Notes to Doing vs. Allowing Harm

1. Sarah McGrath (2003) argues that some behavior involves both doing and allowing harm. Such behavior would not count as allowing for the purposes of a moral distinction between doing and allowing harm.

2. This issue is relevant also to the debate over abortion, the debate over capital punishment, and the more theoretical debate over consequentialism. See Scheffler (1982), Smart (1973) and Williams (1973). See also Haydar (2010)

3. See also Tooley (1972), Singer (1979), and Unger (1996).

4. See Frowe (2007) for a similar strategy applied to Tooley’s Machine case (Tooley 1972, 108). See Trammell (1975) for criticism that our intuitions may not be sensitive enough to detect a moral distinction between killing and letting die in the bathtub cases, given the overwhelming effect of the agent’s malicious intentions.

5. See Malm (1992) for and Purves (2011) for defences of the contrast strategy in the light of these criticisms and Asscher (2007) for further criticisms of the contrast strategy.

6. See Bradley and Stocker (2005) for criticism of Scheffler’s arguments.

7. See Thomson (1986) and Foot (1978) for early statements and reactions to the Trolley Problem. See Fischer and Ravizza (eds.) (1992) for a representative sample of reactions to the problem. See Thomson (2008) for Thomson’s most recent treatment of the problem.

8. We talk about allowing the tree to fall, but we do not talk about “doing the tree fall”. We do of course talk about “making the tree fall” and “causing the tree to fall,” but these terms are to be avoided because they suggest that allowing the tree to fall is not a way of causing it to fall, and, as will be argued below, this is wrong.

9. See, for example, Callahan (1989).

10. This idea, which has its roots in Hume’s writings, is developed in Lewis (1986). Note that the definition mentioned in the text represents the gut idea of the counterfactual account of causation. Subsequent versions are much more complicated, but they all imply that letting die is a kind of causing.

11. See Mackie (1974). According to “transference” accounts of causation, causation consists in the transfer of energy or momentum from one object to another at the point of contact between the objects. Such accounts would indeed imply that allowing was not causing. See Aronson (1971) . But it seems then that a different premise in the argument for the moral insignificance of the distinction would be in trouble. The thought that one cannot be morally responsible for what one is not causally responsible for now seems dubious. It seemed correct, before because, on the counterfactual accounts, it is very close to the principle that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’. If the transference account of causation is correct, then lack of causal responsibility does not imply inability to make a difference.

12. For argument that cases of allowing involve causing harm see Bennett (1995), 128; Kagan (1989) 92—94; Quinn (1989), 293. Bennett also argues that appeal to causation will not be able to explain the doing/allowing distinction because the doing/allowing distinction applied to non-causal consequence (Bennett 1995, 127).

13. See Munthe (1999), for an interesting attack on the claim that the counterfactual distinction is morally significant. Munthe argues that if true, this claim would violate the rule that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’.

14. Quinn uses the expression, “harmful positive agency” for doing harm and “harmful negative agency” for allowing harm. This idea can be traced back at least to Anscombe and Davidson; see Anscombe (1958) and Davidson (1980).

15. Note that Quinn’s argument for the moral significance of the distinction doesn’t seem to hang on his account of the distinction.

16. See Strudler and Wasserman (1995) for an interesting critique of this point.

17. This nutshell leaves out much important detail. See the original.

18. See Woollard (2010) for argument that Bennett’s positive/ negative distinction is in fact morally relevant.

19. For example, Dinello (1971). Quinn makes a similar point in (1989).

20. Note that Sassan bears obvious resemblances to Harry Frankfurt’s famous counterexample to the Principle of Alternative Possibilities. See Frankfurt (1969). It is importantly different from that example, however.

21. In correspondence with Howard-Snyder, cited in Howard-Snyder (2002).

22. See Woollard (2015) for an argument that Bennett can avoid the Sassan counterexample by reframing his account to ask not whether most ways the agent could move would have led to the harmful upshot occurring but whether most way the agent could have moved would have left the relevant fact about the agent’s behavior holding. The difference is important because the relationship between the relevant fact and the upshot may not be simply counterfactual dependence.

23. Woollard (2008) argues that Foot should not be interpreted as seeing all safety net cases as enablings.

24. This version of the Impoverished Village Case is taken from McMahan (1993). It is based on an example originally presented in Bennett (1981), p. 91. For other similar cases, see Kagan (1989), 106–11.

25. For a similar objection, see Isaacs (1995).

26. See Isaacs (1995) and Persson and Savulescu (2005) for critiques of McMahan. See Woollard (2015) for an alternative version of the non-unified approach.

27. This is a variation of Poisoner 1 (Hanna 2014, p. 681).

28. Persson originally presents his objection as the ‘paradox’ that the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing implies both that it is permissible for to allow the victim of past behavior to die in cases like Poison 1 (because it is allowing harm) and that it is impermissible to do so (because it is doing harm). This presentation is unfortunate as it overlooks the fact that most supporters of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing understand it as a claim about the moral distinction between doing harm and merely allowing harm. But Persson’s core point does not rest on ignoring this aspect of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing. He anticipates the response that the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing could be understood so that a permission to let someone be killed is not seen as implying a permission to let yourself kill that person (Persson 2013, 100). His real, and much more interesting, objections come up in discussion of this response.

29. Hanna argues that strategies that seem promising for showing why allowing oneself to have done harm is not equivalent to merely allowing harm seem to imply that it is equivalent to doing harm—and vice versa (Hanna 2014).

Copyright © 2016 by
Fiona Woollard <>
Frances Howard-Snyder

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