Notes to Ecology

1. “Ecology” was but one of many terms that Haeckel introduced—one historian calls him the “busiest name-maker of his time”; see Worster (1994), p. 192. For a history of ecology with an emphasis on population ecology, see Kingsland (1985). For a philosophical defense of Haeckel's conception of ecology, see Cooper (2004). For a very different point of view, one that attempts to embed ecology in its human and cultural context, see Haila and Levins (1992).

2. There have been many discussions of model construction in ecology, though usually only in the context of population ecology (or, more generally, population biology, that is, including population genetics). See, for instance, Levins (1966), with further discussion by Wimsatt (1987), Orzack and Sober (1993), Odenbaugh (2003), and Justus (2005).

3. Some philosophers will find this assessment of theory in ecology overly pessimistic; see Shrader-Frechette and McCoy (1993), Sarkar (1996), and Weber (1999) for further discussion. Others will argue for the existence of ecological laws (for instance, Lawton [1999], Lange [2002] and Ginzburg and Colyvan [2004]).

4. “Nothing in biology makes sense except in the light of evolution,” as Dobzhansky (1973) famously quipped.

5. See van Valen (1973) who, however, only presents this formulation only as one that is “plausible.” Problems arising from a stronger interpretation should not be attributed to him.

6. See, for example, Peters (1991) (who, however, frames the question in terms of Popperian falsifiability). For a response, see Haila (1997).

7. This is sometimes also called “model uncertainty” though that term also has other uses. In any case “sensitivity” or “robustness” (Levins 1966) analysis is supposed to provide a way out from the problem. According to this methodological stricture, only invariant results from a variety of different models should be accepted with confidence. Much has been written about robustness of this type (by philosophers [Wimsatt 1987; Orzack and Sober 1993; Justus 1995]) though it has never been formalized successfully.

8. On issues connected with the definition of complexity, see Zurek (1990).

9. A more extensive treatment of some of the philosophical issues in population ecology is given by Colyvan (forthcoming).

10. Scudo and Ziegler (1978) collect most of the principal works from this period. Their use of “golden age” to describe this period underscores the wealth of theoretical work in ecology during this period including, especially, the work of Lotka and Volterra. Kingsland (1985) provides a history.

11. Interactions between individuals are also being regarded as properties of individuals.

12. There are two notable exceptions: classical population ecology does include age- and stage-structured models which subdivide the individuals of a population in a series of age or life-stage classes. These fall somewhere in the continuum between purely state-based and individual-based models. This is an example of the demarcation problem. However, does it matter that models cannot be classified into clean categories? Probably not, when it is recalled that hybrid and confluent models are among the most fecund in many scientific contexts—for more on this issue, see Sarkar (2005b).

13. Strictly speaking, this already results in a population model of a community—an example of the demarcation problem mentioned in Section 1.

14. For some, the former is a fundamental law of ecology, and the latter a canonical model of the field (see, for example, Ginzburg and Colyvan [2004]). According to these authors, changes from exponential growth should be regarded as indicative of “ecological forces” in the same way that, in classical mechanics, deviations from Newton's first law of motion indicate the presence of physical forces.

15. See Finerty (1976) for the history and an overview of the models; Chitty (1996) provides a readable account of the current status.

16. See May (1976); Kot (2001) provides a useful recent review.

17. See Kot (2001) for a review of the dispute.

18. In the context of ecology Wimsatt (1980) is one of the few philosophical explorations of the concept of randomness.

19. For a full statement of the act, see “The United States National Forest Management Act of 1976” in the Other Internet Resources section.

20. See Zaber, David J., “Southern Lessons: Saving Species through the National Forest Management Act” in the Other Internet Resources section.

21. Shaffer (1978), pp. 8-9. Shaffer's choice of the Yellowstone grizzly bears has had the result that almost all early examples of stochastic PVA relied on that data set. See Beissinge (2002), pp. 6-7.

22. Shaffer (1978), p. 12. For a more detailed critique of the MVP concept, see Sarkar (2005a).

23. Gilpin and Soulé (1986), p. 19. The early enthusiasm for PVA is best expressed by Shaffer's somewhat grandiose hope: “Like physicists searching for a grand unified theory explaining how the four fundamental forces …interact to control the structure and fate of the universe, conservation biologists now seek their own grand unified theory explaining how habitat type, quality, quantity, and pattern interact to control the structures and fates of species. Population viability analysis (PVA) is the first expression of this quest (Shaffer, in Meffe and Carroll [1994], pp. 305–306).” As the text notes, in retrospect, PVA did not live up to this promise.

24. for example, Margules (1989). Caughley (1994) offers a different critique of stochastic PVA. For a response, see Hedrick et al. (1996).

25. See, for example, Grumbine (1992), p. 32, and almost any textbook of conservation biology from the 1990s.

26. In a piece in Other Inquisitions Borges introduced an alleged Chinese encyclopedia in which animals are classified as: (i) those that belong to the Emperor; (ii) embalmed ones; (iii) those that are trained; (iv) suckling pigs; (v) mermaids; (vi) fabulous ones; (vii) stray dogs; (viii) those included in the present classification; (ix) those that tremble as if they were mad; (x) innumerable ones; (xi) those drawn with a very fine camelhair brush; (xii) others; (xiii) those that have just broken a flower vase; and (xiv) those that from a long way off look like flies. Borges' classification provided one inspiration for Foucault's (1970) justly famous musings on the nature of classification, and the power relations embodied in such arrangements, in The Order of Things.

27. Lande et al. (2003), p. 6. While this argument makes it clear why environmental stochasticity should not be regarded as haveing an explicit dependence on population size, the reasons for suggesting that demographic stochasticity should have such a dependence are not equally compelling.

28. Lande et al. (2003), p. 7. Note that dependence on density ipso facto requires a dependennce of population size.

29. Even with a mathematical models, these definitions (like all definitions) are partly conventional and acceptable only to the extent that they are useful.

30. Foley (1994). The same result was obtained independently by Lande (1993).

31. Foley (1997), however, does not provided an explicit analysis of this case because he was unable to produce an exact solution of the model.

32. Sarkar, unpublished results, based on an exact solution of Foley's model.

33. See Odenbaugh (2005) for an entry to the extensive literature. For all the extensive discussion of the appropriate definition of “community” it remains far from clear why the issue is important, that is, why it matters to the construction of empirically adequate models—but this is a topic that will be left for another occasion.

34. Such associations are now usually called “assemblages” in contemporary ecology.

35. See Levins (1974, 1975) where loop analysis is first introduced; Puccia and Levins (1985) further develop the theory. Note, however, that this is but one way of representing communities and should not be taken as categorical.

36. As Goodman (1975, p. 261) puts it: “The diversity-stability hypothesis has been trotted out time and time again as an argument for various preservationist and environmentalist policies. It has seemed to offer an easy way to refute the charge that these policies represent nothing more than the subjective preferences of some minority constituencies.…From a practical standpoint, the diversity-stability hypothesis is not really necessary; even if the hypothesis is completely false it remains logically possible—and, on the best available evidence, very likely—that disruption of the patterns of evolved interaction in natural communities will have untoward, and occasionally catastrophic, consequences. In other words, though the hypothesis many be false, the policies it promotes are prudent.” The rationale for biodiversity conservation developed in the last chapter does not even require Goodman's prudential argument to be sound even though it probably is.

37. The qualifie “typically” is necessary because it is conceivable that these interaction are density-dependent with B interacting much more strongly with A at lower densities (of B) than at higher ones.

38. For a survey of definitions and measures of diversity, see Magurran (1988). Ricotta (2005) surveys some of the more recent work but is not comprehensive.

39. For a very important early analysis, see Lewontin (1969).

40. These tables are based on James Justus' dissertation in progress (“The Stability, Complexity, Diversity Debate of Theoretical Community Ecology: A Philosophical Analysis”, Department of Philosophy, University of Texas at Austin). Grimm and Wissel (1997) provide a more comprehensive inventory which is very similarly organized as Box 3.2.

41. May (1973) notes a concept of stability that is very close to this: the probability of return to equilibrium.

42. Pimm (1991).

43. Pimm (1991).

44. Pianka (2000).

45. Pimm (1991).

46. Holling (1973); Pimm (1991).

47. Lehman and Tilman (2000) attribute this to Naeem (1998) who, however, does not explicitly suggest the use of this criterion as a definition of stability.

48. See May (1973) who, finds a negative correlation; however, May replaces diversity with complexity in his theoretical analyses. Nevertheless, the results of his derivations probably remain correct if diversity is used instead of complexity (as he measures it).

49. For a philosophical attempt to trace the history of this metaphor, see Cuddington (2001). See, also, Egerton (1973).

50. Pimm (1991) summarizes the evidence for this conclusion as it appeared around 1990. No more recent similarly exhaustive survey seems to be available,

51. See Gause (1934). Note, however, that on the “received view” (Sarkar 2004, 2005b) of evolution based on population genetics, natural selection does not act between species. But, without invoking natural selection as acting in such a way, it is hard to imagine how ecology can be practiced. Once again, there is an obviously important open philosophical question and, moreover, one the answer to which could make a tangible difference to the practice of biology.

52. May (1973); Pimm (1991). Note, also, the discussion of the last paragraph.

53. See Lehman and Tilman (2000).

54. Pfisterer and Schmid (2002); see Naeem (2002) for a commentary.

55. McCann (2000). Unfortunately, because of their potential to mislead a broad audience, McCann's claims are presented in a special section on biodiversity in the eminent journal, Nature.

56. See Lange (2004), who uses island biogeography theory to argue that ecology has laws; see, also Shrader-Frechette (1990) and Sarkar (2005a) for discussions of the use of species-area curves and island biogeography theory in biodiversity conservation planning.

57. For a recent appraisal of what is known about species-area relationships, see Rosenzweig (2005).

58. Arrhenius (1921); see, also, Gleason (1922) who appears to have obtained the result independently.

59. Margules et al. (1982) emphasize this shift in the explanation of the species-area relation.

60. See, for example, Connor and McCoy (1979) and the reply by Sugihara (1981).

61. His most important results are presented in Preston (1962a, b).

62. Munroe (1948); Brown and Lomolino (1989) provide a discussion of Munroe's work.

63. MacArthur and Wilson (1963, 1967). For a recent balanced assessment of the status of this theory, see Whittaker (1998).

64. In an interesting theoretical innovation, Hubbell (2001) has recently added speciation to this mix.

65. See, for instance, Gilbert (1980); problems with the assumptions of the theory and the difficulty of calibrating its parameters were pointed out as early as 1969 in Sauer's (1969) review of MacArthur and Wilson's book.

66. The following references provide an entry into this dispute: Wilson and Willis (1975); May (1975); Diamond (1975b, 1976); Diamond and May (1976); Terborgh (1975, 1976).

67. May (1975), p. 177.

68. International Union for the Conservation of Nature (1980).

69. Simberloff and Abele (1976a); for responses, see Diamond (1976), Terborgh (1976), Whitcomb et al. (1976). Simberloff and Abele (1976b) contains their reply.

70. Soulé et al. (1979).

71. Western and Ssemakula (1981).

72. Zimmerman and Bierregard (1986).

73. Margules et al. (1982). Earlier, Higgs (1981) provided a theoretical analysis comparing a single large reserve to two smaller ones, each of which had half the area of the first. Whether the single reserve or the pair permitted the coexistence of more species depended on context; the island biogeography theory did not provide unequivocal results.

74. Soulé and Simberloff (1986). The history of the SLOSS debate is yet to receive the philosophical attention it deserves (see, however, Shrader-Frechette [1990] and, especially, Kingsland [2002]). Mann and Plummer (1995) include a useful popular history.

75. See Tansley (1935); emphasis in the original.

76. Reductionism will be discussed in Section 5. (The account of reductin being invoked hre is Sarkar's [1998] model of “strong” reduction.)

77. See McIntosh (1985), Chapter 6, for more details on this point.

78. Golley (1993) has traced the history of the “ecosystem concept,” including both the philosophical and the scientific developments discussed in this section, in great detail.

79. See McIntosh (1985), p. 205; for a partial contrast, see Golley (1993).

80. See, for example, Bormann and Likens (1979a, b). Both McIntosh (1985) and Golley (1993) identify this study as critical to the attempt to establish ecosystem studies institutionally.

81. See Sarkar (2005a).

82. See Vitousek (1994).

83. On such models, see, especially, Sellers et al. (1997); Prentice et al. (2001) summarize the current situation.

84. See, for instance, Hobbs and Huenneke (1992) and Kasischke et al. (1995).

85. Ryan (1991).

86. Aerts and Chapin III (2000).

87. See the important review by Huston et al. (1988) which correctly predicted that IBMs would change the nature of ecological modeling.

88. See, for example, Shugart (1984) and Shugart et al. (1992). However, a comprehensive comparative review of the success and failures of IBMs, relative to traditional ecological models, does not appear to be available at present.

89. See Shugartet al. (1992) for detail.

90. See Beissinger (2002) and Beissinger and Westphal (1998).

91. For more on this view of reductionism, see Sarkar (1998).

92. Intrinsically systemic properties are those that cannot be defined without reference to the system as a whole as an ontological unit beyond the components that comprise it.

93. For instance, Spencer (1997) constructs such a model for small freshwater benthic habitats with three trophic levels (algae, herbivorous invertebrates, and predatory invertebrates).

94. Fryxell and Lundberg (1998) take this unificatory strategy even further to include some evolutionary considerations.

95. Roger Tomlinson, who directed the project, and Duane Marble are the two individuals usually credited with inventing the acronym “GIS.” Much of the history recounted in the text is recounted in Tomlinson (1988).

96. These maps classified areas according to: (a) soil capability for agriculture; (b) recreational potential; (c) habitat potential for ungulates; (d) habitat potential for waterfowl; (e) forestry potential; (f) present land use; and (g) shoreline.

97. Running et al. (1989).

98. Spatial modeling on regular geometric grids is not analogous to visual modeling in the same way. Proper visual representation is supposed to be as veridical as possible. This means that as much spatial detail as possible should be incorporated into a model. Representing spatial structure as globally geometrically regular, as traditional spatially explicit ecological models have been forced to do (because of the complexity otherwise encountered) goes against the spirit of this veridicality requirement.

99. See, for example, Taylor (2005) which is an inter-disciplinary attempt to understand complexity in ecology.

100. Sterelny and Griffiths' (1999) textbook is a notable exception, devoting due space to ecology.

Copyright © 2005 by
Sahotra Sarkar

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