Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Hobbes on the Emotions

1. Introduction

Unlike Descartes, Hobbes wrote no single work devoted to the emotions. But a number of texts contain extensive discussions: chapters 7, 9 and 12 of the Elements of Law (ms. 1640); de Cive (1642); chapters 6 and 13 (among others) of Leviathan (1651); chapter 25.12-13 of de Corpore (1655); and chapter 11 of de Homine (1658). How Hobbes identifies and classifies the passions changes over the years. But other views remain remarkably consistent: particularly the identification of passions as a kind of motion internal to the body and related to the will, the description of happiness, or “felicity,” as continual success in satisfying desires in the future (rather than the satisfaction itself), the important place given to “glory,” and the (rather curious) opposition between passion and reason.

2. Hobbesian materialism

One touchstone of Hobbes's account is his materialist psychology. Criticizing the “metaphorical” sense in which passions are motions, he instead identifies them with material locomotion. Life itself requires motion, Hobbes maintains, and there are many kinds of motions within a living body: passions stand between the involuntary “vital” motion characteristic of all living things, and animal, or voluntary motion, by which animals move their bodies through the world, driven by appetites and aversions. Hobbes links motions caused by the impact of external objects on our sense organs and the reverberations of “decaying sense” to the imagination; the imagination can in turn be considered the “small,” almost indiscernible, beginnings of animal motion, which Hobbes calls endeavour, or “conatus.” Alterations in these small, interior motions produce what we call “deliberation,” the last motion of which is the will that produces voluntary motion. Passions are identified as those interior beginnings of motion, by which the imagination eventually motivates us to action. They thus coincide with the will, and Hobbes emphasizes that the passions have a motivating power through their attractive or aversive directions. He sometimes (e.g., in the Elements of Law) locates different faculties in different parts of the body: sense and imagination are attributed to the brain, while the continuation of those motions to the heart produces passions. Motion, however, circulates continuously throughout the body. But it is only at the end of chapter 25 of De Corpore that he provides a thoroughly materialist explanation of how changes in vital motion result in appetitive or aversive action, referring to the circulation of the blood (as explained by Harvey) and linking it with a Stoic-sounding account of the contracting and expanding of the animal spirits. He does not offer a description of the physiology of any particular passion, as Descartes did. But he always treats passions as motions within the body, and seems to think that is sufficient to support his materialist claims.

3. The classification of the passions

As in other areas of his thought, Hobbes puts great stock in the taxonomy of the passions. Here, however, the texts differ somewhat (Pacchi 1987). For instance, the Elements of Law starts with the passion of “glory,” followed by a long list of passions divided (more or less) into contraries, in a way that seems indebted to Aristotle's Rhetoric. To these, Hobbes adds such distinctively modern passions as “admiration” and its opposite, “contempt,” while allowing many passions to be compounds, e.g., of joy and grief. Hobbes also distinguishes between passions directed at past and present objects, and those directed at future ones; only the last are the passions of the mind. In general, Hobbes seems more interested in defining each passion, and placing it relative to its “opposite” than in generating a well-ordered taxonomy from the top down. But Chapter 9 of the Elements concludes with Hobbes's famous list of passions, and related motions organized as moments in a footrace:

To endeavour is appetite
To be remiss is sensuality.
To consider them behind is glory.
To consider them before is humility …
Continually to be out-gone is misery.
Continually to out-go the next before is felicity.
And to forsake the course is to die. (Elements of Law 9.21)

On the other hand, chapter 6 of Leviathan shows many similarities to Descartes, particularly in its identification of six “simple” passions. These are not primary; appetite and aversion are the primary drives, to which Hobbes adds “contempt” as a neutral middle. The simples can be compounded in innumerable ways to produce new passions; Hobbes lists some thirty or so passions, which are just the simple passions modified by diverse considerations. The list is not exhaustive, but it does show how widely Hobbes tosses his nets: “passions” include everything from ephemeral states (e.g., “sudden glory” causing laughter), to moods (e.g., confidence and diffidence), to character traits and dispositions (e.g., good nature, covetousness and impudence).

Hobbes also distinguishes in a number of places between sensual pleasures (a kind of passion) and the passions of the mind. In the Elements of Law, the difference that makes a difference is found in the temporality of the object: sensual pleasures are directed at present objects, whereas passions of the mind are concerned with the future. Leviathan puts the difference in terms of whether objects are considered as effect, means, or promise (although as long as life lasts, these considerations are related in an endless cycle). In both cases, however, Hobbes seems most interested in the passions insofar as they concern objects that have not yet been attained. This is typical of his generally future-directed approach to the explanation of human life, an approach evident both in his definition of felicity and in his account of how the fundamental law of nature directs us in a forward-looking search to preserve our own lives.

4. Power, Felicity and the Passion for Glory

What makes for the prospect of success in satisfying our passions is power, and thus, the pursuit of happiness is a matter of striving for power. Power must be understood broadly: Hobbes maintains that the greatest part of an individual's power is socially constructed, either through the pooling of forces, or simply from the recognition of one's (comparatively) great power by others. For this reason, the passion for “glory” – understood as the desire for recognition of one's power, and the eclipse of others' power – seems a natural outgrowth and direct reflection of the striving for power by beings like us. So it is not surprising that the most prominent member of the list of passions provided in the Elements of Law is glory. The passion is less prominent in the Leviathan, although it figures as one of the basic causes of the war that marks the “natural condition of mankind.” The search for glory seems bound to produce conflict, since recognition is competitively bought (especially in the state of nature), although the Leviathan finds ways to satisfy the urge to glory without unmanageable conflict (see Slomp, 1998). For this reason, the passion for glory can give rise to self-destructive behavior in which conquest is pursued further than security requires. Fortunately, the disposition to this passion is not universal, since some people are “moderate.” But it does seem inherent to the human constitution, and Hobbes gives a psychological-reflective basis to the propensity to this passion: glory involves a contemplation of one's own power, which is inherently pleasurable – and indeed closely related to the prospect of happiness (see Leviathan 13.4).

5. The Passions in and out of the State of Nature

The psychological gratification and self-fortifying nature of glory may also figure in Hobbes's famous account of the passions in the state of nature. On the one hand, the passions endemic to the “natural condition” of mankind (i.e., to life without a sovereign authority) can be understood in terms of our native “endeavour” to preserve our life, to satisfy our desires, and to secure the prospect of continuing success in the future. In a situation of rough “equality of ability” and scarcity of goods, we will naturally feel an “equality of hope” for attaining our ends. Competition is a natural response to that situation, an appropriate strategy for attaining our ends. So too are the passions of diffidence and glory (subject to the caveats already discussed). The rub is that the collective behavior motivated by such passions is at odds with what the laws of nature tells us – that is, with rational consideration of how best to achieve whatever we endeavor to achieve. Here we have the first of several oppositions Hobbes sets up between the motivations of the passions and the direction of reason, although the conflict may be one inherent in practical reason itself. Hobbes does allow that there are “passions that incline men to peace,” e.g., “the fear of death, desire of such things as are necessary to commodious living, and a hope by their industry to obtain them” (Leviathan 13.14). And reason suggests that we can transform our natural condition and satisfy our peaceable passions by setting up a sovereign authority. Doing so may transform, or at least modify, our “natural” passions. Certainly, we will find new objects for our hopes, desires and fears. More generally, it will become reasonable to cultivate a sociable character, or “complaisance” (which is not explicitly identified as a passion, but seems a plausible candidate). Perhaps most importantly, the institutions of a commonwealth under some sovereign authority will provide new forms of power and new forms for the recognition of power that will channel the passion for glory in directions consistent with communal living.

What Hobbes seems to find the central problem in the state of nature is not so much the preponderance of “unsociable” passions as the lack of a “common measure.” Each person takes his personal preferences, embodied in his particular passions, to be the measure of good and evil. The institution of a sovereign authority provides the missing common measure, as well as the ability to enforce it. The passions become a problem for Hobbes, insofar as he identifies them with the lack of such a measure, that is, with the particularized, individual judgments of good and evil. The downfall of Aristotle and other practitioners of “darknesse from vain philosophy” lies in their failure to see that there is no internal guide – not even passions moderated by reason – that will provide an appropriate common measure in the absence of a sovereign authority (Leviathan 46.32).

6. Passions and Reason

The association of passions with the individual and idiosyncratic may explain why Hobbes frequently opposes them to the “common measure” provided by the pronouncements of reason. Such opposition figures prominently in the Elements of Law and in Parts III and IV of the Leviathan, which refuse to ascribe passions to God. Nonetheless, the condemnation of reason in favor of the passions strikes an odd note. For the passions are a crucial link in the cycle of motion that constitutes living as such. Because they are indispensable elements of any life, Hobbes criticizes philosophers such as Aristotle who praise “mediocrity” (moderation) in the passions. Moreover, Hobbes associates the motion of “greater” passions with greater ambition and greater intelligence, although an excess of passion may produce giddiness or madness. A “defect” of passion engenders “dulnesse,” and a disorder of passions, melancholy or enthusiasm (Leviathan 8.16-20). Moreover, passions seem to provide the very material of reasoning. They are the “beginnings of speech,” which are the necessary tools for reasoning about universals. More importantly, chapter 6 of Leviathan declares that the deliberation that precedes will is itself simply an alternation of passions. Hobbes makes no distinction here between deliberation about means and deliberation about ends; a passion-motion is necessary to initiate any animal motion, even if it is simply action instrumental to some end. For these reasons, Hobbes declares that “the desires and other passions of man are in themselves no sin” (Leviathan 13.10).

This contrast also poses a practical problem. For it seems impossible that a reason divorced from the passions could ever control the passions and the behavior they motivate. Chapter 14 of Leviathan tells us that passions can only be bridled by other passions – particularly, the passion of fear. One might think that this is simply a matter of harnessing the passion of fear to enforce that which reason has declared. But there is still a problem of motivation, of what will move us to undertake harnessing fear to reason; indeed, there is still the problem of how passion and reason can come into contact to govern behavior at all. Passions are motions, and Hobbes declares in De Corpore 9.7 that only motions can affect other motions. Perhaps, though, we can avoid these puzzles if we refuse to view the contrast between passion and reason as reflecting a deep opposition in kind. Consider, for instance, how Hobbes uses the contrast in de Cive 8.18: “the naturall state hath the same proportion to the Civill, I mean liberty to subjection, which Passion hath to Reason, or a Beast to a Man.” The difference between passions and reason is analogous to that between the natural state of liberty, particularly the liberty of acting on idiosyncratic preferences, and the civil state where there exists a common measure. Hobbes continues this theme in 9.1:

Lastly, out of [commonwealth], there is a Dominion of Passions, war, fear, poverty, slovinlinesse, solitude, barbarisme, ignorance, cruelty. In it, the Dominion of reason, peace, security, riches, decency, society, elegancy, sciences, and benevolence.

War, fear, and cruelty are certainly different from peace, security, society, elegancy, sciences and benevolence, but each may be equally motivated by passions (see Leviathan 13.13-14). It seems plausible to understand Hobbes not so much to be opposing two separate faculties, as distinguishing between the chaotic and unbridled passions of the state of nature and what emerges when passions are channeled by an overriding, organizing passion (fear of a coercive power) to accord with a common measure. In any case, what seems most important to Hobbes is the contrast between what drives conflict and what allows cooperative endeavor, rather than any quasi-Stoic view about how reason can overcome the passions.

7. Influences on Later Authors

Hobbes's understanding of the emotions presented an important alternative to Descartes's ‘functionalist’ approach to the passions, one that made him attractive to authors such as Spinoza who were bent on eliminating even the whisper of teleological explanation. Spinoza's borrowings from the Hobbesian account of the transition from the state of nature to sovereign authority are well-known. But that debt is merely one element in a shared approach to using the emotions to explain the naturalistic mechanics of human behavior. True, Spinoza does not emphasize the passion of glory as did Hobbes, taking a rather dim view of what he calls “ambition.” But Spinoza does adopt many of the psychological underpinnings Hobbes attributed to the passion in his basic ontology, going so far as to extend the purview of the “conatus” so that it becomes intrinsic to all finite things, all of which express “a perpetual and restless desire of power after power” (Leviathan 11.2). Spinoza likewise contrasts passions and the “common measure” of reason, but conceives it in terms of his contrast between what is active in us and the merely passive emotions. We still must work within an internal affective economy, in which “only an affect can overcome an affect.”

Hobbes also exerted a tremendous influence on later British writers on the emotions, although there his influence was seen more as a cautionary example than as a model. Walter Charleton included Hobbes in his pantheon of illustrious sources, but Henry More seemed more influential when he criticized Hobbes for considering self-preservation the “highest wisdom” (1690, 62). In particular, Hobbes came to be associated with the caustically deflationary and egoist views of Bernard Mandeville and thus served as a target for those philosophers who took morality to be rooted in other-directed emotions or reasons. More generally, Hobbes became a locus in a cluster of debates about the nature and corrigibility of the emotions. (For further discussion, see the section on Changing Vocabulary in the main entry.) Whether Hobbes was interpreted fairly by these successors depends on the proper understanding of what exactly he meant by the “passions” and how they might figure among the various conditions for social life. But it is noteworthy that unlike such contemporaries as Edward Reynolds (1640), Hobbes does not give self-love a prominent place in his enumeration of the passions either in the Elements of Law or the Leviathan (see Schmitter 2011).

Copyright © 2010 by
Amy M. Schmitter <>

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