Intersections Between Analytic and Continental Feminism

First published Tue Dec 23, 2003; substantive revision Wed Aug 1, 2012

Analytic approaches to feminism typically take their starting point from the philosophy of language and from Anglo-American political philosophers, whereas Continental approaches generally look to European theories and theorists. However, the approaches share common concerns. Both worry about essentialist and falsely universalized conceptions of women; both are concerned with issues of justice; and both are interested in the relevance of theories of ego development for feminist concerns.

1. Critique of Essentialism: The Analytic Tradition

Some analytic feminists follow a line of thought developed in connection with the philosophy of race. K. Anthony Appiah (1996) argues that racial ascriptions are problematic whether one adopts an ideational or a referential theory of language. According to an ideational theory, we learn what a word like ‘race’ means when we learn the rules for applying it. The theory supposes that, while different people can possess some different beliefs about race, they share certain criterial beliefs and these serve to define the concept. A strict ideational theory requires that all the criterial beliefs be satisfied in the correct application of the concept. The beliefs, in other words, must be individually necessary and jointly sufficient. Yet, as Appiah insists, there is no set of criterial beliefs that satisfies this condition in the case of race. Suppose the set is comprised by the beliefs (1) that people with very different skin colors are always of different races and (2) that one's race is determined by the race of one's parents. Neither of these beliefs is necessary to a particular racial ascription since (not-1) the so-called black race includes individuals of strikingly different colors and (not-2) one's parents may themselves belong to different so-called races. Nor are the two beliefs sufficient together to define race since they can conflict: one may be of a different color than one's parents even if they themselves are of the same color; and one can be the same color as one's parents although they are defined as belonging to different races.

Suppose we loosen the theory so that race has only to satisfy a good number of our criterial beliefs. In this case, we shall be able to retain the concept of race only by allowing for a vagueness and even confusion in what we mean by it. In order to retain a concept of race despite this problem, Lucius Outlaw (1995) has suggested that we view race as a cluster concept. On this definition, we can divide the elements of race into heritable physical characteristics, shared practices, linked histories and traditions and, finally “a common site of origin which accounts, in significant part, for the shared physical features.” If individuals share these groups of features in “a limited number of patterned combinations,” then what is required for the constitution of a race is “necessarily one feature,” for example, heritable physical characteristics “plus several others,” for example, linked histories and a common site or origin (p. 101, note 29). Yet, suppose, for example, that a South African of mostly Dutch ancestry and a South African of mostly Xhosan ancestry share certain heritable physical characteristics. They are both large, possess curly hair and share certain other morphological features. Further they share a history, although at least some their ancestors hold different places in that history and they share a common origin in the region of South Africa. Are they then members of the same race? Suppose a pinkish individual shares practices, traditions, and a common site of origin with people whose skin is tawny. Is he or she of the same race as they? Even if we can answer these questions, the definition still runs into the problem of conflicting beliefs. Sometimes in applying the term we will give priority to ancestry in spite of color (as in the one-drop rule) and sometimes we will give priority to color in spite of a mixed ancestry.

Similar consequences follow from a referential theory of language. On this view, race is whatever in the world corresponds to or causes our talk of race. But, here, scientists have come up either completely empty handed, with regard to racial genes for example (Appiah 1996, 72–74) or with very little: recent research correlates certain short segments of DNA known as markers with broad geographical groups that sometimes but not always correspond with the groups that count socially as races. Furthermore, the long history of population mixing between people from different continents (for both conquest and other reasons) means that we need to select a necessarily arbitrary date for linking markers with groups; the date currently in use is 1492.

What if we transfer this analysis to questions of sex and/or gender? The distinction between sex and gender was a catalyst for what is called Second Wave Feminism: It situated inequalities between men and women in gender, conceived of as the cultural and historical conventions surrounding women's status, rather than in sex, conceived of as material facts of the body. Most feminists (in both analytic and continental traditions) consider this distinction over-simplified and we can begin to see why those in the analytic tradition do so by noticing difficulties in the definition of sex. On a strict ideational theory, when we speak of different sexes we should have a definitive set of criterial beliefs that define the concept and its application. But what are the beliefs that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for the ascription of sex? State courts have sometimes held that the criterion for belonging to a specific sex is the possession of either XX or XY chromosomes. Thus, courts in Texas (Littleton v. Prange (9 S.W. 3d.223 (1999)) and Kansas (In re Estate of Marshall G. Gardiner (273 Kan. 191 (2002)) denied the validity of marriages between men and male-to-female transsexuals on the grounds that these marriages violate the states’ prohibition against same-sex marriages. Nevertheless, courts in other states and countries have defined sex differently, either in terms of anatomy or as a combination of anatomy and “psychological sex,” by which courts mean the sex one thinks one is. (See M.T v J.t. (140 NJ Super. 77 (1976)) The surgical practice of many hospitals also seems to disagree with the Kansas and Texas courts since they sometimes allow surgeries on infants with intersex conditions that shape their anatomies to accord with standard male and female forms but may not accord with the chromosomal data. (See, for example, Kessler (2000), 27). Indeed, in its 2006 revision of its guidelines, the American Academy of Pediatrics, while recognizing some problems with surgeries on intersexed infants, still cautions that the complexity of creating penises may well justify bringing an XY infant up as a girl. It is unclear, then, which belief about sex is individually necessary. Is it the one that equates sex with chromosomes or the one that equates it with anatomy? Nor are the two criteria sufficient together since they can conflict. To take just one example: individuals with XY chromosomes and a condition called androgen insensitivity syndrome, which makes their bodies insensitive to testosterone have the anatomies of women and, moreover, are often what Natalie Angier calls “mama mia women,” because of their tall stature, large busts, thick hair and luminous complexions. (Angier 2000, 34).

Suppose, then, we turn to gender, defined as a set of culturally and historically influenced behaviors and roles. Here we might claim (1) that people with very different sets of behaviors are of different genders and (2) that one's gender is determined by one's role in the bearing and rearing of children. A strict ideational theory will require beliefs about gender that are individually necessary and jointly sufficient. Yet, neither of the beliefs just stated is individually necessary since (not-1) the so-called feminine gender includes individuals of strikingly different behaviors and (not-2) one's role in bearing and rearing children can be quite complex: one may bear but not raise the children; not bear but raise them, do neither or both. Nor, then, will the ideas be jointly sufficient: one may be socially defined as a woman although one engages in “masculine” behaviors and has no role in the raising of one's children. Similar ambiguities will arise for any set of beliefs thought to be individually necessary and jointly sufficient for gender. Defining women in terms of a set of attitudes toward marriage, careers, and child rearing will inevitably exclude some so-called women while including some so-called men.

Sally Haslanger describes the sort of issues that arise here as commonality and normativity problems (2000, 37). In the first place, they raise the question of what different women are meant to have in common. Not all can or want to bear children; not all share interests. Indeed, intersections between gender, race, class, nationality and so on seem to signal more differences between groups of women than commonalities. The result often leads to the second problem: talk of women as a single group tends falsely to generalize the interests, concerns and characteristics of a specific group of women, namely: white, middle-class women and to make their interests, concerns and characteristics serve as the norm for all women.

Kimberle Crenshaw draws the consequences for issues of violence against women. Both feminists and African-American civil rights groups can overlook the concerns and issues of African-American women. African-American civil rights groups often downplay statistics about domestic violence in African-American neighborhoods because they do not want to feed stereotypes about the violence of African-American men. Likewise, feminists often downplay the statistics because they do not want domestic violence to appear to be simply a minority crime. To this extent, African-American men are the norm for civil rights advocates and white women are the norm for women's rights advocates. Women of color, in turn, simply disappear from view. As Crenshaw explains, this result is dispiriting:

Among the most troubling political consequences of the failure of antiracist and feminist discourses to address the intersections of race and gender is the fact that, to the extent they can forward the interests of “people of color” and “women,” respectively, one analysis often implicitly denies the validity of the other. The failure of feminism to interrogate race means that the resistance strategies of feminism will often replicate and reinforce the subordination of people of color, and the failure of antiracism to interrogate patriarchy means that antiracism will frequently reproduce the subordination of women. (Crenshaw 1991, 1252).

Sex and gender pose difficulties for a referential theory as well. In this instance sex and/or gender is whatever in the world corresponds to or causes our talk of sex and/or gender. Yet, there seems to be no way to get from the biological level of chromosomes, hormones or brain functions to the characteristics we associate with gender. Mama mia women, other intersexuals and transexuals indicate the difficulty in correlating gender with sex chromosomes while feminists such as Anne Fausto-Sterling (2000) have raised problems with correlations between alleged gender roles and hormones or brains. Attempts to correlate ambition or aggressiveness with “male” hormones or math ability with the shape of the corpus callosum fail. Indeed, whatever differences are found or thought to be part of the corpus callosums of men and women seem to turn up in adults and older children, rather than in young children. Hence, it remains unclear how we ought to measure the relative effects of biology and environmental causes. Since we know that the brain continues to develop through a human life, there are at least two alternatives to the claim that differences in the brain cause differences in gender: first, the lived experiences of men and women could help shape their brains and do so in societies already differentiated by gender or, second, brain structure and culturally specific gender differences might interrelate in some as yet unraveled way. In either case, a referential theory of language that claims that we know what a gender is when we know what in the world corresponds to or causes our talk of gender would seem to be in trouble. Not only do we not know what corresponds to or causes or talk of gender; it may well be that our talk of gender causes differences in the world.

Not all analytic feminists agree with all parts of this sort of analysis. Naomi Zack, for one, explicitly rejects the analogy between race and gender:

While there are genes for morphology perceived or judged to be racial, such as hair texture and skin color, there are no chromosomal markers for black race or white race (or any other race) no genes for race per se, and, indeed, nothing which is analogous to XY, XX, or to any of the borderline sexual-type combinations of X and Y, for instances of mixed race. (1997, 37)

Others hold open the possibility of providing a definition of gender that can be sensitive to commonality and normativity problems. Haslanger suggests that although the unity that is meant to encompass women as part of the same definition may be overly generalized or badly characterized, it may nonetheless mark a real unity. Taking what she calls a materialist position, she argues that if gender cannot be defined in terms of intrinsic or psychological characteristics common to members of a particular gender, it can nonetheless be defined “in terms of how one is socially positioned, where this is a function of, e.g., how one is viewed, how one is treated, and how one's life is structured socially, legally, and economically.” On this account, gender categories represent hierarchical relations in which one group maintains a subordinate relation to another and the difference between the two groups is marked by “sexual difference.” Thus:

S is a woman iffdf S is systematically subordinated along some dimension (economic, legal, political, social, etc.) and S is “marked” as a target for this treatment by observed or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a female's biological role in reproduction.


S is a man iffdf S is systematically privileged along some dimension (economic, legal, political, social, etc.) and S is “marked” as a target for this treatment by observed or imagined bodily features presumed to be evidence of a male's biological role in reproduction (Haslanger 2000, 38).

The merit of these definitions, Haslanger thinks, is that they allow for differences in the sorts of subordination different women can suffer in different cultures, historical periods, classes and races at the same time that they allow for the visibility or imagined visibility of sex and gender. If, in contrast, we were to employ difficulties in the category of women to deny any unity in observed or imagined bodily features, it would be unclear how or who might continue feminist struggles against gender oppression. The key, then, according to Haslanger, is to define women in such a way that the definition can be sensitive to differences between women while allowing them to work towards common goals.

2. Critique of Essentialism: The Continental Tradition

Feminists who appeal to the resources of the Continental tradition are also concerned with the status of women as a category and with the related issues that arise from intersections between gender, race, class and so on. The initial point of reference here is Simone de Beauvoir (1953), who famously defined women as the “Other”. De Beauvoir insists that “No group ever sets itself up as the One without setting up the Other against itself…Jews are ‘different’ for the anti-Semite, Negroes are ‘inferior’ for American racists, aborigines are ‘natives’ for colonists, proletarians are the ‘lower class’ for the privileged.” (Beauvoir 1953, xvii) Jews, “Negroes,” aborigines and the proletariat are Other in the sense that the One dominates them and turns them into the Other for extended periods of time. Nevertheless, these groups were not always the “Other” and, moreover, they struggle for a time when they will no longer be “Other.” What distinguishes women, according to Beauvoir is that there is no “before” or “after” to their Otherness. Men are always the One and women are always the Other. As the Other, they live only in relation to the One and have no free human existence or subjectivity on their own. They occupy space in a man's world only as relative and inessential aspects of it.

This account raises two issues. First, as Luce Irigaray (1985) points out, if women are the Other to men they cannot be defined independently of a definition of men. However, if they cannot be independently of men, how are they Other from men? To define women as the Other of men is to articulate their identity within a vocabulary that takes men as its norm. Men provide the standard and women are other than that. Yet, if women can be articulated only within a male-normed language, then language cannot get at their otherness at all. They are always, instead, part of a language system expressing the One. The “exclusion” of women, Irigaray writes, “is internal to an order from which nothing escapes: the order of (man's) discourse. To the objection that this discourse is perhaps not all there is, the response will be that it is women who are ‘not-all’”(Irigaray 1985, 88). Julia Kristeva agrees. “A woman cannot be,” she writes. “It is something which does not even belong in the order of being” (Kristeva 1981, 137).

De Beauvoir's definition also raises a second set of problems—indeed, the very same problems Haslanger defines as those of commonality and normativity. As Elizabeth Spelman (1988, 64) points out, if de Beauvoir thinks that Blacks, aboriginals, Jews, and proletarians are not essentially Other and may conceivably (or eventually) become part of the One, then she appears to have difficulty in assessing the status of black, aboriginal, Jewish or proletarian women. If they are only temporarily Other, then when de Beauvoir describes women as essentially Other, does she simply neglect all women who are not white, middle class women? And, if black, aboriginal, Jewish and proletarian women are essentially Other, then does de Beauvoir simply misspeak when she says that Blacks, aboriginals, Jews and proletarians can conceivably overcome their Otherness? De Beauvoir claims that to “decline to be the Other, to refuse to be party to the deal—this would be for women to renounce all the advantages conferred upon them by their alliance with the superior caste” (De Beauvoir 1953, p. xx). But if the “superior caste” consists primarily of white men, then do black, aboriginal, Jewish and proletarian women have the same alliance with it? Are black, aboriginal, Jewish and proletarian women in de Beauvoir's account meant to be the same as white, middle-class women? Or is de Beauvoir interested only in white, middle class women?

In the face of accounts of women that seem to ignore differences between them, Continental feminists, like analytic feminists, try to rethink their identity. Iris Marion Young (1994), for instance, turns to Jean-Paul Sartre and conceives of women as a series as opposed to a group. For Sartre, a group is a collection of people who consciously undertake a common project together where the project typically is one best taken up by this sort of group (Young 1994, 724). Storming the Bastille is an example. A series is less organized and not at all self-conscious, as exemplified by people waiting for a bus. Such individuals possess a common interest in traveling along a certain route, but they have, or need have, no direct relation to one another. Instead, they are related only indirectly, through a relation to the bus. This series could become a group were individuals within it to start complaining about the length of time they wait for the bus, and they could undertake together some sort of collective protest. Nonetheless, without this move toward collective action, they remain isolated from one another and focused on the bus, which Sartre and Young call a practico-inert reality, rather than on each other.

If women are a series, what is the practico-inert reality on which they are focused? Young looks to a compulsory heterosexuality that forces us to focus on the features of a body connected to sexual reproduction—vaginas and clitorises, for example, rather than belly buttons—and to connect these features to one another as well as to certain other features—largish breasts, for example. Only by linking such physical features, and by excluding others, can we conceive of particular bodies as female ones. Thus conceptualized, the body is one of the practico-inert realities to which individuals relate themselves as women. Other practico-inert realities that position individuals in the gender series include, according to Young, pronouns, verbal and visual representations, clothes, cosmetics, social spaces, and spaces associated with the sexual division of work and other activities. In each case, these realities describe structures or objects to which individuals relate themselves serially, as they relate themselves to a bus. Conceiving of women as a series thus allows for the sense in which they share certain features but in which they can also possess striking differences in their relation to the realities that make them part of that series. Women are “a serial collective defined neither by any common identity nor by a common set of attributes that all individual in the series share” (Young 1994, 737).

Other Continental feminists look to the phenomenological and hermeneutic traditions to resolve the commonality and normativity questions. Linda Alcoff refers to Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Hans-Georg Gadamer to anchor women's identity in embodiment. Bodies and bodily experiences differ for men and women. These differences can stem from cultural practices that promote different ways of moving, siting, standing, running, speaking, and throwing a ball, for instance. Moreover, because of differences in physical strength, men and women also approach the same task differently, using different parts of their bodies to do the same things. Finally, in distinction from men, women's bodily experiences include the “experience of breasts, menses, lactation and pregnancy” (Alcoff 2005, 106). For Alcoff, these differences lead to differences in women's orientations or what, following Gadamer she calls horizons on themselves and their world. Alcoff does not deny that these horizons vary according to the traditions and cultures to which various women belong; nor does she deny that horizons also vary according to intersections with other factors, such as race and class. At the same time, she argues, “The possibility of pregnancy, childbirth, nursing, and in many societies, rape are parts of females' horizons … and they exist there because of the ways we are embodied” (Alcoff 2005, 176). As common embodied points of access to meanings, these horizons reflect a basis for solidarity among women in spite of all of the differences women may have from one another.

Georgia Warnke (2007) also turns to Gadamer to think about women's identity. Identities, she claims, are interpretations of, or ways of understanding, who we and others are. As such they necessarily comply with the conditions of understanding: they are culturally and historically situated, motivated by particular concerns and interests and inevitably partial. Identifying ourselves or others as women is thus neither acontextual nor always plausible. Rather as an identity, it is more or less intelligible depending upon the context in which it appears. This analysis allows for the way people can be understood as women in particular contexts without requiring their identities or commonalities to extend beyond them.

3. Possibilities for Social Justice: The Continental Tradition

In reflecting on questions of justice, Continental feminists are primarily concerned with power. Judith Butler (1990) begins her analysis by returning to Irigaray and Kristeva's criticism of de Beauvoir and arguing that their insights into the closed nature of a gendered linguistic system raise issues about a substance-accident metaphysics as a whole. According to this metaphysics, both sex and gender are meant to be accidental attributes attached to a substantial subject. One is essentially a subject and only accidentally a male or female, masculine or feminine one. Yet, if women can be defined only in terms of men, as the Other of men, then sex and gender are not as much accidents as they are relations—not attributes a subject possesses but oppositions between linguistic terms: male versus female and masculine versus feminine. Furthermore, if sex and gender are not attributes, perhaps we should rethink the subject or substance to which they are meant to attach. Perhaps there is only language which, in articulating a relation between male and female, masculine and feminine, posits a substance on which to erect those terms. Butler quotes Michel Haar's commentary on Nietzsche:

All psychological categories (the ego, the individual, the person) derive from the illusion of substantial identity. But this illusion goes back basically to a superstition that deceives not only common sense but also philosophers — namely, the belief in language and, more precisely, in the truth of grammatical categories.

In other words, language inspires us to add substantial identities to actions because verbs need subjects. Turning from Nietzsche to J.L. Austin, Butler (1988) conceives of women (and men) as “performatives.” Performative speech acts for Austin are utterances such as “the meeting is now open” or “I now pronounce you husband and wife” in which, uttered under appropriate circumstances, the speech act does something by saying something. The speech act thus brings a state of affairs into existence. Likewise, according to Butler, the language of sex and gender, appropriately institutionalized, creates men and women.

What is meant by “appropriately institutionalized.” Here Butler and others turn to Michel Foucault's analysis of power. For Foucault (1978,1990) the most important site of power does not lie in the state or economy but, instead, in everyday social practices such as social work, medicine and psychiatry, in scientific and social scientific disciplines that type individuals and create categories of identity, and in institutions such as prisons, schools and hospitals. Such power is productive: social institutions and practices create modern identities such as homosexuals, “blacks,” and manic-depressives. Thus, Foucault famously argues that homosexuals are the result of the Victorian age, in particular, of the power of legal, medical and psychiatric authorities. Before 1870, he argues, acts of sodomy possessed no special distinction. What mattered about any sexual practice was whether it occurred inside or outside of marriage. In the course of the 19th century, however, sodomy between men became the subject of psychological histories, legal discipline and moral character. The act of sodomy was no longer simply an act but the disclosure of identity. As Foucault writes, “The nineteenth-century homosexual became a personage. Nothing that went into his total composition was unaffected by his sexuality” (1978, 1990 43).

For Butler and others, the construction of men and women takes a similar path, as the result of compulsory heterosexuality. As a form of power, compulsory heterosexuality imposes a set of norms about how and whom we should desire and establishes a set of sanctions from this set. By doing so, it divides human populations into two genders that are in turn supposed to be connected to two sexes with two directions of sexual desire. Thus, one is a man with a male body and a desire for women or one is a woman with a female body and a desire for men. No other match-ups constitute intelligible identities. “The heterosexualization of desire,” Butler writes, “requires and institutes the production of discrete and asymmetrical oppositions between ‘feminine’ and ‘masculine,’ where these are understood as expressive attributes of ‘male’ and ‘female’” (1990, 17).

Feminists who take this sort Foucaultian approach to questions of power and inequality are obviously skeptical of our capacities for critical agency and rational reflection to which Marxists and other social critics have traditionally appealed for a purchase on relations of power and subordination. If the subject, as a homosexual or woman for example, is an effect of power, the structure of oppression is already built into the identity. How can women or homosexuals be agents for the emancipation of, or equal justice for, women or homosexuals if their identity is itself an effect of unequal power relations? Indeed, if we become subjects at all only within everyday disciplinary practices, then subjects are always already effects of power. To emancipate ourselves from power would be to emancipate ourselves from ourselves. How then do feminists in this tradition consider issues of power, justice and equality?

Some turn to geneology. Joan Wallach Scott (1988), for example, looks at the way a dispute in the French garment trades in the 1840s constructs women in terms of unskilled work and the home. At the time, increasing numbers of garments were being sold as ready-to-wear clothes. These could be cut and sewn in standard sizes and therefore made at a lower cost to the employer outside of a custom tailoring shop and at home. While employers sought to move ever more work to domestic settings, tailors agitated for laws that would require all garment work to be done in shops. To support their position, they emphasized the artisan tradition of tailoring and contrasted it to mere seamstressing. Tailors were skilled professionals while seamstresses were unskilled. Seamstressing was done at home in between or after domestic duties. Tailoring was done in shops. Tailors were men; seamstresses were women. Through these associations, skilled work and out-of-the-home professionalism became masculine while unskilled and home-based work became feminine.

For her part, Butler looks to resignification. Power not only produces but reproduces itself and this constant production and reproduction serves as the opening for “resignification, redeployment, subversive citation from within, and interruption and inadvertent convergences with other [power/discourse] networks” (1995, 135).

Other Continental feminists are less certain about this approach. Seyla Benhabib (1995 20), for one, distinguishes between a stronger and a weaker version of the claim that identities such as women and homosexuals are constructions of power. The stronger version insists that subjects are entirely the effects of power, particularly of a compulsory heterosexuality, and that as effects they can only accept their mode of being a subject or try to subvert it from within. A weaker version of the claim, however, would simply emphasize that infants are born into a world of existing gendered relations, hierarchies and distributions of power and are acculturated into this world by parents, teachers and the like. To say that infants are born into prevailing structures of power, however, is not to say that they are already entirely constituted by them. Hence, Benhabib claims, there remain capacities for refection and accountability that are not simply themselves effects of power. For her part, Nancy Fraser finds the positive connotations that Butler associates with resignification “puzzling.” “Why,” she asks, “is resignification good? Can’t there be bad (oppressive, reactionary) resignifications?” (1995 67–8). If all subjectivity is a construction of power/discourse networks, why should we not simply be content with the subjects that our current disciplinary practices enforce? Or, if some resignifications are good, which ones? How do we determine which sort we should endorse?

Fraser suggests that in order to respond to objections of this general kind, a feminism inspired by Foucault might integrate its emphasis on social construction with an analysis that allows for both social criticism and “utopian hope”. (1995 71) Here she gestures toward a Habermasian account, one that looks to procedures for rationally justifying norms to which we can all agree and that uses such universal norms as footholds for social criticism. Fraser also calls for articulating a vision of the future that is “sufficiently compelling to persuade other women – and men – to reinterpret their interests.” (1997, 218). Part of this model involves overcoming constructed gender oppositions between breadwinning and care giving work and, moreover, easing the strain of both. “The trick,” Fraser contends, “is to imagine a social world in which citizens’ lives integrate wage earning, care giving, community activism, political participations, and involvement in the associational life of civil society – while also leaving time for some fun …. Unless we are guided by this vision now, we will never get any closer to achieving it.”

At times, Butler seems to be moving in just the direction that Fraser indicates. That is, despite her Foucaultian sympathies, she sometimes appeals to recognizably Habermasian ideas about rationality and consensus. Thus, she refers to the need for “grounds for action” and to the “collective contexts” in which “we try to find modes of deliberation and reflection about which we can agree.” (Butler 2004, 222) Yet, she also pulls back from such ideas, warning that we should regard any agreement on norms with suspicion. “Do we need to know,” she writes, “that, despite our differences, we are all oriented toward the same conception of rational deliberation and justification? Or do we need precisely to know that the ‘common’ is no longer there for us, if it ever was.” (2004, 221)

4. Possibilities for Social Justice: The Analytic Tradition

Working from an Anglo-American tradition, Martha Nussbaum has raised questions similar to those that Benhabib and Fraser raise about a Foucaultian-inspired feminism. Indeed, she thinks the latter is irretrievably self-involved and needs to be rejected in favor of the kind of theoretical and practical work that can change laws, feed the hungry, and oppose oppressive practices and institutions. To this end, she looks to Amartya Sen's development of Rawlsian liberalism into what she calls the human capabilities approach. Following Rawls, this approach focuses on the distribution of resources and opportunities within a country or political entity. It adds to Rawls’ view, first, the question of what individuals’ needs for resources are and, second, the question of how they are able to convert these resources into human functioning (Nussbaum 1999, 34). By human functioning, Nussbaum means both the basic functioning without which we would not regard a life as human or fully human and the less basic functioning without which we would not regard a human life as flourishing. The “we” here is not meant to be ethnocentric. The idea is, rather, that a just society provides individuals with the capabilities for human functioning where the idea of a basic and flourishing functioning is one to which people from different traditions with different conceptions of the good could agree as necessary to the pursuit of their conception.

This idea provides a checklist against which to measure forms of oppression and discrimination in particular countries. Thus, inequalities based on gender hierarchies as well as practices such as female genital mutilation will be precluded and a defense of such practices as part of the cultural tradition will not work. If cultural tradition confines women to the house, even if widowed and without means of support, then such practices are to be condemned as violating capabilities for even basic functioning. Indeed, if egregious practices such as female genital mutilation and female confinement violate capabilities for life, nutrition and bodily integrity, all inequalities based on gender hierarchies, in Nussbaum's view, undermine capabilities for self-respect and emotional development that are part of human functioning.

To look to human capabilities is not to look to actual functioning. Nussbaum does not deny that one might choose a life of celibacy, for instance. The human capabilities approach argues, instead, that justice requires the capability for sexual pleasure so that if one chooses celibacy, this choice is really a choice. As Nussbaum writes, “A person who has opportunities for play can always choose a workaholic life — there is a great difference between that chosen life and a life constrained by insufficient maximum hour protections and/or the ‘double day’ that makes women in many parts of the world unable to play.” (1999, 44). Ultimately, then, her concerns are the same as Fraser's: that a postmodern focus on genealogy and resignification cannot do the work of undoing the social, political and economic discrimination that women suffer in far too many cultures and countries.

5. The Appropriation of Psychoanalytic Theory: The Analytic Tradition

A third intersection between analytic and continental approaches in feminism occurs with their joint appropriation of psychoanalytic theory. While English-speaking feminists and those that are associated with them have drawn on work that revises Freud in the direction of object-relations theory, French-speaking feminists and the English-speaking feminists who follow them have by and large focused on revising Freud in terms of Lacan. Some analytic feminists have looked to the work of psychologist, Nancy Chodorow who follows object-relations theory in seeing the breast, and by extension, the mother, as the most important object for the infant. In addition, the circumstance that it is women that typically do the work of mothering leads to importantly different consequences for little boys and little girls. Mothers experience their daughters as identical to themselves and stress these similarities in their nurturing activities. Hence, their daughters grow up in the context of an identifying relationship with their primary caregiver. In contrast, mothers experience their sons as different from themselves and emphasize these differences in their care giving. Boys therefore grow into their gender identity by accepting their differences from their primary caregiver and by associating themselves with a largely absent father. As Chodorow writes, “Because they are parented by a person of the same gender … girls come to experience themselves as less differentiated than boys, as more continuous with and related to the external object world, and as differently oriented to their inner object-world as well.” (Chodorow 1999, 167). These differences in their relation to their primary care giver have other implications as well. As schoolchildren, girls excel in literature while schoolboys excel in mathematics and science; girls are more likely to rely on adults to settle disputes and to take relationships more seriously than competition while boys focus on more complex, competitive and rule-governed games. College-age boys fear attachment and a loss of autonomy while college-age girls fear success and a loss of connection. As adults, women tend to value relationships over independence and to devote themselves to the care of others; in contrast, men tend to value their autonomy and to focus on questions of rights and duties over emotions and sensitivity to others.

Following this line of thought, “difference feminism” emphasizes women's concern with issues of relationship, their sensitivity to the particulars of individual circumstances, and their interest in the narrative of concrete individual lives. It thus stresses women's orientation to what Carol Gilligan calls an ethics of care as opposed to an ethics of justice (Gilligan 1982). An ethics of justice concerns itself with guaranteeing individual rights and with adjudications of conflicts between rights based on general principles of liberty and equality. In contrast, an ethics of care is sensitive to the particular case and circumstances, to the specificity of people's lives and life-stories, and to the needs of concrete rather than generalized others (Benhabib 1987). In addition it focuses on the interdependence of people rather than on their individual rights, on possibilities for empathy rather than those of autonomous decision-making (Held 1995), and as Nel Noddings (1995) stresses, on our capacity for fulfillment in our commitment to others rather than on our need to justify our actions.

Difference feminists also urge a form of the politics that understands women's gender identity as a source of strength. Thus, Patricia Hill Collins delineates the way community activism can issue from Black women's and especially Black mothers’ experiences of caring. She criticizes the image of super-strong African-American mothers insofar as it obscures the costs of caring for Black women. Yet she also sees Black motherhood as an important model for “ a more generalized ethic of caring and personal accountability.” (Collins 1995, 133). Black communities typically emphasize not only the responsibility of “bloodmothers” for their own children but also of what Collins calls othermothers — grandmothers, sisters, aunts, neighbors and “fictive mothers” who view the children of the community as “our” children (1995, 131). Out of these networks of community childcare develop community organizations, advocacy groups and the like. Other feminists use the value of caring to demand pregnancy and maternity leaves, childcare facilities on workplace grounds, flexible schedules, classroom attention to the needs of girls, including single-sex education if necessary, and career guidance for girls.

6. The Appropriation of Psychoanalytic Theory: The Continental Tradition

What about Continental approaches to psychoanalytic theory? Feminists such as Jacqueline Rose, Juliet Mitchell, Elizabeth Grosz and Jeanne L. Schroeder begin with Lacan's reinterpretation of Freud and go in a different direction. Crucial here is the division of the real, the imaginary and the symbolic. The real is that world that we feel we have lost when we begin to mediate our experience through imagery or language; it is the world of unity with the other or the mother figure (which Continentally oriented feminists often write as (M)Other to emphasize that it is a position of the other from the point of view of the child; typically this position is taken by women.) The imaginary signals the stage of mirror images when the child recognizes itself by seeing itself reflected in the mother. At this stage the infant does not recognize itself as a subject but simply as not-Mother. Only with the transition to the symbolic that corresponds to Freud's Oedipal phase does the child understand itself as a subject.

Schroeder explains the symbolic order by way of Lacan's delineation of three categories of longing that correspond to the three orders of real, imaginary and symbolic: these are, respectively, need, demand, and desire (Schroeder 1998, 73). In the first stage the infant experiences only need whereas in the second stage, it recognizes that it sometimes lacks what it needs and therefore demands it. This demand is part of the retrospective idea in the imaginary that one was once in unity with the (M)Other and is now not so. Demand is not yet conscious language but rather a call to the Other who has what it demands. At the same time, demand signals insecurity: each time that a demand is not immediately gratified, the question arises as to whether the mother loves the infant (1998, 75). Desire is what emerges: “The baby's need can be met, its demand responded to, but its desire only exists because of the initial failure of satisfaction. Desire persists as an effect of a primordial absence and it therefore indicates that, in this area, there is something fundamentally impossible about satisfaction itself” (Mitchell 1985, 6). What the infant desires, according to Grosz's account of Lacan, is to be desired: “Desire is a fundamental lack, a hole in being that can satisfied only by one ”thing“ – another('s) desire. Each self-conscious subject desires the desire of the other as its object. Its desire is to be desired by the other, its counterpart” (Grosz 1990, 64).

The symbolic order is reached in desire. Lacanian feminists note that Lacan reconstructs this process from the point of view of the son. The child realizes that he is not the object of the mother's desire, that the mother desires the father or whatever person fulfills the role of the father. Moreover, if the mother desires the father, she must desire something he has; this object of desire, Lacan calls the phallus. Having the phallus is the signifier of being a subject. As part of the symbolic order, however, the phallus cannot be seen; instead, the child looks at anatomical fathers and marks how they differ from anatomical mothers, conflating the phallus with the penis. The conflation here is two-fold. First, the child conflates the symbolic phallus with the order of the real he both desires and fears in the imaginary order as a return to unity and, as he sees it, a swallowing up of himself in the mother. Second, the child conflates the real phallus with the physical penis. The father is a subject because of the mother's desire and this desire depends upon his having a penis.

The price the father extracts for the son's becoming a subject is castration. Schroeder explains:

Since the Child imagines that he once had the Phallus (i.e., wholeness, union with the Mother) prior to the mirror stage, he must retroactively explain its loss, but in a way that can deny his loss. He tells himself that the Father threatened to take away the Phallus which the male child conflates with his penis. The Father and son reached an agreement that if the son submitted to castration (the Law of the Father) the Name of the Father will recompense him by allowing him to adopt the Father's name and marry another woman. The son would then be recognized as a speaking subject, a member of the symbolic community, and thereby regain his wholeness. (Schroeder, 1998, 83)

What about the daughter? Women enter this pact between father and son as objects of exchange: the son exchanges his mother for another woman. Grosz writes, “The girl has quickly learned that she does not have the phallus, nor the power it signifies. She comes to accept, not without resistance, her socially designated role as subordinate to the possessor of the phallus, and through her acceptance, she comes to occupy the passive, dependent position expected of women in patriarchy” (1990, 69). Moreover, if men have the phallus, women are the phallus, the object of desire. Men become speaking subjects through the threat of their symbolic castration while women become the objects of exchange. Consequently, any move by women to overturn the terms of their objectification threatens the entire symbolic order. By the same logic, when women speak they do so only by taking up the masculine position (Cornell 1992, 175).

Critics of difference feminism in the English speaking world have argued that it simply reinforces stereotypes about women and their presumed special needs, restricting women to traditional roles and increasing the difficulty of escaping them. As working mothers, women are expected to put their families first in a way that men are not and to give up on high-paying but demanding jobs for the sake of their children. Indeed, as college students they are often motivated to train in the first place for the sort of career that allows them to take time off to bear and rear children. Such actions mean that they typically have less power within the family to make decisions about either their own lives or the lives of their families. Moreover, these circumstances can put them at a disadvantage in no-fault divorce settlements where their contributions to the family cannot be easily measured in monetary terms (Okin 1989, Chapter 7). Indeed, to the extent that stressing gender difference leads to policies that increase the costs of hiring women, trap them at the lower end of the wage scale, and abandon them in divorce settlements, difference feminism arguably renders women more rather than less vulnerable.

A similar stasis seems to arise from Lacanian feminism at least to the extent that it can make solutions to sexism seem overwhelmingly difficult. Lacanian feminists try to stress the space that Lacan opens up for overturning sexual categories. Irigaray is even notable as the representative of a French difference feminism insofar as she is interested in the concept of the feminine that is excluded by a discourse in which women are the other of men. Yet, what seems to be required is nothing less than an overturning of the symbolic order, of language itself.

For this reason, we might rather trace a line of resistance that runs from the challenge to an uncritical conception of sex and gender to the contributions to feminism by liberalism and critical theory. Arguments by analytic philosophers of language and Continental Foucaultians show us that we should not take up the categories of sex and gender uncritically. Even if we ultimately justify their employment, our use of them remains critically informed by recognition of the limits of the terms and the overgeneralizations and exclusions they can foster. Arguments by liberals and critical theorists demand that we not become so involved in the complexities of language that we ignore the poverty and oppression that those identified as women suffer in too many countries. We therefore need action on two fronts: a constant questioning of the gender divisions we have made and constant efforts to right the wrongs to which those positioned as women remain subject.


  • Alcoff, Linda Martin (2005), Visible Identities: Race, Gender, and the Self, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Angier, Natalie (2000), Woman: An Intimate Geography, New York: Anchor Books.
  • Appiah, K. Anthony (1996), “Race, Culture, Identity, Mistaken Connections” in K. Anthony Appiah and Amy Gutmann, Color Conscious: The Political Morality of Race, Princeton, Princeton University Press, pp. 30–105.
  • Benhabib, Seyla (1987), “The Generalized and the Concrete Other: The Kohlberg-Gilligan Controvery and Feminist theory” in Feminism as Critique: On the Politics of Gender, S. Benhabib and D. Cornell (eds.), Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987.
  • Butler, Judith (1990), Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, New York: Routledge.
  • ––– (2004), Undoing Gender, New York: Routledge.
  • Chodorow, Nancy (1978), The Reproduction of Mothering: Psychoanalysis and the Sociology of Gender, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Collins, Patricia Hill (1995), “Black Women and Motherhood” in Justice and Care: Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics, Virginia Held (ed.), Boulder CO.: Westview Press.
  • Cornell, Drucilla (1992), Philosophy of the Limit, New York: Routledge.
  • Crenshaw, Kimberlé (1991), “Mapping the Margins: Intersectionality, Identity Politics and Violence Against Women” in The Stanford Law Review, 43(6): 1241–1299.
  • De Beauvoir, Simone (1953), The Second Sex, H.M. Parshley (trans. and ed.), New York: Knopf.
  • Fausto-Sterling, Anne (2000), Sexing the Body: Gender Politics and the Construction of Sexuality, New York: Basic Books.
  • Fraser, Nancy (1989), “Foucault on Modern Power: Empirical Insights and Normative Confusions” in N. Fraser, Unruly Practices: Power, Discourse and Gender in Contemporary Social Theory, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • ––– (1997), “False Antitheses: A Response to Seyla Benhabib and Judith Butler”, in N. Fraser, Justice Interruptus: Critical Reflections on the “Postsocialist” Condition, New York: Routledge.
  • ––– (1997a), “Multiculturalism, Anti-Essentialism and Radical Democracy: A Genealogy of the Current Impasse in Feminist Theory”, in Fraser, Justice Interruptus: Critical Reflections on the “Postsocialist” Condition, New York: Routledge.
  • Grosz, Elizabeth (1990), Jacques Lacan: A Feminist Introduction, New York: Routledge.
  • Irigaray, Luce (1985), “The Power of Discourse and the Subordination of the Feminine” in Luce Irigaray, This Sex Which Is Not One, Catherine Porter (trans.), Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Haslanger, Sally (2000), “Gender and Race: (What) Are They? (What) Do We Want Them To Be)”, Noûs, 34(1): 31–55.
  • Held, Virginia (1995), “Introduction”, Justice and Care: Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics, Virginia Held (ed.), Boulder CO.: Westview Press.
  • Kristeva, Julia (1981), “Women Can Never Be Defined,” in New French Feminisms, Elaine Marks and Isabelle de Courtivron (eds.), New York: Schocken Books.
  • Mitchell, Juliet (1985), “Introduction I”, in Juliet Mitchell and Jacqueline Rose (eds.) Feminine Sexuality: Jacques Lacan and the école freudienne, New York: W.W. Norton.
  • Noddings, Nel (1995), “Caring” in Justice and Care: Essential Readings in Feminist Ethics, Virginia Held (ed.), Boulder CO.: Westview Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha C. (1999), “Women and Cultural Universals” in M. Nussbaum, Sex and Social Justice, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • ––– (1999a), “The Professor of Parody: The Hip Defeatism of Judith Butler” in The New Republic, February 22, 1999, pp. 45–48.
  • Okin, Susan M. (1989), Justice, Gender and the Family, New York: Basic Books.
  • Outlaw, Lucius (1995), “On W.E.B. Du Bois's ‘The Conservation of Races,’ ” in Overcoming Racism and Sexism, Linda Bell and David Blumenfeld (eds.), New York: Roman and Littlefield.
  • Riley, Denise (1988), “Am I that Name”: Feminism and the Category of “Women” in History, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Scott, Joan Wallach (1988), Gender and the Politics of History, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Schroeder, Jeanne L. (1998), The Vestal and the Fasces: Hegel, Lacan, Property and the Feminine, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Spelman, Elizabeth. (1988), Inessential Woman, Boston, MA: Beacon Press.
  • Warnke, Georgia (2007), After Identity: Rethinking Race, Sex and Gender, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Wittig, Monique (1997), “One is Not Born a Woman” in The Second Wave: A Reader in Feminist Theory, Linda Nicholson (ed.), New York: Routledge.
  • Young, Iris Marion (1994), “Gender as Seriality: Thinking about Women as a Social Collective,” in Signs, 19(3): 713–738.
  • Zack, Naomi (1997), “Race and Philosophic Meaning” in Race/Sex: Their Sameness, Difference, and Interplay, Naomi Zack (ed.), New York: Routledge.

Academic Tools

sep man icon How to cite this entry.
sep man icon Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society.
inpho icon Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO).
phil papers icon Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions]

Related Entries

feminist (topics): perspectives on reproduction and the family | feminist (topics): perspectives on sex and gender | feminist (topics): perspectives on sexuality | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self

Copyright © 2012 by
Georgia Warnke <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free