now be analyzed as consisting of three main parts.

The first part is closely tied to Dedekind's employment of set-theoretic tools and techniques. He often uses these in constructing new mathematical objects (the natural and real numbers, ideals, modules, etc.) or whole classes of such objects (various algebraic number fields, rings, lattices, etc.). But more characteristic for his approach, both in foundational and other contexts, is a related aspect. Not only are infinite sets used by Dedekind; they are also endowed with general, structural features (order relations, arithmetic and other operations, etc.); and the resulting systems are then studied in terms of higher-level properties (continuity for the real number system, unique factorization in algebraic number fields, etc.).

Once more, philosophically significant is not just that this procedure is infinitary (his acceptance of actual infinities) and non-constructive (the added features do not have to be grounded in algorithms). Rather, a whole variety of relational systems, including many new ones, can now be investigated, and this brings with it a significant extension of the subject matter of mathematics. Thus, Dedekind leads us far beyond what is empirically or intuitively given (concrete numbers of things, geometric magnitudes, etc.)—mathematics becomes the study of relational systems much more generally (based on a novel “logic of relations”, as Russell will later put it).

The second main part of Dedekind's methodology consists of persistently (from early on, cf. Dedekind 1854) attempting to identify and clarify fundamental concepts (continuity, infinity, natural number, real number, generalized notions of integer, of prime number, the new concepts of ideal, module, lattice, etc.). Here it is crucial for Dedekind to find “the right definitions”, and this involves not just basic adequacy, but also desiderata such as: fruitfulness, generality, simplicity, and “purity”, i.e., the elimination of aspects “foreign” to the case at hand. (The definition of prime number must be at just the right level of generality, geometric notions are foreign to the natural and real numbers, etc.; cf. Reck 2003a, Avigad 2006.)

The third main part of Dedekind's approach connects and complements the first two. Not only does he study systems of objects or whole classes of such systems; and not only does he attempt to identify basic concepts. Dedekind also tends to do both, often in conjunction, by considering mappings on the systems studied, especially structure-preserving mappings (homomorphisms etc.), and what is invariant under them. This implies, among others, that what is crucial about a mathematical phenomenon may not lie on the surface (concrete features of examples, particular symbolisms, etc.), but go deeper. And while the deeper features are often captured set-theoretically by him (Dedekind cuts, ideals, quotient structures, etc.), this points beyond set theory in the end, towards category theory (Corry 2004, McLarty 2006).

These three parts, and Dedekind's approach as a whole, may not seem extraordinary to a contemporary mathematician; but that is just testimony to how much modern mathematics has been shaped by it. The approach was certainly seen as novel, even revolutionary, at the time. Some negative reactions to it, by finitist and constructivist thinkers, were already mentioned above. The extent to which Dedekind's approach diverged from what was common up to then becomes clearer if we remember two traditional assumptions: that mathematics is the science of number and magnitude; and that it has essentially to do with calculating and algorithmic procedures. Relative to such assumptions, Dedekind's approach to mathematics involves a radical transformation and liberation (Stein 1988, Tait 1997).

Another way to bring out the radical character of Dedekind's work is by returning to his treatment of the infinite. It starts by taking what was long seen as a paradoxical property (to be equinumerous with a proper subset) to be a defining characteristic of infinite sets. Dedekind then adds an analysis of the finite in terms of the infinite, again a rather bold idea. For conceptual innovations like these to become accepted, they not only had to open up new realms for mathematics but also lead to progress in more traditional realms (as they did: the clarification of continuity, of mathematical induction, results in algebraic number theory, in the theory of algebraic functions, etc.).

While Dedekind was a great innovator, he was, of course, not alone in moving large parts of mathematics in a set-theoretic, infinitary, and structuralist direction. There was a whole group of mathematicians who promoted a more “conceptual” approach to it at the time, including several of his teachers in Göttingen. Within this group, Dirichlet has sometimes been seen as the leader, or the “poet's poet”, including being a big influence on Dedekind (Stein 1988). As Hermann Minkowski, another major figure in this tradition, later put it (on the occasion of Dirichlet's 100th birthday), he impressed on other mathematicians “to conquer the problems with a minimum amount of blind calculation, a maximum of clear-seeing thought” (quoted in Stein 1988).

Riemann was another central figure in this connection. He too had a strong influence on Dedekind, in two ways: first, by emphasizing (in his development of complex function theory) the importance of using simple, characteristic, and “intrinsic” concepts, in contrast to “extrinsic” properties tied to, say, particular symbolisms (Mehrtens 1979b, Laugwitz 1999, Tappenden 2005a); and second, by exploring new “conceptual possibilities”, including the systematic study of Riemannian geometries (Stein 1988). Another example of such conceptual exploration, also familiar to Dedekind, was the study of transfinite ordinal and cardinal numbers by his correspondent Cantor (Ferreirós 1999, chs. 2 and 6).

Can the significance of Dedekind's methodology be analyzed further, or can it be articulated in other terms? One way to do so is by highlighting the methodological values embodied in it: systematicity, generality, purity, etc. (Avigad 2006). Another is by focusing on the kind of reasoning involved: “conceptual” or “structural” reasoning (Stein 1988, Ferreirós 1999), or in terminology often associated with Hilbert, “axiomatic” reasoning (Sieg & Schlimm 2005). One may even want to talk about a novel “reasoning style” in this connection, where “style” is to be taken primarily in an epistemological sense, not in a psychological or sociological sense; and this new style may be said to bring with it, not just new theorems and proofs, but a distinctive kind of “understanding” of mathematical facts (Reck 2009, cf. Tappenden 2005b).

Such attempts to shed light on the full significance of Dedekind's approach are initial forays, thus clearly in need of further elaboration. But one aspect seems clear enough: The methodological and epistemological structuralism that shapes many of Dedekind's mathematical works is not independent of the logical and metaphysical views emerging in his foundational writings. If one adopts his methodological stance, it is hardly possible to hold on to narrowly formalist, empiricist, and intuitionist views about mathematics. A structuralist epistemology, along Dedekindian lines, calls for a structuralist metaphysics—these are two sides of the same coin (Reck 2003a, 2009). Dedekind seems to have been keenly aware of this point, even if he never said so explicitly.

Literature: Mehrtens (1979b), Gray (1986), Stein (1988), Laugwitz (1999), Ferreirós (1999), Stillwell (1996, 2000), Sieg & Schlimm (2005), Tappenden (2005a, 2005b), Avigad (2006), McLarty (2006), Reck (2003a, 2009), and Gray 2008.

6. Concluding Remarks

We started out by considering Dedekind's contributions to the foundations of mathematics in his overtly foundational writings, especially Stetigkeit und irrationale Zahlen and Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen? We then added a sketch, and a preliminary analysis, of the methodological innovations in his more mainstream mathematical writings, from his work in algebraic number theory to other areas. We also noted that the logical and metaphysical position one can find in his foundational work is closely tied to his methodological and epistemological perspective. In this and other senses, any attempt to distinguish sharply between his “foundational” and his “mathematical” writings is misguided—Dedekind made foundationally relevant contributions throughout his work. His case provides, thus, a good argument and illustration for a more general lesson, namely: Any strict distinction between “foundational” or “philosophical” questions about mathematics, on the one hand, and “inner-mathematical” questions, on the other hand, is problematic in the end, especially if one does not want to impoverish both sides.

If we look at Dedekind's contributions from such a perspective, the sum total looks impressive indeed. He was not only one of the greatest mathematicians of the nineteenth century, but also one of its subtlest philosophers of mathematics. With his structuralist views about the nature of mathematical entities and about the way in which to investigate them, he was far ahead of his time. Arguably he was even ahead of much contemporary philosophy of mathematics, especially in terms of his sensitivity to both sides. This is not to say that his position is without problems. Dedekind himself was deeply troubled by the set-theoretic antinomies. And the twentieth century produced additional surprises, such as Gödel's Incompleteness Theorems, that are difficult to accommodate more generally. In addition, the methodology of mathematics has developed further since his time, including attempts to reconcile and integrate “conceptual” and “computational” thinking. Then again, is there a philosophical position available today that addresses all important problems and answers all relevant questions successfully? If not, updating a Dedekindian position may be a worthwhile project.

Bibliography

Primary Literature (German Editions and English Translations)

Works listed in this section are by Richard Dedekind, unless otherwise specified.

1854 “Über die Einführung neuer Funktionen in der Mathematik; Habilitationsvortrag”; in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 3, pp. 428–438.
1857 “Abriß einer Theorie der höheren Kongruenzen in bezug auf einen reellen Primzahl-Modulus”; reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 1, pp. 40–67.
1872 Stetigkeit und irrationale Zahlen, Vieweg: Braunschweig (originally published as a separate booklet); reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 3, pp. 315–334, and in Dedekind (1965), pp. 1–22; English trans., Dedekind (1901b).
1876a “Bernhard Riemanns Lebenslauf”, in Riemann (1876), pp. 539–558.
1876b “Briefe an Lipschitz (1–2)”, in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 3, pp. 468–479.
1876 Riemann, Bernard, Gesammelte Mathematische Werke und Wissenschaftlicher Nachlass, H. Weber, ed., with assistance by R. Dedekind; second edition (revised) 1892, with a supplement added in 1902; reprinted by Dover: New York, 1953.
1877 Sur la Théorie des Nombres Entiers Algébrique, Gauthier-Villars: Paris; reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 3, pp. 262–296; English trans. Dedekind (1996b).
1882 “Theorie der algebraischen Funktionen einer Veränderlichen”, with H. Weber; reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 1, pp. 238–350.
1888a Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?, Vieweg: Braunschweig (originally published as a separate booklet); reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 3, pp. 335–91, and in Dedekind (1965), pp. III–XI and 1–47; English trans., (Dedekind 1901c) and (revised) Dedekind (1995).
1888b “Brief an Weber”, in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 3, pp. 488–490.
1890 “Letter to Keferstein”, in Van Heijenoort (1967), pp. 98–103.
1893 Lejeune-Dirichlet, P.G., Vorlesungen über Zahlentheorie, fourth edition, edited and with supplements by R. Dedekind; Vieweg: Braunschweig; reprinted by Chelsea: New York, 1968.
1897 “Über Zerlegungen von Zahlen durch ihre größten gemeinsamen Teiler”; reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. 2, pp. 103–147.
1900 “Über die von drei Moduln erzeugte Dualgruppe”; reprinted in Dedekind (1930–32), Vol. II, pp. 236–271.
1901a Essays on the Theory of Numbers, W.W. Beman, ed. and trans., Open Court Publishing Company: Chicago, 1901; reprinted by Dover: New York, 1963; English version of Dedekind (1965); essays also included in Ewald (1996a), pp. 756–779 and 787–833, and in Hawking (2005a), pp. 901–964.
1901b “Continuity and Irrational Numbers”, in (Dedekind 1901a), pp. 1–27; English trans. of Dedekind (1872).
1901c “The Nature and Meaning of Numbers”, in (Dedekind 1901a), pp. 29–115; English trans. of Dedekind (1888a).
1930–32 Gesammelte Mathematische Werke, Vols. 1–3, R. Fricke, E. Noether & Ö. Ore, eds., Vieweg: Braunschweig; reprinted (except for the separately published Dedekind 1964) by Chelsea Publishing Company: New York, 1969.
1937 Noether, E. & Cavaillès, J., eds., Briefwechsel Cantor-Dedekind, Hermann, Paris.
1964 Über die Theorie der ganzen algebraischen Zahlen. Nachdruck des elften Supplements (from Lejeune-Dirichlet 1893), with a preface by B. L. van der Waerden, Vieweg: Braunschweig.
1965 Was sind und was sollen die Zahlen?/Stetigkeit und irrationale Zahlen. Studienausgabe, G. Asser, ed., Vieweg: Braunschweig; later German version of Dedekind (1901a).
1981 “Eine Vorlesung über Algebra”, in Scharlau (1981a), pp. 59–100.
1982 “Unveröffentlichte algebraische Arbeiten Richard Dedekinds aus seiner Göttinger Zeit, 1855–1858”, Archive for History of Exact Sciences 27:4, 335–367.
1985 Vorlesungen über Diffential- und Integralrechnung 1861/62, based on notes by H. Bechtold, M.-A. Knus & W. Scharlau, eds., Vieweg: Braunschweig.
1986 Lipschitz, Rudolf, Briefwechsel mit Cantor, Dedekind, Helmholtz, Kronecker, Weierstrass und anderen, W. Scharlau, ed., Vieweg: Braunschweig.
1991 Meschkowski, H. & Nilson, W., eds., Georg Cantor. Briefe, Berlin: Springer; especially “Die Periode des Briefwechsels mit Dedekind — die Entstehung der Mengenlehre”, pp. 29–66.
1995 What Are Numbers and What Should They Be? H. Pogorzelski, W. Ryan & W. Snyder, eds. and trans., Research Institute for Mathematics: Orono, ME; revised English trans. of Dedekind (1888).
1996a “Julius Wilhelm Richard Dedekind (1831–1916)”, in Ewald (1996a), Vol. 2, pp. 753–837; English trans. of various texts by Dedekind.
1996b Theory of Algebraic Integers, J. Stillwell, ed. and trans., Cambridge University Press; English trans. of Dedekind (1877).
1999 Dirichlet, P.G.L., Lectures on Number Theory, with supplements by Richard Dedekind, J. Stillwell, ed. and trans., American Mathematical Society: Providence; English trans. of Lejeune-Dirichlet (1893).
2008 Richard Dedekind: La création des nombres, H.B. Sinaceur, ed. and trans., Vrin: Paris; French trans. of various texts by Dedekind.

Secondary Literature (in English, French, and German)

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  • Mehrtens, Herbert (1979a): Entstehung der Verbandstheorie, Gerstenberg: Hildesheim; especially Chapter 2, “Die ‘Dualgruppe’ von Richard Dedekind”, pp. 66–126.
  • ––– (1979b): “Das Skelett der modernen Algebra. Zur Bildung mathematischer Begriffe bei Richard Dedekind”, in Disciplinae Novae, C.J. Sciba (ed.), Göttingen: Vanderhoeck & Ruprecht, pp. 25–43.
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algebra | Frege, Gottlob | Hilbert, David | Hilbert, David: program in the foundations of mathematics | mathematics, philosophy of | mathematics, philosophy of: structuralism | mathematics: explanation in | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | set theory: early development | set theory: Zermelo's axiomatization of

Acknowledgements

This entry has benefited significantly from comments by Jeremy Avigad, William Demopoulos, Jeremy Heis, Dirk Schlimm, and the editors. I am also grateful to various people, including Stanley Burris and Diego Fernandes, for pointing out small problems and helping me fill gaps in the earlier version.

Copyright © 2011 by
Erich Reck <erich.reck@ucr.edu>

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