Supplement to Empathy

Measuring Empathy

Psychologists distinguish between measurements of situational empathy—that is, empathic reactions in a specific situation—and measurements of dispositional empathy, where empathy is understood as a person's stable character trait. Situational empathy is measured either by asking subjects about their experiences immediately after they were exposed to a particular situation, by studying the “facial, gestural, and vocal indices of empathy-related responding” (Zhou, Valiente, and Eisenberg 2003, 275), or by various physiological measures such as the measurement of heart rate or skin conductance. None of these measurements are perfect tools. As is widely known, self-reports can be influenced by a variety of interfering factors. They might not indicate of how one has actually felt but rather reflect one's knowledge of how other people expect one to feel. They also might vary according to an individual's ability to verbalize his or her thoughts. Physiological measurements do not fall prey to such concerns, yet it is unclear whether they allow one to distinguish sufficiently between empathy, sympathy, and personal distress (Zhou, Valiente, and Eisenberg 2003).

A large chunk of empathy research has focused on investigating the variables associated with empathy as a stable disposition. Dispositional empathy has been measured either by relying on the reports of others (particularly in case of children) or, most often (in researching empathy in adults), by relying on the administration of various questionnaires associated with specific empathy scales. Some of the most widely used questionnaires have been Hogan's empathy (EM) scale (Hogan 1969), Mehrabian and Epstein's questionnaire measure of emotional empathy (QMEE; Mehrabian and Epstein 1972), and, since the 1980's, Davis's Interpersonal Reactivity Index (IRI; Davis 1980, 1983, and 1994). These questionnaires reflect the multiplicity of empathy conceptions in psychology, since each understands itself as operationalizing a different definition of empathy. Hogan conceives of empathy in an exclusively cognitive manner, Mehrabian and Epstein think of it as an exclusively affective phenomenon defining it broadly as “a vicarious response to the perceived emotional experiences of others” (525), and Davis treats empathy as including both cognitive and affective components; as a “set of constructs, related in that they all concern responsivity to others but are also clearly discriminable from each other” (Davis 1983, 113).

Hogan's cognitive empathy scale consists of 64 questions that were selected from a variety of psychological personality tests such as the Minnesota Multiphasic Personality Inventory (MMPI) and the California Personality Inventory (CPI) according to a rather complicated procedure. From almost thousand questions, Hogan chose those questions in response to which he found two groups of people—who were independently identified as either low-empathy or high-empathy individuals—as showing significant differences in their answers. Mehrabian and Epstein's questionnaire consists of 33 items divided into seven subcategories testing for “susceptibility to emotional contagion,” “appreciation of the feelings of unfamiliar and distant others,” “extreme emotional responsiveness,” “tendency to be moved by others' positive emotional experiences,” “tendency to be moved by others' negative emotional experience,” “sympathetic tendency,” and “willingness to be in contact with others who have problems” (Mehrabian and Epstein 197). Yet, even though the QMEE distinguishes between these aspects of empathy on a conceptual level, it only assigns a total empathy score to individuals completing the questionnaire. For this very reason, Davis's Interpersonal Reactivity Index tends to be nowadays preferred among researchers. The IRI is a questionnaire consisting of 28 questions divided equally among four distinct subscales; that is, “perspective taking” or “the tendency to spontaneously adopt the psychological view of others in everyday life;” “empathic concern” or “the tendency to experience feelings of sympathy or compassion for unfortunate others;” “personal distress” or the “tendency to experience distress or discomfort in response to extreme distress in others;” and “fantasy” or “the tendency to imaginatively transpose oneself into fictional situations” (Davis 1994, 55-57). In contrast to Mehrabian and Epstein, Davis's scale does not calculate an overall value for empathy but calculates a separate score for each of the subscales.

Remarkably, no significant correlation has been found between the scores on various empathy scales and the measurement of empathic accuracy. If any, only a negligibly small effect has been found between empathic accuracy and affective empathy as measured by QMEE and the empathic concern and personal distress subscales in the IRI (Davis and Kraus 1997). This is particularly surprising in regard to Hogan's empathy scale, which attempts to measure empathy understood in a cognitive sense. Hogan certainly acknowledges the fact that conceiving of empathy as a disposition to “imaginatively apprehend another state of mind” does not conceptually imply anything about the objective success of such apprehension. Yet, if empathy plays a central role in establishing social relations among agents, one would expect to find a more positive correlation between the measurement of cognitive empathy as a stable disposition and empathic accuracy. Davis and Kraus do not take such lack of correlation as an indication of a fundamental failure in the conception of the empathy questionnaires. Rather, it indicates a principal limitation of any empathy scale relying on self-reports. They speculate, following Ickes (1993, 2003, chap.7 ), that the lack of correlation indicates that people in general have little meta-knowledge regarding their empathic ability. Within this interpretive framework, there is nothing in principle wrong with the questions asked to determine our empathic abilities. If we would have the required meta-knowledge, answering the questions truthfully would be a good guide for determining empathy as defined within the context of each scale.

Yet a closer look at the questions used in the questionnaires raises some more fundamental concerns about the adequacy of the various scales. Particularly in Hogan's or Mehrabian and Epstein's questionnaires, one has to be worried about the insufficient semantic correspondence between the content of the items probed and the conception of empathy presumed by the authors of the questionnaire or even the conceptions of empathy as articulated in this entry (Holz-Ebeling and Steinmetz 1995). In what sense, for example, can one understand items like “I prefer a shower to a tub bath” (#7 ), “I think I would like to belong to a singing club,” “I would like the job of a foreign correspondent” (#29), or “I like to talk about sex” (#56) in Hogan's scale as having anything to do with empathy in a cognitive sense? At most the scale could be used in identifying empathic people, if there is, as a matter of fact, a correlation between empathy and specific answers to such questions. Yet the questionnaire does not seem to probe directly for empathy, since it does not establish that subjects tested answer because of an empathic disposition as it is defined by the author. Moreover, it is not even clear that the questionnaire would be less appropriate if one were to define empathy in a purely affective manner. Investigating empathy with the help of Hogan's questionnaire seems like testing for intelligence by asking people whether they wear expensive suits and dresses. Even if counterfactually all and only intelligent people would wear such apparel, a test designed in this manner would not ascertain the existence of intelligence by testing for capacities directly associated with our understanding of intelligence. (For a discussion of Hogan see also Johnson, Cheek, and Smither 1983 and Bierhoff 2002). Similarly in Mehrabian and Epstein's scale, reverse items like “People make too much of the feelings and sensitivity of animals,” “I often find public display of affection annoying,” “I am annoyed by unhappy people who are just sorry for themselves,” or “Little children sometimes cry for no apparent reasons” (reverse items #2,3 4, and 33) do not seem to test directly for affective empathy. Answers to the last item might just reflect lack of experience with children (or too much thereof) and the other items seem at most to test for particular social attitudes towards others; attitudes that seem prima facie compatible with both high and low empathy defined as a vicarious emotional reaction to others. At best, the questions can be interpreted as measuring one's emotional arousability rather than empathy. (For this suggestion see Mehrabian, Young, and Sato 1988). Indeed in a recent study (Holz-Ebeling and Steinmetz 1995), subjects regarded hardly any of the items in the above two scales to be semantically related to the author's empathy conception. In the same study, Davis's IRI scale fared much better—even if it did not score perfectly—in that 12 out of the 28 items were regarded to be appropriate when compared with the author's general conception of empathy and his definition of the specific sub-scales. However, it has been suspected that in including the fantasy subscale and in inserting questions like “I am usually pretty effective in dealing with emergencies” or “I sometimes feel helpless when I am in the middle of a very emotional situation” under the personal distress subscale, Davis's scale measures broader psychological processes such as the imagination or capacity for emotional control; processes that probably are somehow related but that certainly are not identical to empathy (Baron-Cohen and Wheelwright 2004).

In the context of studying the question of whether autism should be regarded as an “empathy disorder,” Baron-Cohen and Wheelwright therefore felt the need to develop a new questionnaire for measuring empathy. Their empathy questionnaire, called the empathy quotient (EQ), defines empathy as including a cognitive component—a “drive to attribute mental states to another person/animal”—and an affective component, entailing “an appropriate affective response in the observer to the other's person's mental state” (168). It consists of 60 questions: 40 of them are directly related to empathy and 20 are regarded as filler items in order to distract the subjects “from a relentless focus on empathy.” First results using the test seem to verify the hypothesis that autism is associated with impairment in empathy. Simon-Baron and Wheelwright stress that one has to interpret the above results cautiously as the validity of EQ needs to be further tested and compared to other scales, particularly the IRI. Looking over the various items, it does not seem as if EQ encounters the same problems regarding its content validity as the other scales. Most items can indeed be understood as testing for empathy as defined by the authors. Yet it has to be pointed out—at least in regard to the affective component of empathy—that neither the authors' definition nor their included items sufficiently distinguish between affective empathy, sympathy, and personal distress. As many other authors, they tend to think of affective empathy as an amalgam of empathy proper, sympathy, and personal distress.

Whether or not existing means—particularly questionnaires—are appropriate tools for further distinguishing between these very different emotional reactions remains an open question. Help for devising new empathy scales or for further validating existing questionnaires could also come from the neurosciences that have very recently begun to contribute to the study of empathy and have begun to investigate the underlying neurobiological mechanisms of perspective taking (for a survey see Decety and Jackson 2004). Indeed some recent studies seem to have found preliminary evidence for a correlation between some empathy questionnaires and specific neural activity. Specifically, Gazzola, Aziz-Sadeh, and Keysers (2006) found that the auditory mirror circuits—that is, those circuits that are activated both in executing an action and while listening to sounds of similar actions—show stronger activation levels in individuals who have higher perspective taking scores in Davis's IRI questionnaire. Lamm, Bateson, Decety (2007) found correlation between the Empathy Quotient and activation in right putamen, the left posterior/middle insula, the anterior medial cingulated cortex and the left cerebellum. Such correlations suggest that those questionnaires do measure aspects that have been traditionally regarded to be central for empathy, like the ability of perspective taking. Whether the existence of such correlation can be further corroborated must await the results of additional research. Studying empathy from the perspective of the neurosciences might also help us to understand and further distinguish the various components that have been at times insufficiently held apart in the social psychological study of empathy.

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Copyright © 2013 by
Karsten Stueber <kstueber@holycross.edu>

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