Supplement to Empathy

The Study of Cognitive Empathy and Empathic Accuracy

Besides a growing interest in person perception among psychologists in the 1950's (e.g., Heider (1958)), researchers from the counseling and therapeutic milieu were keen on investigating empathic accuracy, since empathy was seen as being essential for successful therapy. In conceiving of a client centered therapy, Rogers defines empathy early on as the ability to “ perceive the internal frame of reference of another with accuracy and with the emotional components and meanings which pertain thereto as if one were the person, but without ever losing the ‘as if’ conditions” (1959, 210-11). In his later works he more fully analyzes it as the ability to enter

the private perceptual world of the other and becoming thoroughly at home in it…It means temporarily living in the other's life, moving about in it delicately without making judgments; it means sensing meanings of which he or she is scarcely aware… It includes communicating your sensings of the person's world….It means frequently checking with the person as to the accuracy of your sensings, and being guided by the responses you receive…To be with another in this way means that for the time being you lay aside your own views and values in order to enter another's world without prejudice. (Rogers 1975, quoted after Rogers 1980, 142/43).

If empathy is central for the success of therapy, as Rogers claims, then it would be good if one could rank the applicants for the counseling profession according to their empathic abilities. Early attempts to test empathic accuracy in the above sense have, however, encountered a number of methodological problems that—once recognized—seriously discredited this research tradition for a while (Davis 1994). Dymond's (1949) influential “scale for rating empathic ability” can be used to illustrate this fact. (For other methods of measuring empathic accuracy see Taft 1955, Davis and Kraus 1997)). Dymond defined empathy in the tradition of Rogers as the “imaginative transposing of oneself into the thinking, feeling, and acting of another person and so structuring the world as he does” (1949, 127). He then proposed to test empathic ability by measuring the degree of correspondence between a person A and a person B's ratings of each other on six personality traits—such as self-confidence, superior-inferior, selfish-unselfish, friendly-unfriendly, leader-follower, and sense of humor—after a short time of interacting with each other. More specifically, empathic ability is measured through a questionnaire that asked both persons

  1. to rate themselves on those personality traits,
  2. to rate the other as they see them,
  3. to estimate from their perspective of how the other would rate himself,
  4. and to rate themselves according to how they think the other would rate them.

Person's A empathic ability is then determined by the degree to which A's answers to (iii) and (iv) corresponds to B's answer to (i) and (ii). The less A's answers diverge from B's, the higher one judges A's empathic ability and accuracy.

Yet as has been pointed out (Cronbach 1955, Davies 1994), it is not clear that the test measures empathic ability as Dymond defines it. Even if the calculated degree of empathy is high, nothing in the test guarantees that this result is indeed based on a transposition into the mindset of the other individual. First, not all of the trait attributions seem to be conceptually independent of each other. Rating somebody high on self-confidence seems to imply conceptually that one also rates him high on leadership qualities etc. Second, responding to the questionnaire is possible without imaginatively adopting the perspective of the other individual. One's answers could merely depend on a stereotypical understanding of how others in a particular group rate themselves. Knowing, for example, that another person is a Harvard graduate and having the prejudice that Harvard graduates tend to be rather self-confident might enable me to score relatively high on the above empathy scale if that prejudice is indeed true. Yet such “empathic success” seems to depend more on the adequacy of my picture of the “generalized other” (Cronbach 1955, 179) and not on my ability to engage with the other as a concrete individual taking his specific perspective into account. Third, one would score highly on this measure of empathy, if—for whatever reasons—subjects A and B share certain response biases and use the same region of the scale in responding to the questions. If both subjects, for example, check always the midpoint of the scale (Davis 1994, 85), their empathic ability would be rated highly. In this case, the measure of empathic ability has no real “psychological meaning” (Cronbach 1955, 180). It certainly does not measure any capacity having to do with a therapist's ability to relate in an empathic manner to his client in a therapy session.

While these methodological concerns about empathic accuracy have seriously hindered research on empathic accuracy for some time, it has been revived in the last thirty years. The work of William Ickes illustrates this revival well. In contrast to earlier conceptions of empathy that included some reference to underlying psychological processes, Ickes's conception of empathy is result oriented and studies empathy merely as the “ability to accurately infer the specific content of another person's thoughts and feelings” (Ickes 1997, 3). Ickes focuses not on the question of how well subjects are able to predict stable dispositional traits of another person. He tests their abilities to accurately identify others' occurrent mental states in the context of dyadic interaction schemes. In a typical experimental setup, an interaction between two people in a naturalistic setting, such as a waiting room, is video-taped. Immediately afterwards, while watching the video tape, the subjects are asked to identify their thoughts and feelings and the thoughts and feelings of the other person. Their empathic accuracy is then measured based on the judgments of independent raters using a three point scale for evaluating of how similar A's characterization of his or her own thoughts is compared to B's characterization of A's thoughts and vice versa. (For a very readable survey see Ickes 2003). Based on this research, it seems that our empathic abilities are rather low (within the 25-35% range), we are also rather poor judges of our own mindreading abilities, and maybe surprisingly empathic accuracy between people in long marital relations tend to decline. Moreover, the traditional stereotype and high regard for a “women's intuition” has to be regarded as a myth. If there is a difference between men and women in this respect, it has more to do with a difference in motivation than a difference in ability. (Ickes 2003, see however the opposing view of Baron-Cohen 2003).

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Copyright © 2013 by
Karsten Stueber <kstueber@holycross.edu>

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