Empedocles

First published Fri Mar 4, 2005; substantive revision Tue Sep 11, 2012

In antiquity, Empedocles (ca. 495–435 BCE) was characterized as active on the democratic side in the politics of his native city of Acragas in Sicily, and as a physician, as well as a philosopher and poet. His philosophical and scientific theories are mentioned and discussed in several dialogues of Plato, and they figure prominently in Aristotle's writings on physics and biology and, as a result, also in the later Greek commentaries on Aristotle's works. Diogenes Laertius devotes one of his Lives of Eminent Philosophers to him (VIII, 51–77). His writings, which are poetical in form, have come down to us mostly in fragments preserved as quotations in the works of these and other ancient authors. Extensive fragments, some of them not previously known, were recently found preserved on a papyrus roll from Egypt in the Strasbourg University library (see Martin and Primavesi 1999). The numbering of the fragments in this article follows that of the Diels-Kranz edition; the translations are from Kirk, Raven, and Schofield 1983.

Traditionally, Empedocles' writings were held to consist of two poems, in hexameter verse, entitled On Nature and Purifications. However, some modern commentators have argued that the two were originally one work—a position re-energized by the recently edited fragments of the Strasbourg manuscript. In any event, the papyrus does show the two to be thematically more closely related than previously thought. Nevertheless, the themes of the two parts (if they did belong to a single poem) are sufficiently distinct that separate treatment is appropriate here. Even if there is not a strict separation of the two themes, the first primarily concerns the formation, structure, and history of the physical world as a whole, and the formation of the animals and plants within it; the second concerns moral topics. For convenience, this article uses the traditional names for the two collections of fragments.

1. On Nature

On Nature is a bold and ambitious work. It is based on the claim that everything is composed of four material elements (“roots”); these elements are moved by two opposing forces. The elements are fire, air, earth, and water; the forces are Love and Strife. “Air” refers to aither, the upper, atmospheric air, rather than the air that we breathe here on earth. Aristotle credits Empedocles with being the first to distinguish clearly these four elements, traditional in Greek physical theory (Aristotle, Met. A4, 985a31–3). These elements and forces are eternal and equally balanced, although the influence of Love and of Strife waxes and wanes (B6 and B17, lines 14–20). Empedocles seems to have Parmenides' arguments in mind when he denies that these elements or forces come to be or pass away. Everything else comes to be and passes away because each is composed of elements that successively combine to form them and separate at their destruction (B 17.26–35).

In fragment 17, apparently speaking of the physical world as a whole, Empedocles states his fundamental thesis about the relation of elements and forces:

A twofold tale I shall tell: at one time it grew to be one alone out of many, at another again it grew apart to be many out of one. Double is the birth of mortal things and double their failing; for one is brought to birth and destroyed by the coming together of all things, the other is nurtured and flies apart as they grow apart again. And these things never cease their continual exchange, now through Love all coming together into one, now again each carried apart by the hatred of Strife. So insofar as it has learned to grow one from many, and again as the one grows apart [there] grow many, thus far do they come into being and have no stable life; but insofar as they never cease their continual interchange, thus far they exist always changeless in the cycle. (B 17.1–13) [translation modified]

Immediately one is struck by the comprehensive symmetry of this scheme. It seems to address coming-to-be and passing-away, birth and death, and it does so with an elegant balance. The many elements (four in number) come together and blend under the agency of Love, and they are driven apart by Strife, in a continual alternation.

While all commentators take this passage as fundamental, their interpretations vary, sometimes widely. In the traditional sort of interpretation (see O'Brien 1969, Wright 1981) this passage tells about a two-part symmetrical cosmic cycle, which endlessly repeats itself. We can trace the history of one cycle, beginning with the point at which all the elements are united, completely intermingled and motionless under the total domination of Love. Then Strife enters and begins to separate the elements out, until finally all the elements are completely separated into distinct, self-contained masses of fire, air, earth and water. At this point, Love begins to unite the elements until, once again, they are completely intermingled and another cycle begins. In each half of the cycle, as the separation or unification proceeds, there is a cosmogony (generation of a cosmos or ordered world) and a zoogony (generation of animals). In the first half-cycle, under the increasing influence of Strife, a cosmos and then animals come to be. In the second half, under the increasing influence of Love, again a cosmos and animals come to be.

Empedocles seems to describe such a cosmogony in other passages. He posits a stage in which Love is totally dominant and all things are unified into a Sphere (B 27). Since this spherical unity includes the elements, they are presumably thoroughly intermingled with one another. The Sphere is the initial stage in the formation of the cosmos; it is not itself a cosmos. The latter requires a separation of elements into identifiable masses of earth, air, water, and fire (B 38), even though there might still be some (much diminished) presence of each element within each of the four masses. The elements of earth, water, air and fire would predominate in the respective masses, making them identifiable as such. The mass of earth is at the center; water more or less surrounds the earth. Air forms the next layer. From fire at the periphery, the sun comes to be as a distinct entity. This geocentric formation is what the ancients usually recognized to be our cosmos. Since it is Strife that separates the elements, the cosmogony so described is presumably dependent on Strife's influence.

Empedocles also describes a time when Strife has separated the elements (B 35). When Strife reaches the depths of the vortex (i.e., the central point round which the whole cosmos turns), Love comes to be in the middle of the whirl. Love then begins to join together what Strife had separated; the mixture of things by Love gives rise to mortal beings. This somewhat mysterious description suggests that the means by which Strife separates the elements from the beginning is a vortex. Heavier elements like earth settle in the middle and lighter ones like fire are pushed to the periphery. This reference to the vortex also implies that dominance by Strife is characterized by the whirling motion of the cosmos as we know it.

While in traditional interpretations the separation by Strife, as described above, produces at first a cosmos, the continuing influence of Strife gradually increases the separation. Eventually, when Strife is totally dominant, the elements are so thoroughly separated into their respective places, each constituting a mass totally on its own, with no presence in it of any portion of any of the other elements, that the cosmos and all its movements are destroyed. These interpretations then hold that there is another cosmogony in the reverse progress from complete separation to complete unity, under the influence of Love. Certainly, the symmetry of the fundamental principle might suggest a second cosmogony. However, we do not find in the remains of Empedocles' poem a description of another cosmogony, one taking place under the influence of Love. Of course, that we do not find one does not mean that it did not exist, given the fragmentary nature of the text. In fact, Aristotle suggests in a number of places (On the Heavens II 13, 295a29; On Generation and Corruption II 7, 334a5) that Empedocles was committed to such a second cosmogony. But he says Empedocles shied away from holding to such a cosmogony because it is not reasonable to posit a cosmos coming to be from elements already separated—as though cosmogony can only happen through the separation of elements out of a previously blended condition of them all (On the Heavens, III 2, 301a14).

Such issues lend weight to a second strain of interpretation (see Long 1974, Bollack 1965–1969). Such interpretations still read the fundamental principle of B 17 as referring to alternating periods of domination by Love and Strife. However, they hold that there is only one cosmogony and zoogony. In the vortex, Strife dominates in order to separate the elements into their respective places to form a cosmos. As described above, this would be a condition in which some portions of each of the other elements are found intermingled within the separate masses of earth, water, air and fire. This is the extreme point in the domination of Strife; but it is not, as on the traditional interpretation, a total, acosmic separation of elements. Once the cosmos is formed (consisting of a world-order with continental land-masses, oceans, rivers, winds, sun, moon, seasons, planets, stars, etc.), Love begins to assert her influence. From the mixture of elements in due proportions, there arise various forms of animal life. Ultimately, both animals and cosmos perish as Love totally reunifies the elements. Thus, finally, the Sphere is restored. On this interpretation there is a single cosmogony and zoogony, not two as on the traditional interpretations. The idea of a single cosmogony and zoogony is attractive, in part, because it echoes other Presocratic philosophers.

So far we have concentrated on Empedocles' account of the coming to be of the cosmos. But in his zoogony, Empedocles also wrote about animals and how they came to be. It is clear that he associated zoogony with the influence of both Love and Strife. We can distinguish two sets of fragments that tell of the way that living beings come to be. The first set tells about fantastic events and creatures; the second about natural-sounding events and creatures.

Let us start with the fantastic. Empedocles says that there was a time when separate limbs wandered around on their own:

Here sprang up many faces without necks, arms wandered without shoulders, unattached, and eyes strayed alone, in need of foreheads (B 57).

The wandering and straying suggest aimless and disorderly movements (and so, some influence of Strife). Then, however, these separate limbs combined in random ways to make fantastic creatures:

Many creatures were born with faces and breasts on both sides, man-faced ox-progeny, while others again sprang forth as ox-headed offspring of man, creatures compounded partly of male, partly of the nature of female, and fitted with shadowy parts. (B 61)

In these fragments there is a change from separateness to combination. Combination is, of course, the work of Love. While these creatures are fantastic, Aristotle does say some of the combinations were fitted to survive (Aristotle, Phys. II 8, 198b29).

In the second set of fragments we find an explanation of the way that present day creatures come to be.

Come now, hear how fire as it was separated raised up the nocturnal shoots of men and pitiable women: it is no erring nor ignorant tale. Whole-nature shapes first sprang up from the earth, having a portion of both water and heat. These fire sent up, wishing to come to its like: they did not yet display the desirable form of limbs nor voice, which is the part proper to men. (B 62)

This phase produces the earliest human forms, although they have yet to show clearly human features. Ultimately, from these there developed men and women as we know them today (B 63–65). At this point, sexual reproduction becomes the focus of Empedocles' account. Still, this phase begins with separation of elements, as the first lines of the fragment show, and so it involves some influence of Strife.

In the traditional interpretations, there are two zoogonies, one under the increasingly dominant influence of Love and the other under the dominant influence of Strife. By contrast, in the second strain of interpretation, there is only one zoogony, which takes place under the increasing influence of Love, although Strife is still present. Thus, there are not two zoogonies happening in distinct cosmic cycles; rather there are fluctuations of Love and Strife within the progress from total domination by Strife to that by Love. However, some commentators argue that new material in the Strasbourg papyrus lends weight to the traditional interpretation. For instance, Trépanier (2003) argues that ensemble d (see Martin and Primavesi 1999, 144–149) strengthens previous evidence for a kind of zoogony, taking place under the influence of Strife, which is fully distinct from the kind of zoogony under the influence of Love. In turn, distinct zoogonies imply distinct cosmogonies.

However, the double zoogony implies that animals or their parts will come to be through a process of separation. Since zoogony under Love is shown to be a kind of assembly of parts that leads to viable creatures, by parity of reasoning, zoogony under Strife should be a sundering of wholes that leads to viable creatures or to the sort of parts that are condemned to further disintegration. The task, then, for the traditionalists is to find passages in the manuscript that clearly show a sundering that produces viable creatures or parts thereof. In turn, the sundering must clearly belong to a stage in which Strife is not just dominant—after all, their opponents recognize a fluctuation in the influence of Love and Strife—but is achieving complete separation. While the traditionalists have presented passages from the manuscript that they claim to be such evidence, the claims have not gone unchallenged (Balaudé 2010 and Laks 2001). At this point in the continuing scholarly debate perhaps it is not too bold to say that the new material presents some—not uncontested—evidence for a double zoogony.

The question of the sequence of these stages is, perhaps, not as important as the fact that, on any view, Empedocles is proposing a way of explaining living beings by competing principles of Love and Strife. While each of the four roots has its particular quality, these qualities alone are not enough to explain how a cosmos, and its creatures, come to be. Besides the interaction of fire, air, earth, and water, there must be other forces at work in order to have the world we live in. Thus, the four roots, with their particular qualities, are not so naturally antagonistic as to defy combination but are capable both of repelling one another and of coming together. On the one hand, a lot of our world is the effect of disintegration because the roots prove to be antagonistic due to Strife; on the other, they also come together by harmonizing their particular qualities due to Love. When harmony is a creative force, how Love achieves combination comes to the fore. The explanation of harmonizing achieves an important depth in the idea of a proportional mixture of elements. Empedocles says that flesh and blood are composed of approximately equal parts of earth, fire, water, and aither (B 98). Another proportion of elements produces bone (B 96). Thus, a proper balance harmonizes the roots and banishes antagonism. However we read the cycles of Love and Strife, then, this harmony of potentially opposing roots is only a phase. In the sphere of Love, the proportion that produces the variety of creatures gives way to a homogenizing blend of the roots.

These fragments seem related to ancient medicine, with its theory of the proper mixture of hot and cold, dry and wet as constituting the healthy condition of the body. (Recall that we are told that Empedocles was a physician as well as a philosopher and poet.) However, the extant fragments do not show any detailed connection with medical explanations. The equal proportion in the mixture of blood does seem related to another kind of explanation. Blood has a central role to play in Empedocles' account of biological processes, to which we now turn; among other things, it is that whereby men think (B 105). It appears that the equal mixture allows discrimination of all things (since, of course, all things are made up of the four elements in differing proportions).

Since Empedocles seems not to have distinguished thinking from perception, it would be best to begin with the latter. First of all, Empedocles holds that perception is based on the principle of “like by like.”

For with earth do we see earth, with water water, with air bright air, with fire consuming fire, with Love do we see Love, Strife with dread Strife. (B 109)

Since roots and principles in the perceiver are related to the roots and principles in the perceived object, the passage suggests that elements in one correspond to elements in the other. This passage, of course, does not make immediately clear how this correspondence results in the perception of color and shape. In any event, using the basic idea of “like by like,” he refines his account of perception to include the idea of “effluences.” Everything gives off effluences (B 89). These are tiny particles that flow out from objects conintually. One then can grasp one half of the correspondence; effluences from the perceived object flow to the perceiver, in particular to the perceptual organ. Then, effluences of fire would make contact with the fire in the eye. On this basis, since fire, e.g., is white, one can construct an account of the way that fire—and other roots—are responsible for color perception. However, these sorts of explanations do not encompass the perception of Love and Strife, which seems to depend on deduction (B 17)

However, Empedocles' account of perception is more complex still. While one stream of effluences goes from the object of perception to the organ, another goes out from the perceiving organ itself. Empedocles compares the eye to a lantern (B 84). In the lantern, the flame is shielded by a linen screen, but the light still goes through the linen. So the eye has a membrane through which the flame within the eye goes out. This account of the eye refers to another important Empedoclean idea; the surface of the eye has passages through which the effluent fire goes out. Effluences go in the other direction, as well, from the objects. In a well-known passage of Plato's Meno where Socrates is supposed to be giving Empedocles' theory of perception, they come from the object of perception to the organ of perception. In this account there is also a way to distinguish the different kinds of perception. Different sized effluences from the object fit similarly shaped openings or pores in the different organs. Then colors are effluences from objects fitted to the pores of the eye (Meno 76c). So, perception of color is based on a correspondence between the shape of the pores in the eye and the shape of the particles that flow from the perceived object.

2. Purifications

Purifications has a style markedly different from that of On Nature. While the latter, for the most part, concerns the origins and workings of natural phenomena, the former is the autobiography of a divine being. In the opening lines, the narrator of the poem, who is presumably Empedocles, describes himself as a god, received as such by the cities to which he travels. To them he dispenses advice, prophecies, and cures (B 112). This god is actually a spirit—a daimôn—who has been exiled from the blessed life of the other spirits by breaking an oath and shedding blood (by killing and eating animals: see below). He wanders throughout the natural world, rejected by the very elements, because he put his trust in raving Strife (B 115). Exiled daemons are reincarnated into all sorts of living forms, finally coming to be as prophets, poets, physicians, and leaders among men. (Empedocles was a poet, and we recall that ancient evidence indicated he was also a physician and political leader, and a prophet too.) At last they arise as gods; and, finally released from exile, they then enjoy a blessed life (B 146 and 147). Presumably, the narrator himself is at this stage in his exile. Since it is the key event in the life of a daemon, we need to know why shedding blood is so important and how it is related to putting trust in Strife. Empedocles describes (B 128) what sounds like a golden age in which the reigning divinity was Aphrodite, the goddess of love and sex, not Ares, god of war, nor Zeus, nor Kronos, nor Poseidon. Presumably we are to think of Aphrodite as ruling over beings joined by love, whereas the rest, like Ares, are associated with war and strife. What is most notable about those who lived in this era is that they did not pollute themselves with bloody sacrifice (B 128). In fact, both animals and men lived together in friendship (B 130). This era is normative for all of existence (B 135). Mortals are warned in the strongest possible terms to abstain from bloodshed and the eating of flesh. These two are connected in the practice of bloody sacrifice because those attending the sacrifice ate the flesh of sacrificed animals. The chief reason given for abstinence from meat is that, since all are reincarnated as various sorts of living beings, killing and eating animals is in reality cannibalism (B 136 and 137). Thus, killing and eating one another is the most extreme form of Strife among humans. The narrator himself, the exiled and wandering daemon, wishes that he had been destroyed before he had done the terrible deed of eating flesh with his lips (B 139).

The relation between On Nature and Purifications is the subject of varied speculations. Once it was thought that the first was a scientific work and the latter a religious one. Since these categories were understood to be antithetical, there could be no relation at all between them; Empedocles had just written two incompatible poems. More recently, as the usefulness of such a rigid dichotomy seemed less plausible, commentators have seen the teaching about nature as continuous with Purifications. Both, after all, give a prominent place to Love and Strife. Nature, then, is ruled by the very same principles that are the key to understanding the drama of the ethical life, as Empedocles represents that. Understanding how nature works, one will want to side with Love and not Strife—especially, one will want to avoid the shedding of blood, that whereby we think and perceive, the very principle of conscious life. However, here too commentators have interpreted passages from the Strasbourg manuscript as showing a tighter unity between what are taken to be two aspects of the same account. For instance, Primavesi claims the daemons' journeying back to a state of purity mirrors the roots returning to the sphere of Love (Primavesi 2005). Such interpretations imply that there are not two poems but one. Nevertheless, the way textual support has been marshalled for these sorts of readings has not gone uncritized (Laks 2002).

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