Notes to Existentialism

1. Some (e.g., MacIntyre 1967:153) have found this interest in producing a systematic account of existence incompatible with the basic tenor of existentialism, which is supposed to be anti-rational, anti-intellectual, a matter of passion, feeling, and literary rhetoric. But while Kierkegaard and Nietzsche did attack the complacent academic philosophy of their time, the latter, at least, offered positive views of his own. And while later existentialists did call into question the exclusive right of logical argumentation in philosophical method, championing phenomenological description as equally necessary, it is far too simplistic to identify the essence of existentialism with these elements of protest and to reduce its characteristic theses to the short-sightedness of “a dissappointed rationalism” (MacIntyre 1967:152).

2. Husserl developed the phenomenological method by means of an eidetic reduction—in which the philosopher was to reflect not on some particular intentional experience (such as perception) but the “essence” or universal structure exhibited by it—and by means of an epoché, or bracketing of the reality of the world in order to study its pure (and, Husserl claimed, immanent) givenness as a correlate of consciousness. To various degrees, the existentialists rejected these aspects of Husserl's method, and the doctrine of the transcendental ego associated with them (see Cooper 1999:46-54; Zaner and Ihde 1973:11-26), holding that they undermined the true significance of the discovery of intentionality. As Merleau-Ponty (1962:xiv) famously wrote: “The most important lesson which the reduction teaches us is the impossibility of a complete reduction.” The relation between transcendental and existential phenomenology is, however, quite complex and remains in dispute. See, for a variety of views, Cooper (1999), Spiegelberg (1984:436-40), Dreyfus and Haugeland (1978:222-38), Crowell (2001), Natanson (1968).

3. In fact, many of Kierkegaard's works were not written under his own name but as authored by a series of personae, or pseudonyms, which makes the attribution of particular views in his texts to “Kierkegaard” problematic. Indeed, this strategy of “indirect communication” was tied to the existential themes that Kierkegaard sought to highlight in his dialectical writings, but we shall ignore these complications here. For a good discussion of Kierkegaard's pseudonymous authorship, see Hannay (1982).

4. Sartre's slogan derives from a sentence in Heidegger's Being and Time: “Das ‘Wesen’ des Daseins liegt in seiner Existenz,” which Macquarrie and Robinson translate, “The ‘essence’ of Dasein lies in its existence” (Heidegger 1962:67). In 1946 Heidegger maintained that Sartre had totally misunderstood the meaning of the claim (Heidegger 1998:250), but certainly some of what Sartre develops from it can be found in Heidegger too. For the latter, the question of existence is not first of all a philosophical one but rather the question raised by any human being: “Who am I?” The fact that we raise such a question is not, for Heidegger, an accidental feature of our psychology but a essential feature of our being: I am such that “in [my] very being that being is an issue for [me]” (Heidegger 1962:32). A philosophical inquiry into existence, then, is a kind of meta-inquiry into “that which one inquires into when one asks the question ‘Who?’” (Heidegger 1962:79). This, in turn, leads him to distinguish sharply between “categories” and “existentialia”—i.e., between the philosophical concepts used to characterize entities that answer to a “what” question and those that answer to a “who” question: “Existentialia and categories are the two basic possibilities for characters of being. The entities which correspond to them require different kinds of primary interrogation respectively: any entity is either a ‘who’ (existence) or a ‘what’ …” (Heidegger 1962:71).

5. Heidegger himself is quite clear on the point that at a certain formal level he is presenting a theory of the “essential structures” that pertain to existence (Dasein): By means of phenomenological inquiry “there are certain structures which we shall exhibit—not just any accidental structures, but essential ones which, in every kind of being that factical Dasein may possess, persist as determinative for the character of its being” (Heidegger 1962:38). Such an aim—which could also be found in every existential philosopher who draws upon the resources of phenomenology—belongs to the very character of philosophy as a reflective and general inquiry. But the search for “essential structures” in this sense does not undermine the distinction between the “what” and the “who,” and thus the character of these essential structures will have to be understood differently in each case. As Heidegger puts it: “Accordingly, those characteristics which can be exhibited in this entity are not ‘properties' present-at-hand of some entity which ‘looks' so and so and is itself present-at-hand; they are in each case possible ways for it to be, and no more than that” (Heidegger 1962:67).

6. The fact that the category—natural, social, etc.—to which these features belong can be disputed is irrelevant; indeed, even what these features are is not decisive, since “facticity” as such is simply whatever aspect of my being lies beyond the scope of my freedom: the given. It is for the empirical sciences, not existential philosophy, to say what these features are, and such empirical work will always remain a matter of dispute. For instance, are “race” and “belief” really concepts that capture some given aspect of myself? This does not mean, however, that existential philosophers have not tried to offer more robust theories of facticity—for instance, Sartre's appropriation of Marx's emphasis on economic categories, or Merleau-Ponty's attempt to develop an ontology of “flesh.”

7. Heidegger (1962:85) diagnoses the reason for our tendency to think this way in his notion of “falling”: our practical absorption in the world leads to a kind of self-forgetfulness in which we think of ourselves in terms of what we have most to do with, namely, in terms of things. “Dasein…gets its ontological understanding of itself in the first instance from those entities which it itself is not but which it encounters ‘within’ its world, and from the being which they possess.”

8. It should be noted that some existentialists, such as Jaspers, use the term “transcendence” in a different sense, to refer to the “Encompassing,” the whole that lies beyond the ordinary, the mundane, and the reach of empirical science. For Jaspers (1968:60-61), this leads to a strongly normative use of the term Existenz as “the Encompassing, not in the sense of the vastness of a horizon of all horizons, but rather in the sense of a fundamental origin, the condition of selfhood without which all the vastness of being becomes a desert.” As Jaspers uses the term, Existenz corresponds most closely to what existential philosophers typically call authentic existence, while what they refer to as “inauthentic existence” does not count as Existenz at all for Jaspers. On authentic existence, see below.

9. This irreducible duality in the self makes possible what Sartre (1992:86-116) calls “bad faith,” a kind of project of self-deception. In order to produce excuses bad faith first takes a third-person stance toward itself, identifying itself entirely with facticity. When it becomes necessary to elude what it has made of itself, however, it then adopts the first-person agent's perspective, identifying itself entirely with transcendence, where all is “possibility.” In neither case can the deception fully succeed—it is a “metastable” structure that will inevitably collapse into anguish. But as Sartre points out, without these two facets of existence—i.e., if consciousness was the simple “I think” that the tradition took it to be—it would be impossible to explain how the very project of self-deception could be entertained.

10. Sartre (1992:90-94) argues that the Freudian theory of the unconscious is based on an incoherent view of consciousness, but he embraces the project of psychoanalysis as an uncovering of the “fundamental project” of an individual's life. For a brief example of how this works, see his Baudelaire. In general, it is at this point that existentialism makes contact with the tradition of hermeneutics and the Verstehen tradition in the human sciences. This becomes especially explicit in Sartre's later elaboration of his “progressive-regressive method” in Search for a Method. (See especially Sartre 1968:132-162). See also Ludwig Binswanger's concept of “Dasein-analysis” as a method in psychoanalysis, and, finally, the hermeneutic reading of Freud offered by Paul Ricoeur in his Freud and Philosophy.

11. In Fear and Trembling Kierkegaard made a similar point when he argued that Abraham had to remain “silent” about his act—not in order to spare Sarah's or Isaac's feelings (indeed, ethically, according to Kierkegaard, he was required to speak), but because he could not say anything intelligible. His “act” was singular, not part of a practice that could ever be made public, and hence could not, strictly speaking, be understood, even as a “deviation” from normal ethical behavior.

12. On the other hand, to the extent that character is seen as an unreflective source of my behavior, it will always be in tension with the idea of authenticity. In general, the relation between authenticity and a theory of the virtues is important and under-studied. Can one, for instance, be inauthentically courageous? Can I engage in “courageous” acts in the right circumstances, for the right reasons, and so on, and still do them “as one does”—that is, without drawing these behaviors back to my first-person choice of myself in the world, a commitment to being a courageous person?

13. Sartre (1992) adds a characteristic twist to this idea: the dual structure of human existence (facticity/transcendence) brings with it, formally, a kind of meta-project of doing justice simultaneously to both sides so that their opposing claims—being such as to have a fixed and stable identity while also being such as to be free—are united authentically in one being. Such a being, says Sartre, is what we imagine God to be. But what authenticity (self-transparency) reveals is the impossibility of such a project ever succeeding. Hence at a basic level all human projects contain an element of futility—man is a “useless passion,” a “failed God,” a “worm” in the heart of being. For Sartre, this amounts to the claim that the idea of God is self-contradictory.

14. Of course, not all philosophers who recognize the distinctive norm of authenticity hold moral values to be groundless. A religious existentialist such as Marcel explicitly denies Sartre's claim that we choose our values; rather “causes have their instrinsic value and, consequently, values are real…I recognize them and then posit my actions in accordance or in contradiction with these values” (Marcel 1968:87). But Marcel's position is not typical, even for religious existentialists. Another frequently disputed question is whether, given that moral values have no ultimate foundation, a definite morality can nevertheless be derived from the norm of authenticity itself. See Cooper (1999:178-84) for an attempt to show that the Sartrean ideal of “commitment” and Marcel's—apparently contrary—ideal of “openness” are in fact complementary aspects of authenticity.

15. As we saw (note 1 above) Alasdair MacIntyre argues that existentialism is just disappointed rationalism and that its hyperbolic rhetoric stems from its failure to abandon various foundationalist assumptions. It is true that existentialism is a form of anti-foundationalism, and the widespread rejection of foundationalist assumptions in contemporary philosophy does remove some of the shock value of existentialist theses. However, it does not do away with the shock value of anxiety itself, and the carefree anti-foundationalist “ironist” must admit, so long as anxiety remains a possibility, that there is a deeper meaning to foundationalism—or a greater sting in its loss—than irony can easily deal with.

16. The technicalities of Sartre's arguments for these points, which ultimately turn on the question of how intentionality can be explained ontologically, cannot concern us here, but see Sartre (1992:3-30), and the entry on Sartre in this Encyclopedia.

17. Heidegger's understanding of the relation between values and freedom has many similarities with Sartre's view, though the differences are not without importance. For a good treatment of these two thinkers see Fell (1979).

18. For these reasons existentialist ethics is often called an ethics of the “situation.” As Mary Warnock (1967:37) writes, Sartre's existentialism suggests that “instead of coming to situations armed with lists or sets of principles, some one of which has got to be put into practice, we must think of each situation afresh, and try to see what, stock descriptions, duties and principles apart, ought to be done for the best. If we are faced with a situation in which we have to make a moral decision, on this view, we must really decide for ourselves what to do, remembering that we could decide anything, and not seeking to evade responsibility by sheltering under the rules, the principles, of what one must do in such a case.” In this connection, existentialism anticipates current interest in the problem of judgment—in particular, interest in the Kantian idea, found in the Critique of Judgment, of a “reflective judgment” that seeks the universal for a given particular rather than merely subsuming a particular under an already given universal or principle.

19. It is a complicated matter to say what the limits of such a “tradition” are. See Guignon (1993) and Crowell (2004) for contrasting views.

Copyright © 2010 by
Steven Crowell <crowell@rice.edu>

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