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Virtue ethics is currently one of three major approaches in normative ethics. It may, initially, be identified as the one that emphasizes the virtues, or moral character, in contrast to the approach which emphasizes duties or rules (deontology) or that which emphasizes the consequences of actions (consequentialism). Suppose it is obvious that someone in need should be helped. A utilitarian will point to the fact that the consequences of doing so will maximize well-being, a deontologist to the fact that, in doing so the agent will be acting in accordance with a moral rule such as “Do unto others as you would be done by” and a virtue ethicist to the fact that helping the person would be charitable or benevolent.
Three of virtue ethics' central concepts, virtue, practical wisdom and eudaimonia are often misunderstood. Once they are distinguished from related but distinct concepts peculiar to modern philosophy, various objections to virtue ethics can be better assessed.
- 1. Preliminaries
- 2. Virtue, practical wisdom and eudaimonia
- 3. Objections to virtue ethics
- 4. Future directions
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Virtue ethics' founding fathers are Plato and, more particularly Aristotle (its roots in Chinese philosophy are even more ancient) and it persisted as the dominant approach in Western moral philosophy until at least the Enlightenment. It suffered a momentary eclipse during the nineteenth century but re-emerged in the late 1950's in Anglo-American philosophy. It was heralded by Anscombe's famous article “Modern Moral Philosophy” (Anscombe 1958) which crystallized an increasing dissatisfaction with the forms of deontology and utilitarianism then prevailing. Neither of them, at that time, paid attention to a number of topics that had always figured in the virtue ethics' tradition—the virtues themselves, motives and moral character, moral education, moral wisdom or discernment, friendship and family relationships, a deep concept of happiness, the role of the emotions in our moral life and the fundamentally important questions of what sort of person I should be and how we should live.
Its re-emergence had an invigorating effect on the other two approaches, many of whose proponents then began to address these topics in the terms of their favoured theory. (The sole unfortunate consequence of this has been that it is now necessary to distinguish “virtue ethics” (the third approach) from “virtue theory”, a term which is reserved for an account of virtue within one of the other approaches.) Interest in Kant's virtue theory has redirected philosophers' attention to Kant's long neglected Doctrine of Virtue, and utilitarians have developed consequentialist virtue theories (Driver 2001; Hurka 2001. It has also generated virtue ethical readings of philosophers other than Plato and Aristotle, such as Martineau, Hume and Nietzsche, and thereby different forms of virtue ethics have developed (Slote 2001; Swanton 2003, 2011a).
But although modern virtue ethics does not have to take the form known as “neo-Aristotelian”, almost any modern version still shows that its roots are in ancient Greek philosophy by the employment of three concepts derived from it.These are arête (excellence or virtue) phronesis (practical or moral wisdom) and eudaimonia (usually translated as happiness or flourishing). As modern virtue ethics has grown and more people have become familiar with its literature, the understanding of these terms has increased, but it is still the case that readers familiar only with modern philosophy tend to misinterpret them. (See Annas 2011 for a short, luminously clear, but authoritative account of all three.)
A virtue such as honesty or generosity is not just a tendency to do what is honest or generous, nor is it to be helpfully specified as a “desirable” or “morally valuable” character trait. It is, indeed a character trait—that is, a disposition which is well entrenched in its possessor, something that, as we say “goes all the way down”, unlike a habit such as being a tea-drinker—but the disposition in question, far from being a single track disposition to do honest actions, or even honest actions for certain reasons, is multi-track. It is concerned with many other actions as well, with emotions and emotional reactions, choices, values, desires, perceptions, attitudes, interests, expectations and sensibilities. To possess a virtue is to be a certain sort of person with a certain complex mindset. (Hence the extreme recklessness of attributing a virtue on the basis of a single action.)
The most significant aspect of this mindset is the wholehearted acceptance of a certain range of considerations as reasons for action. An honest person cannot be identified simply as one who, for example, practices honest dealing, and does not cheat. If such actions are done merely because the agent thinks that honesty is the best policy, or because they fear being caught out, rather than through recognising “To do otherwise would be dishonest” as the relevant reason, they are not the actions of an honest person. An honest person cannot be identified simply as one who, for example, always tells the truth, nor even as one who always tells the truth because it is the truth, for one can have the virtue of honesty without being tactless or indiscreet. The honest person recognises “That would be a lie” as a strong (though perhaps not overriding) reason for not making certain statements in certain circumstances, and gives due, but not overriding, weight to “That would be the truth” as a reason for making them.
An honest person's reasons and choices with respect to honest and dishonest actions reflect her views about honesty and truth—but of course such views manifest themselves with respect to other actions, and to emotional reactions as well. Valuing honesty as she does, she chooses, where possible to work with honest people, to have honest friends, to bring up her children to be honest. She disapproves of, dislikes, deplores dishonesty, is not amused by certain tales of chicanery, despises or pities those who succeed by dishonest means rather than thinking they have been clever, is unsurprised, or pleased (as appropriate) when honesty triumphs, is shocked or distressed when those near and dear to her do what is dishonest and so on.
Given that a virtue is such a multi-track disposition, it would obviously be reckless to attribute one to an agent on the basis of a single observed action or even a series of similar actions, especially if you don't know the agent's reasons for doing as she did (Sreenivasan 2002). Moreover, to possess, fully, such a disposition is to possess full or perfect virtue, which is rare, and there are a number of ways of falling short of this ideal (Athanassoulis 2000). Possessing a virtue is a matter of degree, for most people who can be truly described as fairly virtuous, and certainly markedly better than those who can be truly described as dishonest, self-centred and greedy, still have their blind spots—little areas where they do not act for the reasons one would expect. So someone honest or kind in most situations, and notably so in demanding ones may nevertheless be trivially tainted by snobbery, inclined to be disingenuous about their forebears and less than kind to strangers with the wrong accent.
Further, it is not easy to get one's emotions in harmony with one's rational recognition of certain reasons for action. I may be honest enough to recognise that I must own up to a mistake because it would be dishonest not to do so without my acceptance being so wholehearted that I can own up easily, with no inner conflict. Following (and adapting) Aristotle, virtue ethicists draw a distinction between full or perfect virtue and “continence”, or strength of will. The fully virtuous do what they should without a struggle against contrary desires; the continent have to control a desire or temptation to do otherwise.
Describing the continent as “falling short” of perfect virtue appears to go against the intuition that there is something particularly admirable about people who manage to act well when it is especially hard for them to do so, but the plausibility of this depends on exactly what “makes it hard” (Foot 1978, 11–14). If it is the circumstances in which the agent acts—say that she is very poor when she sees someone drop a full purse, or that she is in deep grief when someone visits seeking help—then indeed it is particularly admirable of her to restore the purse or give the help when it is hard for her to do so. But if what makes it hard is an imperfection in her character—the temptation to keep what is not hers, or a callous indifference to the suffering of others—then it is not.
Another way in which one can easily fall short of full virtue is through lacking phronesis—moral or practical wisdom.
The concept of a virtue is the concept of something that makes its possessor good: a virtuous person is a morally good, excellent or admirable person who acts and feels well, rightly, as she should. These are commonly accepted truisms. But it is equally common, in relation to particular (putative) examples of virtues to give these truisms up. We may say of someone that he is too generous or honest, generous or honest “to a fault”. It is commonly asserted that someone's compassion might lead them to act wrongly, to tell a lie they should not have told, for example, in their desire to prevent someone else's hurt feelings. It is also said that courage, in a desperado, enables him to do far more wicked things than he would have been able to do if he were timid. So it would appear that generosity, honesty, compassion and courage despite being virtues, are sometimes faults. Someone who is generous, honest, compassionate, and courageous might not be a morally good, admirable person—or, if it is still held to be a truism that they are, then morally good people may be led by what makes them morally good to act wrongly! How have we arrived at such an odd conclusion?
The answer lies in too ready an acceptance of ordinary usage, which permits a fairly wide-ranging application of many of the virtue terms, combined, perhaps, with a modern readiness to suppose that the virtuous agent is motivated by emotion or inclination, not by rational choice. If one thinks of generosity or honesty as the disposition to be moved to action by generous or honest impulses such as the desire to give or to speak the truth, if one thinks of compassion as the disposition to be moved by the sufferings of others and to act on that emotion, if one thinks of courage as merely fearlessness, or the willingness to face danger, then it will indeed seem obvious that these are all dispositions that can lead to their possessor's acting wrongly. But it is also obvious, as soon as it is stated, that these are dispositions that can be possessed by children, and although children thus endowed (bar the “courageous” disposition) would undoubtedly be very nice children, we would not say that they were morally virtuous or admirable people. The ordinary usage, or the reliance on motivation by inclination, gives us what Aristotle calls “natural virtue”—a proto version of full virtue awaiting perfection by phronesis or practical wisdom.
Aristotle makes a number of specific remarks about phronesis that are the subject of much scholarly debate, but the (related) modern concept is best understood by thinking of what the virtuous morally mature adult has that nice children, including nice adolescents, lack. Both the virtuous adult and the nice child have good intentions, but the child is much more prone to mess things up because he is ignorant of what he needs to know in order to do what he intends. A virtuous adult is not, of course, infallible and may also, on occasion, fail to do what she intended to do through lack of knowledge, but only on those occasions on which the lack of knowledge is not culpable ignorance. So, for example, children and adolescents often harm those they intend to benefit either because they do not know how to set about securing the benefit or, more importantly, because their understanding of what is beneficial and harmful is limited and often mistaken. Such ignorance in small children is rarely, if ever culpable, and frequently not in adolescents, but it usually is in adults. Adults are culpable if they mess things up by being thoughtless, insensitive, reckless, impulsive, shortsighted, and by assuming that what suits them will suit everyone instead of taking a more objective viewpoint. They are also, importantly, culpable if their understanding of what is beneficial and harmful is mistaken. It is part of practical wisdom to know how to secure real benefits effectively; those who have practical wisdom will not make the mistake of concealing the hurtful truth from the person who really needs to know it in the belief that they are benefiting him.
Quite generally, given that good intentions are intentions to act well or “do the right thing”, we may say that practical wisdom is the knowledge or understanding that enables its possessor, unlike the nice adolescents, to do just that, in any given situation. The detailed specification of what is involved in such knowledge or understanding has not yet appeared in the literature, but some aspects of it are becoming well known. Even many deontologists now stress the point that their action-guiding rules cannot, reliably, be applied correctly without practical wisdom, because correct application requires situational appreciation—the capacity to recognise, in any particular situation, those features of it that are morally salient. This brings out two aspects of practical wisdom.
One is that it characteristically comes only with experience of life. Amongst the morally relevant features of a situation may be the likely consequences, for the people involved, of a certain action, and this is something that adolescents are notoriously clueless about precisely because they are inexperienced. It is part of practical wisdom to be wise about human beings and human life. (It should go without saying that the virtuous are mindful of the consequences of possible actions. How could they fail to be reckless, thoughtless and short-sighted if they were not?)
The aspect that is more usually stressed regarding situational appreciation is the practically wise agent's capacity to recognise some features of a situation as more important than others, or indeed, in that situation, as the only relevant ones. The wise do not see things in the same way as the nice adolescents who, with their imperfect virtues, still tend to see the personally disadvantageous nature of a certain action as competing in importance with its honesty or benevolence or justice.
These aspects coalesce in the description of the practically wise as those who understand what is truly worthwhile, truly important, and thereby truly advantageous in life, who know, in short, how to live well. In the Aristotelian “eudaimonist” tradition, this is expressed in the claim that they have a true grasp of eudaimonia.
The concept of eudaimonia, a key term in ancient Greek moral philosophy, is central to any modern neo-Aristotelian virtue ethics and usually employed even by virtue ethicists who deliberately divorce themselves from Aristotle. It is standardly translated as “happiness” or “flourishing” and occasionally as “well-being.”
Each translation has its disadvantages. The trouble with “flourishing” is that animals and even plants can flourish but eudaimonia is possibly only for rational beings. The trouble with “happiness”, on any contemporary understanding of it uninfluenced by classically trained writers, is that it connotes something which is subjectively determined. It is for me, not for you, to pronounce on whether I am happy, or on whether my life, as a whole, has been a happy one, for, barring, perhaps, advanced cases of self-deception and the suppression of unconscious misery, if I think I am happy then I am—it is not something I can be wrong about. Contrast my being healthy or flourishing. Here we have no difficulty in recognizing that I might think I was healthy, either physically or psychologically, or think that I was flourishing and just be plain wrong. In this respect, “flourishing” is a better translation than “happiness”. It is all too easy for me to be mistaken about whether my life is eudaimon (the adjective from eudaimonia) not simply because it is easy to deceive oneself, but because it is easy to have a mistaken conception of eudaimonia, or of what it is to live well as a human being, believing it to consist largely in physical pleasure or luxury for example.
The claim that this is, straightforwardly, a mistaken conception, reveals the point that eudaimonia is, avowedly, a moralized, or “value-laden” concept of happiness, something like “true” or “real” happiness or “the sort of happiness worth seeking or having.” It is thereby the sort of concept about which there can be substantial disagreement between people with different views about human life that cannot be resolved by appeal to some external standard on which, despite their different views, the parties to the disagreement concur.
All usual versions of virtue ethics agree that living a life in accordance with virtue is necessary for eudaimonia. This supreme good is not conceived of as an independently defined state or life (made up of, say, a list of non-moral goods that does not include virtuous activity) which possession and exercise of the virtues might be thought to promote. It is, within virtue ethics, already conceived of as something of which virtue is at least partially constitutive. Thereby virtue ethicists claim that a human life devoted to physical pleasure or the acquisition of wealth is not eudaimon, but a wasted life, and also accept that they cannot produce a knock down argument for this claim proceeding from premises that the happy hedonist would acknowledge.
But although all standard versions of virtue ethics insist on that conceptual link between virtue and eudaimonia, further links are matters of dispute and generate different versions. For Aristotle, virtue is necessary but not sufficient—what is also needed are external goods which are a matter of luck. For Plato, and the Stoics, it is both (Annas 1993), and modern versions of virtue ethics disagree further about the link between eudaimonia and what gives a character trait the status of being a virtue. Given the shared virtue ethical premise that “the good life is the virtuous life” we have so far three distinguishable views about what makes a character trait a virtue.
According to eudaimonism, the good life is the eudaimon life, and the virtues are what enable a human being to be eudaimon because the virtues just are those character traits that benefit their possessor in that way, barring bad luck. So there is a link between eudaimonia and what confers virtue status on a character trait. But according to pluralism, there is no such tight link. The good life is the morally meritorious life, the morally meritorious life is one that is responsive to the demands of the world (on a suitably moralized understanding of “the demands of the world” and is thereby the virtuous life because the virtues just are those character traits in virtue of which their possessor is thus responsive (Swanton 2003). And according to naturalism, the good life is the life characteristically lived by someone who is good qua human being, and the virtues enable their possessor to live such a life because the virtues just are those character traits that make their possessor good qua human being (an excellent specimen of her kind) (Foot 2001).
(i) The application problem. In the early days of virtue ethics' revival, the approach was associated with an “anti-codifiability” thesis about ethics, directed against the prevailing pretensions of normative theory. At the time, utilitarians and deontologists commonly (though not universally) held that the task of ethical theory was to come up with a code consisting of universal rules or principles (possibly only one, as in the case of act-utilitarianism) which would have two significant features:
- the rule(s) would amount to a decision procedure for determining what the right action was in any particular case;
- the rule(s) would be stated in such terms that any non-virtuous person could understand and apply it (them) correctly.
Virtue ethicists maintained, contrary to these two claims, that it was quite unrealistic to imagine that there could be such a code (see, in particular, McDowell 1979). The results of attempts to produce and employ such a code, in the heady days of the 1960s and 1970s, when medical and then bioethics boomed and bloomed, tended to support the virtue ethicists' claim. More and more utilitarians and deontologists found themselves agreed on their general rules but on opposite sides of the controversial moral issues in contemporary discussion. It came to be recognised that moral sensitivity, perception,imagination, and judgement informed by experience—phronesis in short—is needed to apply rules or principles correctly. Hence many (though by no means all) utilitarians and deontologists have explicitly abandoned (b) and much less emphasis is placed on (a).
Nevertheless, the complaint that virtue ethics does not produce codifiable principles is still a commonly voiced criticism of the approach, expressed as the objection that it is, in principle, unable to provide action-guidance.
Initially, the objection was based on a misunderstanding. Blinkered by slogans that described virtue ethics as “concerned with Being rather then Doing”, as addressing “What sort of person should I be?” but not “What should I do?” as being “agent-centred rather than act-centred”, its critics maintained that it was unable to provide action-guidance and hence, rather than being a normative rival to utilitarian and deontological ethics, could claim to be no more than a valuable supplement to them. The rather odd idea was that all virtue ethics could offer was “Identify a moral exemplar and do what he would do” as though the raped fifteen year old trying to decide whether or not to have an abortion was supposed to ask herself “Would Socrates have had an abortion if he were in my circumstances?”
But the objection failed to take note of Anscombe's hint that a great deal of specific action guidance could be found in rules employing the virtue and vice terms (“v-rules”) such as “Do what is honest/charitable; do not do what is dishonest/uncharitable” (Hursthouse 1999). (It is a noteworthy feature of our virtue and vice vocabulary that, although our list of generally recognised virtue terms is comparatively short, our list of vice terms is remarkably, and usefully, long, far exceeding anything that anyone who thinks in terms of standard deontological rules has ever come up with. Much invaluable action guidance comes from avoiding courses of action that would be irresponsible, feckless, lazy, inconsiderate, uncooperative, harsh, intolerant, selfish, mercenary, indiscreet, tactless, arrogant, unsympathetic, cold, incautious, unenterprising, pusillanimous, feeble, presumptuous, rude, hypocritical, self-indulgent, materialistic, grasping, short-sighted, vindictive, calculating, ungrateful, grudging, brutal, profligate, disloyal, and on and on.)
Different patterns of conceptual connexion between the concept of right action, and those of virtuous motive, virtuous person/agent, and virtue itself are now widespread in what is still recognizably virtue ethical literature. Some have arisen in response to Johnson's challenging emphasis on the obvious rightness of a non-virtuous agent's attempting self-improvement (Johnson 2003; van Zyl 2009), some in response to the obvious relevance of motive to the moral worth of actions (Slote 2001), some aiming to distinguish action guidance from a theoretical account of what makes actions right (Swanton 2003; Zagzebski 2004). Zagzebski, in particular, regards action guidance as a secondary aim of moral theory; her theory places the moral exemplar centre stage of an abstract structure, but certainly not in the absurd position of the person the fifteen year old is supposed to think about when contemplating abortion. Rather, the other concepts (right act, virtue etc.) are defined in terms of a moral exemplar, and we gain understanding of our moral practices by identifying people we admire and thinking of the definitions in terms of them (Zagzebski 2010).
Insofar as the different versions of virtue ethics all retain an emphasis on the virtues, they are open to the familiar problem of (ii) the charge of cultural relativity. Is it not the case that different cultures embody different virtues, (MacIntyre 1985) and hence that the v-rules will pick out actions as right or wrong only relative to a particular culture? Different replies have been made to this charge. One—the tu quoque, or “partners in crime” response—exhibits a quite familiar pattern in virtue ethicists' defensive strategy (Solomon 1988). They admit that, for them, cultural relativism is a challenge, but point out that it is just as much a problem for the other two approaches. The (putative) cultural variation in character traits regarded as virtues is no greater—indeed markedly less—than the cultural variation in rules of conduct, and different cultures have different ideas about what constitutes happiness or welfare. That cultural relativity should be a problem common to all three approaches is hardly surprising. It is related, after all, to the “justification problem” (see below) the quite general metaethical problem of justifying one's moral beliefs to those who disagree, whether they be moral sceptics, pluralists or from another culture.
A bolder strategy involves claiming that virtue ethics has less difficulty with cultural relativity than the other two approaches. Much cultural disagreement arises, it may be claimed, from local understandings of the virtues, but the virtues themselves are not relative to culture (Nussbaum 1993).
Another objection to which the tu quoque response is partially appropriate is (iii) “the conflict problem.” What does virtue ethics have to say about dilemmas—cases in which, apparently, the requirements of different virtues conflict because they point in opposed directions? Charity prompts me to kill the person who would be better off dead, but justice forbids it. Honesty points to telling the hurtful truth, kindness and compassion to remaining silent or even lying. What shall I do? Of course, the same sorts of dilemmas are generated by conflicts between deontological rules. Deontology and virtue ethics share the conflict problem (and are happy to take it on board rather than follow some of the utilitarians in their consequentialist resolutions of such dilemmas) and in fact their strategies for responding to it are parallel. Both aim to resolve a number of dilemmas by arguing that the conflict is merely apparent; a discriminating understanding of the virtues or rules in question, possessed only by those with practical wisdom, will perceive that, in this particular case, the virtues do not make opposing demands or that one rule outranks another, or has a certain exception clause built into it. Whether this is all there is to it depends on whether there are any irresolvable dilemmas. If there are, proponents of either normative approach may point out reasonably that it could only be a mistake to offer a resolution of what is, ex hypothesi, irresolvable.
Another problem arguably shared by all three approaches is (iv), that of being self-effacing. An ethical theory is self-effacing if, roughly, whatever it claims justifies a particular action, or makes it right, had better not be the agent's motive for doing it. Michael Stocker (1976) originally introduced it as a problem for the other two approaches only. He pointed out that the agent who, rightly, visits a friend in hospital will rather lessen the impact of his visit on her if he tells her either that he is doing it because it is his duty or because he thought it would maximize the general happiness. However, as has been argued (Keller 2007), she won't be any better pleased if he tells her that he is visiting her because it is what a virtuous agent would do, so virtue ethics has the problem too. Its defenders are currently arguing that, at the very least, virtue ethics is not seriously undermined by the problem, and are exploring different forms of self-effacingness (Martinez 2011; Pettigrove 2011).
Another problem for virtue ethics, which is shared by both utilitarianism and deontology, is (v) “the justification problem.” Abstractly conceived, this is the problem of how we justify or ground our ethical beliefs, an issue that is hotly debated at the level of metaethics. In its particular versions, for deontology there is the question of how to justify its claims that certain moral rules are the correct ones, and for utilitarianism of how to justify its claim that the only thing that really matters morally is consequences for happiness or well-being. For virtue ethics, the problem concerns the question of which character traits are the virtues.
In the metaethical debate, there is widespread disagreement about the possibility of providing an external foundation for ethics—“external” in the sense of being external to ethical beliefs—and the same disagreement is found amongst deontologists and utilitarians. Some believe that their normative ethics can be placed on a secure basis, resistant to any form of scepticism, such as what anyone rationally desires, or would accept or agree on, regardless of their ethical outlook; others that it cannot.
Virtue ethicists have eschewed any attempt to ground virtue ethics in an external foundation while continuing to maintain that their claims can be validated. Some follow a form of Rawls' coherentist approach (Slote 2001; Swanton 2003); neo-Aristotelians a form of ethical naturalism.
A misunderstanding of eudaimonia as an unmoralized concept leads some critics to suppose that the neo-Aristotelians are attempting to ground their claims in a scientific account of human nature and what counts, for a human being, as flourishing. Others assume that, if this is not what they are doing, they cannot be validating their claims that, for example, justice, charity, courage, and generosity are virtues. Either they are illegitimately helping themselves to Aristotle's discredited natural teleology (Williams 1985) or producing mere rationalizations of their own personal or culturally inculcated values. But McDowell, Foot, MacIntyre and Hursthouse have all outlined versions of a third way between these two extremes. Eudaimonia in virtue ethics, is indeed a moralized concept, but it is not only that. Claims about what constitutes flourishing for human beings no more float free of scientific facts about what human beings are like than ethological claims about what constitutes flourishing for elephants. In both cases, the truth of the claims depends in part on what kind of animal they are and what capacities, desires and interests the humans or elephants have.
The best available science today (including evolutionary theory and psychology) supports rather than undermines the ancient Greek assumption that we are social animals, like elephants and wolves and unlike polar bears. No rationalizing explanation in terms of anything like a social contract is needed to explain why we choose to live together, subjugating our egoistical desires in order to secure the advantages of co-operation. Like other social animals, our natural impulses are not solely directed towards our own pleasures and preservation, but include altruistic and cooperative ones.
This basic fact about us should make more comprehensible the claim that the virtues are at least partially constitutive of human flourishing and also undercut the objection that virtue ethics is, in some sense, egoistic.
(vi) The egoism objection has a number of sources. One is a simple confusion. Once it is understood that the fully virtuous agent characteristically does what she should without inner conflict, it is triumphantly asserted that “she is only doing what she wants to do and is hence being selfish.” So when the generous person gives gladly, as the generous are wont to do, it turns out she is not generous and unselfish after all, or at least not as generous as the one who greedily wants to hang on to everything she has but forces herself to give because she thinks she should! A related version ascribes bizarre reasons to the virtuous agent, unjustifiably assuming that she acts as she does because she believes that acting thus on this occasion will help her to achieve eudaimonia. But “the virtuous agent” is just “the agent with the virtues” and it is part of our ordinary understanding of the virtue terms that each carries with it its own typical range of reasons for acting. The virtuous agent acts as she does because she believes that someone's suffering will be averted, or someone benefited, or the truth established, or a debt repaid, or ... thereby.
It is the exercise of the virtues during one's life that is held to be at least partially constitutive of eudaimonia, and this is consistent with recognising that bad luck may land the virtuous agent in circumstances that require her to give up her life. Given the sorts of considerations that courageous, honest, loyal, charitable people wholeheartedly recognise as reasons for action, they may find themselves compelled to face danger for a worthwhile end, to speak out in someone's defence, or refuse to reveal the names of their comrades, even when they know that this will inevitably lead to their execution, to share their last crust and face starvation. On the view that the exercise of the virtues is necessary but not sufficient for eudaimonia, such cases are described as those in which the virtuous agent sees that, as things have unfortunately turned out, eudaimonia is not possible for them (Foot 2001, 95). On the Stoical view that it is both necessary and sufficient, a eudaimon life is a life that has been successfully lived (where “success” of course is not to be understood in a materialistic way) and such people die knowing not only that they have made a success of their lives but that they have also brought their lives to a markedly successful completion. Either way, such heroic acts can hardly be regarded as egoistic.
A lingering suggestion of egoism may be found in the misconceived distinction between so-called “self-regarding” and “other-regarding” virtues. Those who have been insulated from the ancient tradition tend to regard justice and benevolence as real virtues, which benefit others but not their possessor, and prudence, fortitude and providence (the virtue whose opposite is “improvidence” or being a spendthrift) as not real virtues at all because they benefit only their possessor. This is a mistake on two counts. Firstly, justice and benevolence do, in general, benefit their possessors, since without them eudaimonia is not possible. Secondly, given that we live together, as social animals, the “self-regarding” virtues do benefit others—those who lack them are a great drain on, and sometimes grief to, those who are close to them (as parents with improvident or imprudent adult offspring know only too well).
The most recent objection (vii) to virtue ethics claims that work in “situationist” social psychology shows that there are no such things as character traits and thereby no such things as virtues for virtue ethics to be about (Doris 1998; Harman 1999). But virtue ethicists claim in response that the social psychologists' studies are irrelevant to the multi-track disposition (see above) that a virtue is supposed to be (Sreenivasan 2002). Mindful of just how multi-track it is, they agree that it would be reckless in the extreme to ascribe a demanding virtue such as charity to people of whom they know no more than that they have exhibited conventional decency; this would indeed be “a fundamental attribution error.” There have been other responses as well (summarized helpfully in Prinz 2009), notably that of Adams, echoing Merritt (Merritt 2000; Adams 2006). Adams steers a middle road between “no character traits at all” and the exacting standard of the Aristotelian conception of virtue which, because of its emphasis on phronesis, requires a high level of character integration. On his conception, character traits may be “frail and fragmentary” but still virtues, and not uncommon. But giving up the idea that practical wisdom is the heart of all the virtues, as Adams has to do, is a substantial sacrifice, as Kamtekar (2010) argues.
Even though the “situationist challenge” has left traditional virtue ethicists unmoved, it has generated a healthy engagement with empirical psychological literature amongst them (Russell 2009 Part III; Annas 2011), which has also been fuelled by the growing literature on Foot's Natural Goodness and, quite independently, an upsurge of interest in character education (see below).
As noted under “Preliminaries” above, a few non-Aristotelian forms of virtue ethics have developed. The most radical departure from the ancient Greek tradition is found in Michael Slote's ‘agent-based’ approach (Slote 2001) inspired by Hutcheson, Hume, Martineau and the feminist ethics of care. Slote's version of virtue ethics is agent-based (as opposed to more Aristotelian forms which are said to be agent-focused) in the sense that the moral rightness of acts is based on the virtuous motives or characters of the agent. However, the extent of the departure has been exaggerated. Although Slote discusses well-being rather than eudaimonia, and maintains that this consists in certain “objective” goods, he argues that virtuous motives are not only necessary but also sufficient for well-being. And although he usually discusses (virtuous) motives rather than virtues, it is clear that his motives are not transitory inner states but admirable states of character, such as compassion, benevolence and caring. Moreover, although he makes no mention of practical wisdom, such states of character are not admirable, not virtuous motives, unless they take the world into account and are ‘balanced’, in (we must suppose) a wise way. The growing interest in ancient Chinese ethics currently tends to emphasise its common ground with the ancient Greek tradition but, as it gains strength, it may well introduce a more radical departure.
Although virtue ethics has grown remarkably in the last thirty years,it is still very much in the minority, particularly in the area of applied ethics. Many editors of big textbook collections on “bioethics”, or “moral problems” or “biomedical ethics” now try to include articles representative of each of the three normative approaches but are often unable to find any virtue ethics article addressing a particular issue. This is sometimes, no doubt, because “the” issue has been set up as a deontologicial/utilitarian debate, but it is often simply because no virtue ethicist has yet written on the topic. However, the last few years have seen the first collection on applied virtue ethics (Walker and Ivanhoe 2007) and increasing attention to the virtues in role ethics.This area can certainly be expected to grow in the future, and it looks as though applying virtue ethics in the field of environmental ethics may prove particularly fruitful (Sandler 2007; Hursthouse 2007, 2011).
Whether virtue ethics can be expected to grow into “virtue politics”—i.e. to extend from moral philosophy into political philosophy—is not so clear. Although Plato and Aristotle can be great inspirations as far as the former is concerned, neither, on the face of it, are attractive sources of insight where politics is concerned. However, Nussbaum's most recent work (Nussbaum 2006) suggests that Aristotelian ideas can, after all, generate a satisfyingly liberal political philosophy. Moreover, as noted above, virtue ethics does not have to be neo-Aristotelian. It may be that the virtue ethics of Hutcheson and Hume can be naturally extended into a modern political philosophy (Hursthouse 1990–91; Slote 1993).
Following Plato and Aristotle, modern virtue ethics has always emphasised the importance of moral education, not as the inculcation of rules but as the training of character. In 1982, Carol Gilligan wrote an influential attack (In a Different Voice) on the Kantian-inspired theory of educational psychologist Lawrence Kohlberg. Though primarily intended to criticize Kohlberg's approach as exclusively masculinist, Gilligan's book unwittingly raised many points and issues that are reflected in virtue ethics. Probably Gilligan has been more effective than the academic debates of moral philosophers, but one way or another, there is now a growing movement towards virtues education, amongst both academics (Carr 1999) and teachers in the classroom.
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- Literature on Aristotle and Virtue Ethics, Ethics Updates, Larry Hinman, U. San Diego.
- Bibliography on Virtue Ethics (in PDF, listed alphabetically), and Bibliography on Virtue Ethics (in PDF, listed chronologically), by Jörg Schroth.
Parts of the introductory material above repeat what I said in the Introduction and first chapter of On Virtue Ethics, Oxford University Press, 1999.