Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science
Feminist epistemology and philosophy of science studies the ways in which gender does and ought to influence our conceptions of knowledge, the knowing subject, and practices of inquiry and justification. It identifies ways in which dominant conceptions and practices of knowledge attribution, acquisition, and justification systematically disadvantage women and other subordinated groups, and strives to reform these conceptions and practices so that they serve the interests of these groups. Various practitioners of feminist epistemology and philosophy of science argue that dominant knowledge practices disadvantage women by (1) excluding them from inquiry, (2) denying them epistemic authority, (3) denigrating their “feminine” cognitive styles and modes of knowledge, (4) producing theories of women that represent them as inferior, deviant, or significant only in the ways they serve male interests, (5) producing theories of social phenomena that render women's activities and interests, or gendered power relations, invisible, and (6) producing knowledge (science and technology) that is not useful for people in subordinate positions, or that reinforces gender and other social hierarchies. Feminist epistemologists trace these failures to flawed conceptions of knowledge, knowers, objectivity, and scientific methodology. They offer diverse accounts of how to overcome these failures. They also aim to (1) explain why the entry of women and feminist scholars into different academic disciplines, especially in biology and the social sciences, has generated new questions, theories, and methods, (2) show how gender and feminist values and perspectives have played a causal role in these transformations, (3) promote theories that aid egalitarian and liberation movements, and (4) defend these developments as cognitive, not just social, advances.
The central concept of feminist epistemology is that of a situated knower, and hence of situated knowledge: knowledge that reflects the particular perspectives of the subject. Feminist philosophers are interested in how gender situates knowing subjects. They have articulated three main approaches to this question: feminist standpoint theory, feminist postmodernism, and feminist empiricism. Different conceptions of how gender situates knowers also inform feminist approaches to the central problems of the field: grounding feminist criticisms of science and feminist science, defining the proper roles of social and political values in inquiry, evaluating ideals of objectivity and rationality, and reforming structures of epistemic authority.
- 1. Situated Knowers
- 2. Feminist Standpoint Theory
- 3. Feminist Postmodernism
- 4. Feminist Empiricism
- 5. Feminist Science Criticism and Feminist Science
- 6. Feminist Defenses of Value-Laden Inquiry
- 7. Feminist Critiques and Conceptions of Objectivity
- 8. Epistemic Authority, Epistemic Injustice, and Epistemologies of Ignorance
- 9. Trends in Feminist Epistemology: Interactions of Standpoint Theory, Postmodernism, and Empiricism
- 10. External Criticisms of Feminist Epistemology
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
Feminist epistemology conceives of knowers as situated in particular relations to what is known and to other knowers. What is known, and the way that it is known, thereby reflects the situation or perspective of the knower. Here we are concerned with claims to know, temporarily bracketing the question of which claims are true or warranted.
Situated knowledge in general. Consider how people may understand the same object in different ways that reflect the distinct relations in which they stand to it.
Embodiment. People experience the world by using their bodies, which have different constitutions and are differently located in space and time. In virtue of their different physical locations, observers who stand in front of an object have different information about it than observers who have a distant but bird's eye view of it.
First-person vs. third-person knowledge. People have first-personal access to some of their own bodily and mental states, yielding direct knowledge of phenomenological facts about what it is like for them to be in these states. Third parties may know these states only by interpreting external symptoms, imaginative projection, or obtaining their testimony. People also have knowledge de se about themselves, expressed in the form “I am F here, now.” This is distinct in character and inferential role from propositional knowledge having the same content, which does not use indexicals.
Emotions, attitudes, interests, and values. People often represent objects in relation to their emotions, attitudes and interests. A thief represents a lock as a frustrating obstacle while its owner represents the lock as a comforting source of security.
Personal knowledge of others. People have different knowledge of others, in virtue of their different personal relationships to them. Such knowledge is often tacit, incompletely articulated, and intuitive. Like the knowledge it takes to get a joke, it is more an interpretive skill in making sense of a person than a set of propositions. (The German language usefully marks this as the distinction between Erkenntnis and Wissenschaft.) Because people behave differently toward others, and others interpret their behavior differently, depending on their personal relationships, what others know of them depends on these relationships.
Know-how. People have different skills, which may also be a source of different propositional knowledge. An expert dog handler knows how to elicit more interesting behavior from an a dog than a novice does. Such know-how expresses a more sophisticated understanding of dogs on the part of the expert, and also generates new phenomena about dogs for investigation.
Cognitive Styles. People have different styles of investigation and representation. What looks like one phenomenon to a lumper may look like three to a splitter.
Background beliefs and worldviews. People form different beliefs about an object, in virtue of different background beliefs. In virtue of the different background beliefs against which they interpret a patient's symptoms, a patient may think he is having a heart attack while his doctor believes he just has heartburn. Differences in global metaphysical or political worldviews (naturalism, theism, liberalism, marxism) may also generate different beliefs about particulars on a more comprehensive scale.
Relations to other inquirers. People may stand in different epistemic relations to other inquirers—for example, as informants, interlocutors, students—which affects their access to relevant information and their ability to convey their beliefs to others.
These kinds of situatedness affect knowledge in several ways. They influence knowers' access to information and the terms in which they represent what they know. They bear on the form of their knowledge (articulate/implicit, formal/informal, by acquaintance or description, and so forth). They affect their attitudes toward their beliefs (certainty/doubt, dogmatic/open to revision), their standards of justification (relative weights they give to different epistemic values such as predictive power and consilience, amount, sources, and kinds of evidence they require before they accept a claim, etc.), and the authority with which they lay claim to their beliefs and can offer them to others. Finally, they affect knowers' assessment of which claims are significant or important.
Social situation. Many of these ways in which knowers' physical and psychological relations to the world affects what and how they know are familiar and extensively studied by cognitive psychology, naturalized epistemology, and philosophy of science. Feminist epistemology takes such studies a further step by considering how the social location of the knower affects what and how she knows. It can thus be seen as a branch of social epistemology. An individual's social locations consists of her ascribed social identities (gender, race, sexual orientation, ethnicity, caste, kinship status, etc.) and social roles and relationships (occupation, political party membership, etc.). Partly in virtue of their different ascribed identities, individuals occupy different social roles that accord them different powers, duties, and role-given goals and interests. They are subject to different norms that prescribe different virtues, habits, emotions, and skills that are thought to be appropriate for these roles. They also acquire different subjective identities. Subjective identification with one's social groups can take several forms. One may simply know oneself to have certain ascribed identities. One may accept or endorse these identities, actively affirming the norms and roles associated with them. Or one may regard one's social identities as oppressive (if, say, one's identity is cast by society as evil, contemptible, or disgusting), yet see one's fate as tied with the groups with which one is identified, and commit oneself to collective action with other members of those groups to overcome that oppression.
Gender as a mode of social situation. Most feminist theorists distinguish between sex and gender. Sex comprises the biological differences between males and females. Gender is what societies make of sexual differences: the different roles, norms, and meanings they assign to men and women and the things associated with them on account of their real or imagined sexual characteristics. Gender thus has several dimensions (Haslanger 2000).
Gender roles. Men and women are assigned to distinct social roles. For example, most societies reserve political and military offices mostly for men, and assign women most childrearing responsibilities.
Gender norms. Men and women are expected to comply with different norms of behavior and bodily comportment. For example, men are expected to be assertive and athletic; women, deferential and modest. Gender norms are tailored to gender roles: men and women are expected to conform to those norms that make them fit for their gender roles (whether or not they actually occupy those roles).
Gendered traits and virtues. Psychological traits are considered “masculine” and “feminine” if they dispose their bearers to comply with the gender norms assigned to men and women, respectively. “Masculine” traits are therefore regarded as virtues in men and (often) vices in women, while “feminine” traits are regarded as vices in men and virtues in women.
Gendered performance/behavior. Many feminist theorists, often influenced by postmodernism, have come to stress the contextual and performative aspects of gender (West & Zimmerman 1987; Butler 1990). Rather than viewing masculinity and femininity as fixed traits, expressed in every social context, these theorists represent human beings as more flexible and disposed to enact both “masculine” and “feminine” behaviors in different contexts. The man who avoids tenderly comforting a crying baby in the presence of women may do so when alone. Rather than viewing masculinity and femininity as manifested only in behavior within fixed, distinct gender roles, they can be seen as contrasting styles of performance in almost any role. Female body builders strive to show off their muscles in a “feminine” way.
Gender identity. A person's ascribed gender identity—how others identify him or her—may not match his or her subjective gender identity—the sense that one is “really” a man or a woman. Subjective gender identity includes all of the ways one might understand oneself to be a man, a woman, both, or neither. One could identify with any subset of gender norms, roles, and traits ascribed to the gender of which one sees oneself as a member, while repudiating others. One could even repudiate them all, but still identify oneself as a man or a women in terms of what one sees as distinct roles men and women ought to play in bringing about a just future (one that may or may not include gender distinctions). One could, as many feminists do, understand one's gender identity as a predicament shared by all with the same ascribed identity, and thus as a basis for collective action to change the very basis of one's gender identity. One could embrace an “androcentric” identity, including both “feminine” and “masculine” roles, norms, and traits, decline to view oneself in gender polarized terms at all, or play with gender identities in a postmodernist spirit.
Gender symbolism. Animals and inanimate objects may be placed in a gendered field of representation through conventional association, imaginative projection, and metaphorical thinking. Thus, the garage is regarded as “male” space, the kitchen, “female”; male deer are said to have “harems”; pears are seen as “womanly”, assault rifles as “manly.”
Gendered knowledge. By bringing together the general account of situated knowledge with the account of gender as a kind of social situation, we can now generate a catalogue of ways in which what people know, or think they know, can be influenced by their own gender (roles, norms, traits, performance, identities), other people's genders, or by ideas about gender (symbolism). Each mode of gendered knowledge raises new questions for epistemology.
The phenomenology of gendered bodies. People's bodies are not just differently sexed; they are differently gendered. Early child socialization trains boys' and girls' bodies to different norms of bodily comportment. In the U.S., these norms stress physical freedom, aggressive play, large motor skills, informal and relaxed posture, and indifference to clothing, neatness and appearance in boys; physical constraint, subdued play, small motor skills, formal and modest posture, and self-consciousness about clothing, neatness and appearance for girls. Once internalized, such norms profoundly affect the phenomenology of embodiment. They inform men's and women's distinct first-personal knowledge of what it is like to inhabit a body, to express capacities unique to one sex or another (e.g., breast feeding), and to have experiences that are manifested through different body parts in differently sexed bodies (e.g., orgasm). They also cause men's and women's experiences of gendered behaviors that both can perform to differ—in comfort, fluidity, feelings of “naturalness” or novelty, self-consciousness, confidence, awkwardness, shame, and so forth. One question these facts raise for feminist epistemology is to what extent dominant models of the world, especially of the relation between minds and bodies, have seemed compelling because they conform to a male or masculine phenomenology (Bordo 1987; Young 1990).
Gendered first-personal knowledge de se. It is one thing to know what sexual harassment is, and how to identify it in a case described in third-personal terms. It is another to come to the recognition “I have been sexually harassed.” Many women who are able to see that women in general are disadvantaged have difficulty recognizing themselves as sharing women's predicament (Clayton & Crosby 1992). The problems of de se knowledge are particularly pressing for feminist theory, because it is committed to theorizing in ways that women can use to improve their lives. This entails that women be able to recognize themselves and their lives in feminist accounts of women's predicament. Feminist epistemology is therefore particularly concerned with investigating the conditions of feminist self-understanding and the social settings in which it may arise—feminist consciousness-raising sessions, women's studies classes, and so forth (MacKinnon 1989).
Gendered emotions, attitudes, interests, and values. Feminist theory defines a representation as androcentric if it depicts the world in relation to male or masculine interests, emotions, attitudes or values. A “male” interest is an interest a man has, in virtue of the goals given to him by social roles that are designated as especially appropriate for men to occupy, or in virtue of his subjective gender identity. A “masculine” interest is an interest a man has in virtue of attitudes or psychological dispositions that are thought specifically appropriate to men. Such attitudes and interests structure the cognition of those who have them. For example, a representational scheme that classifies women as either “babes,” “dogs,” “whores,” or (grand)mothers reflects the androcentric attitudes, interests, and values of single heterosexual adolescent men who view women in terms of their fantasized eligibility for sexual intercourse with them. A representation is gynocentric if it depicts the world in relation to female or feminine interests, emotions, attitudes or values. When a man is described as an “eligible bachelor,” this reflects the gynocentric perspective of a heterosexual, single woman interested in marriage. An interest, emotion, attitude, or value might be symbolically gendered even if men and women do not manifest it differently. For example the ethics of care represents moral problems in terms of symbolically feminine values—values culturally associated with women's gender roles (Gilligan 1982). It thus can qualify as a symbolically gynocentric perspective, even if men and women do not differ in their propensity to represent moral problems in its terms, and are equally able to act accordingly. From a performative perspective, this shows that men can behave in “feminine” ways, too. Feminist epistemology raises numerous questions about these phenomena. Can situated emotional responses to things be a valid source of knowledge about them (Diamond 1991, Jaggar 1989, Keller 1983)? Do dominant practices and conceptions of science and scientific method reflect an androcentric perspective, or a perspective that reflects other dominant positions, as of race and colonial rule (Merchant 1980; Harding 1986, 1991, 1993, 1998)? Do mainstream philosophical conceptions of objectivity, knowledge, and reason reflect an androcentric perspective (Bordo 1987; Code 1991; Flax 1983; Rooney 1991)? How would the conceptual frameworks of particular sciences change if they reflected the interests of females (Anderson 1995b, Waring 1990)?
Knowledge of others in gendered relationships. Gender norms differentially structure the social spaces to which men and women are admitted, as well as the presentation of self to others. As performative theories of gender stress, men manifest their male identity, and women their female identity, differently alone than in mixed company, and differently in these settings than in gender-segregated contexts. Male and female inquirers therefore have access to different information about others. Male and female ethnographers may be admitted to different social spaces. Even when admitted to the same social spaces, their presence has different effects on those being observed, because they do not stand in the same social relationships to their subjects. Physical objects do not behave differently depending on whether a man or a woman is observing them. But human beings do behave differently according to their beliefs about the gender of who is observing them. Research that elicits information about others through personal contact between the researchers and the research subjects therefore raises the question of how findings might be influenced by the gendered relations between researchers and subjects, and whether gender-inclusive research teams are in a better position to detect this. Ethnography, which derives propositional knowledge of others from personal knowledge of native informants in long-term, often intimate relationships, raises these issues most acutely (Bell et al 1993; Leacock 1981). Similar issues arise in survey research, clinical research, and human experimentation (Sherif 1987).
Gendered skills. Some skills are labeled masculine or feminine because men and women need them specifically to perform their respective gender roles, and they are not generically useful for almost any role (as walking, talking, and seeing are). It takes a particular knowledge of small children to know how to comfort them, a particular knowledge of soldiers to know how to whip up their morale. Although men and women alike may acquire and exercise these skills, they are considered the peculiar responsibility of one or the other gender. Men and women may therefore have differential access to such skill-based knowledge. To the extent that the skill is perceived by the agent as the proper province of the “other” gender, he or she may have a difficult time seeing himself or herself perform it confidently and fluidly, and this inability to self-identify with the task can impair performance. The feedback effects of the phenomenology of gendered embodiment and de se knowledge of one's own subjective gender identity can therefore influence the exercise of gendered skills. To the extent that a skill is perceived by others as the proper province of one gender, others may grant or withhold acknowledgment of an agent's expertise. If the successful exercise of the skill requires that others be willing to accept it as a competent performance—as in the cases of comforting children or raising soldiers' morale—others' gender-based readiness or refusal to grant expertise to an agent in exercising that skill can be a self-fulfilling prophecy. These phenomena raise various questions for epistemology. Does the “masculine” symbolism of certain scientific skills, such as of assuming an “objective” stance toward nature, interfere with the integration of women into science? Do actually or symbolically “feminine” skills aid the acquisition of scientific knowledge (Keller 1983, 1985a; Rose 1987; Ruetsche 2004; Smith 1974)?
Gendered cognitive styles. Some theorists believe that men and women have different cognitive styles (Belenky et al 1986; Gilligan 1982). Whether or not this is true, cognitive styles are gender symbolized (Rooney 1991). Deductive, analytic, atomistic, acontextual, and quantitative cognitive styles are labeled “masculine,” while intuitive, synthetic, holistic, contextual and qualitative cognitive styles are labeled “feminine.” Such associations are not wholly arbitrary, the way blue is gendered male and pink, female. For example, it is seen as masculine to make one's point by means of argument, feminine to make one's point by means of narrative. Argument is commonly cast as an adversarial mode of discourse, in which one side claims vindication by vanquishing the opposition. Such pursuit of dominance follows the competitive pattern of male gender roles in combat, athletics, and business. Narrative is a seductive mode of discourse, persuading by an enticing invitation to take up the perspective of the narrator, which excites one's imagination and feeling. Its operations are more like love than war, and thereby follows a mode of persuasion thought more suitable for women. These phenomena raise numerous epistemological questions: does the quest for “masculine” prestige by using “masculine” methods distort practices of knowledge acquisition (Addelson 1983; Moulton, 1983)? Are some kinds of sound research unfairly ignored because of their association with “feminine” cognitive styles (Keller 1983, 1985b)? Do “feminine” cognitive styles yield knowledge that is inaccessible or harder to achieve by “masculine” means (Duran 1991, Rose 1987, Smith 1974)?
Gendered background beliefs and worldviews. We have seen above how men and women have access to different phenomenological knowledge, de se knowledge, know-how, and personal knowledge of others, in virtue of their gender. They also tend to represent the world in different terms, in virtue of their gendered interests, attitudes, emotions and values, and perhaps also (although this is a matter of controversy among feminist theorists) in virtue of different cognitive styles. These differences create different background webs of belief against which information to which men and women have in principle equal access may be processed. Representational schemes that are functional for different gender roles and gendered attitudes make different kinds of information salient. In traditional domestic settings, women tend to notice dirt that men don't. This is not because women have a specially sensitive sensory apparatus. It is because they have a role which designates the females of the household as the ones who have to clean up. Male surgeons have no difficulty maintaining much higher degrees of vigilance about contamination in an operating room than would ever be warranted in housecleaning. Besides making different kinds of information salient to men and women, their different background knowledge may lead them to interpret commonly accessed information differently. A man might read a woman's demure smile as a coy come-on, where another woman may interpret it as her polite and defensive reaction to unwanted attention from him. Such differences can spring from differential access to phenomenological knowledge. The male and female observers imaginatively project themselves into her situation, inferring her feelings from the feelings they think underlie her body language. Because men's and women's phenomenologies of embodiment are different—most men are not in the habit of smiling as a defense against unwanted attention from women—the man may narcissistically imagine the smile as relaxed and spontaneous, whereas the woman may suspect it is forced. Here are a few epistemological questions raised by these phenomena. Are there epistemic obstacles to men's ability to know when they are raping or sexually harassing women, or to legal institutions recognizing this, insofar as they confine their thinking within a “masculine” perspective (MacKinnon 1989)? More generally, do the unexamined sexist or androcentric background beliefs of scientists cause them to generate sexist theories about women, despite their adherence to ostensibly objective scientific methods (Harding 1986; Harding & O'Barr, 1987; Hubbard 1990)? More generally still, how might the social practices of science be organized so that variations in background beliefs of inquirers function as a resource rather than an obstacle to scientific success (Longino 1990; Solomon 2001)?
Relations to other inquirers. Gender differences in knowledge and background beliefs can be reduced if men and women participate in inquiry together. Each gender can take on testimony what the other can acquire through direct experience. Each may also learn how to exercise imaginative projection more effectively, and to take up the perspective of the other gender. However, gender norms influence the terms on which men and women communicate (Kalbfleisch 1995). In many contexts, women are not allowed to speak or even show up, or their questions, comments, and challenges are ignored, interrupted, and systematically distorted, or they aren't accepted as experts. Gendered norms of conversational interaction and epistemic authority thus influence the ability of knowledge practices to incorporate the knowledge and experience of men and women into their processes of discovery and justification. Feminist epistemologists are therefore interested in exploring how gender norms distort the dissemination of testimony and relations of cognitive authority among inquirers (Addelson 1983; Code 1991; Fricker 2007) and how the social relations of inquirers could be reformed, especially with regard to the allocation of epistemic authority, so as to enable more successful practices of inquiry (Jones 2002; Longino 1990; Nelson 1990, 1993).
Problems of and Approaches to Gendered Situated Knowledge. Mainstream epistemology takes as paradigms of knowledge simple propositional knowledge about matters in principle equally accessible to anyone with basic cognitive and sensory apparatus: “2 + 2=4”; “grass is green”; “water quenches thirst.” Feminist epistemology does not claim that such knowledge is gendered. But examination of such examples is not particularly helpful for answering the epistemological problems that arise specifically in feminist theory and practice. What is it to know that I am a woman? What is it like to be sexually objectified? Why is it that men and women so often have dramatically divergent understandings of what happened in their sexual encounters? How can we arrange scientific practices so that science and technology serve women's interests? These kinds of questions make other kinds of knowledge salient for feminist epistemology: phenomenological knowledge, de se knowledge, knowledge of persons, know-how, moral knowledge, knowledge informed by emotions, attitudes, and interests. These kinds of knowledge are often gendered, and they can influence the propositional claims people are disposed to form and accept. This has critical implications for mainstream epistemological conceptions of knowledge, insofar as the latter are based on false generalizations drawing only from examples of ungendered knowledge.
Feminist epistemologists stress the situatedness or perspective-relativity of much knowledge. They do not thereby embrace epistemological relativism. To regard some knowledge claim or form of understanding as situated in a perspective is not to claim that the perspective yields true beliefs or satisfactory understandings (not even “for” those taking up the perspective). It is not to claim that perspectives can only be judged in their own terms, nor that no perspectives are better than others, nor that one cannot take a more objective view of the phenomena than that taken up in one or another perspective. It is not to claim that all knowledge necessarily reflects some peculiar non-universalizable relation of a subset of knowers to the object of knowledge. What attention to situated knowledge does do is enable questions to be raised and addressed that are difficult even to frame in epistemologies that simply assume that gender, and the social situation of the knower more generally, is irrelevant to knowledge. How are the knowledge claims generated by gendered perspectives related to one another? Can men take up a gynocentric perspective, and women, an androcentric perspective? Or are there epistemological barriers to such perspective crossing? Are certain perspectives epistemically privileged? Is there any way to construct a more objective perspective out of differently gendered perspectives? What is the relation of an objective perspective, if one is possible, to gendered perspectives? What would be the point of achieving such a perspective? Would the achievement of such an objective perspective make possible or desirable the elimination of gendered perspectives? Feminist epistemology does not rule out in advance the possibility or desirability of objective knowledge. It does raise new questions about objectivity.
Feminist epistemologists have developed their approaches to the
situatedness of knowledge within three broad epistemological
traditions: standpoint theory, postmodernism, and empiricism.
Standpoint theory identifies a particular social perspective as
epistemically privileged. Postmodernism rejects claims of epistemic
privilege, emphasizing instead the contingency and instability of the
social identity of knowers, and consequently of their representations.
Empiricism seeks standards, within a naturalized framework, for
differentiating the circumstances in which situatedness generates error
and in which it constitutes a resource that can be harnessed to advance
knowledge. It advances a conception of objectivity constituted by
critical and cooperative relations among a plurality of differently
Standpoint Epistemology in General. Standpoint theories claim to represent the world from a particular socially situated perspective that can lay a claim to epistemic privilege or authority. A complete standpoint theory must specify (i) the social location of the privileged perspective, (ii) the scope of its privilege: what questions or subject matters it can claim a privilege over, (iii) the aspect of the social location that generates superior knowledge: for example, social role, or subjective identity; (iv) the ground of its privilege: what it is about that aspect that justifies a claim to privilege; (v) the type of epistemic superiority it claims: for example, greater accuracy, or greater ability to represent fundamental truths; (vi) the other perspectives relative to which it claims epistemic superiority and (vii) modes of access to that perspective: is occupying the social location necessary or sufficient for getting access to the perspective? Many claims to epistemic privilege on behalf of particular perspectives with respect to certain questions are commonplace and uncontroversial. Auto mechanics are generally in a better position than auto consumers to know what is wrong with their cars. Practical experience in fulfilling the social role of the mechanic grounds the mechanic's epistemic privilege, which lays a claim to greater reliability than the judgments of auto consumers.
Standpoint theories become controversial when they claim epistemic privilege over socially and politically contested topics on behalf of the perspectives of systematically disadvantaged social groups, relative to the perspectives of the groups that dominate them. The scope of the claimed privilege includes the character, causes, and consequences of the social inequalities that define the groups in question. This type of standpoint theory classically claims three types of epistemic privilege over the standpoint of dominant groups: First, it claims to offer deep over surface knowledge of society: the standpoint of the disadvantaged reveals the fundamental regularities that drive the phenomena in question, whereas the standpoint of the privileged captures only surface regularities. Second, in virtue of this, it claims to offer superior knowledge of the modality of surface regularities, and thus superior knowledge of human potentialities. Where the standpoint of the privileged tends to represent existing social inequalities as natural and necessary, the standpoint of the disadvantaged correctly represents them as socially contingent, and shows how they could be overcome. Third, it claims to offer a representation of the social world in relation to universal human interests. By contrast, the standpoint of the privileged represents social phenomena only in relation to the interests of the privileged class, but ideologically misrepresents these interests as coinciding with universal human interests.
Grounds of Feminist Standpoint Theory. Feminist standpoint theory claims an epistemic privilege over the character of gender relations, and of social and psychological phenomena in which gender is implicated, on behalf of the standpoint of women. The privilege is relative to theories that justify patriarchy or reflect sexist assumptions. Various feminist standpoint theories ground the claim to epistemic privilege in different features of women's social situation. Each can be seen as drawing an analogy with one or more strands of Marxist epistemology.
Centrality. According to marxist feminists, such as Hartsock (1987) and Rose (1987) women are central to the system of reproduction—of socializing children and caring for bodies—as workers are central to the system of commodity production. Because women are in charge of tending to the needs of everyone else in the household, they are in a better position than men to see how patriarchy fails to meet people's needs. Men, in virtue of their dominant position, have the privilege of ignoring how their actions undermine the interests of subordinates. The epistemic privilege of women therefore rests on the fact that women as a class have superior access to information about whose needs get better served under patriarchy.
Collective self-consciousness. According to MacKinnon (1999) male dominance is based on sexual objectification, a process involving epistemic mystification. In objectification, dominant groups project their desires onto subordinate groups and, in virtue of their power, make subordinate groups conform to the way dominants want them to be. It represents as given, natural, and necessary the group differences that are caused by dominant group desires. Gender is the mode of objectification constituted by erotic desire, the eroticization of domination. Men constitute women as women by representing their natures as essentially sexually subordinate to men and treating them accordingly. Women can unmask these ideological misrepresentations by achieving and acting on a shared understanding of themselves as women—that is, as a social group unjustly constituted by sexual objectification. Women act collectively on this shared understanding in resisting the sexist representations made of them, through campaigns against sexual harassment, pornography, restrictions on reproductive freedom, and so forth. Through these feminist actions, in which women refuse to act as sexual objects, women show that representations of women as sexual objects are not natural or necessary. Their privileged knowledge is agent self-knowledge, made true by being put into action.
Cognitive style. Some early versions of standpoint theory (including Flax 1983, Hartsock 1987, Rose 1987, and Smith 1974) accept feminist object relations theory, which explains the development of stereotypical feminine and masculine traits in terms of the different problems of identity-formation faced by male and female children who are raised by female caregivers (Chodorow 1978). Object relations theory postulates that male children form their distinctive masculine identities by separating themselves from their mothers, a task that psychologically involves an anxious rejection of the feminine and a continuous need to maintain distance and boundaries by controlling and denigrating the feminine. Female children gain a sense of their gender identity through identification with their mothers, and so are more comfortable with a blurring of boundaries between self and other. The development of gender identities leads males and females to acquire distinctively masculine and feminine cognitive styles. The masculine cognitive style is abstract, theoretical, disembodied, emotionally detached, analytical, deductive, quantitative, atomistic, and oriented toward values of control or domination. The feminine cognitive style is concrete, practical, embodied, emotionally engaged, synthetic, intuitive, qualitative, relational, and oriented toward values of care. These cognitive styles are reinforced through the distinctive types of labor assigned to men and women—men having a near monopoly on the theoretical sciences, warmaking, and on positions of political and economic power calling for detachment and control; and women being assigned to hands-on emotional care for others. The feminine cognitive style is said to be epistemically superior because it overcomes the dichotomy between the subject and object of knowing and because an ethics of care is superior to an ethics of domination. Ways of knowing informed by the motive of caring for everyone's needs will produce more valuable representations than ways of knowing informed by the interests of the dominant (Hartsock 1987). They will produce representations of the world in relation to universal human interests, rather than in terms of the interests of dominant classes, ideologically misrepresented as universal interests. To institutionalize the feminine way of knowing, however, would require overcoming the division of mental, manual, and caring labor that characterizes capitalist patriarchy (Rose 1987).
Oppression. Women are oppressed, and therefore have an interest in representing social phenomena in ways that reveal rather than mask this truth. They also have direct experience of their oppression, unlike men, whose privilege enables them to ignore how their actions affect women as a class. The logic of an epistemology that grounds epistemic privilege in oppression is to identify the multiply oppressed as multiply epistemically privileged. Within feminist theory, this logic has led to the development of black feminist epistemology. Collins (1990) grounds black feminist epistemology in black women's personal experiences of racism and sexism, and in cognitive styles associated with black women. She uses this epistemology to supply black women with self-representations that enable them to resist the demeaning racist and sexist images of black women in the wider world, and to take pride in their identities. The epistemic privilege of the oppressed is sometimes cast, following W.E.B. DuBois, in terms of “bifurcated consciousness”: the ability to see things both from the perspective of the dominant and from the perspective of the oppressed, and therefore to comparatively evaluate both perspectives (Harding 1991, Smith 1974, Collins 1990). Black women are “outsiders within,” having enough personal experience as insiders to know their social order, but enough critical distance to empower critique.
Access to the Feminist Standpoint. Every standpoint theory must offer an account of how one gains access to its situated knowledge. This depends on whether membership in the group whose perspective is privileged is defined objectively, in terms of one's position in a social structure, or subjectively, in terms of one's subjective identification as a member of the group. When group membership is defined objectively, it is neither necessary nor sufficient for gaining access to the privileged perspective. It is not sufficient, because one might be unaware of the fact or objective significance of being a member of the group. Members become aware of their objective group identity only by achieving a shared understanding of their predicament with other group members. This is the function of consciousness-raising groups in feminist practice (MacKinnon 1999). It is not necessary, because when a group is defined objectively, the facts that constitute the group as such and its interests are publicly accessible, so anyone can theorize phenomena in relation to the interests of that group. Thus, Marx theorized from the standpoint of the proletariat, even though he was not a worker. However, to the extent that the ground of epistemic privilege lies in the self-knowledge of autonomous agents, only those who participate in that agency can have first-personal agent knowledge. At this point, the site of epistemic privilege shifts from the group as defined objectively to the group defining itself as a collective political agent. The privileged standpoint is not that of women, but of feminists. Men can participate in the feminist movement, too. But they cannot assume a dominant role in defining (hence knowing) the aims of the feminist movement without defeating that movement, given that a constitutive aim of feminism is overcoming male dominance. When group membership is defined subjectively, then membership in the group is both necessary and sufficient to gain access to the perspective of the group. If subjectively identifying as a woman is necessary and sufficient to have a feminine cognitive style, as object-relations theory postulates, then all and only self-identified woman have access to the epistemically privileged standpoint. Similarly, Collins' (1990) version of black feminist epistemology rests on identity politics. However, most versions of standpoint theory represent the epistemically privileged standpoint as an achieved, not a given, perspective, requiring critical reflection on the power structures of society and the relations of one's group to it.
Goals of Feminist Standpoint Theory. Feminist standpoint theory is a type of critical theory, as this term was understood by the Frankfurt school of critical social theorists, from Adorno to Habermas. Critical theories aim to empower the oppressed to improve their situation. They therefore incorporate pragmatic constraints on theories of the social world. To serve their critical aim, social theories must (a) represent the social world in relation to the interests of the oppressed—i.e., those who are the subjects of study; (b) supply an account of that world which is accessible to the subjects of study, which enables them to understand their problems; and (c) supply an account of the world which is usable by the subjects to study to improve their condition. Critical theory is theory of, by, and for the subjects of study. These pragmatic features of critical theory raise the possibility that claims of superiority for particular theories might be based more on pragmatic than epistemological virtues (Harding 1991, Hartsock 1996). Even if a particular feminist theory cannot make good on the claim that it has privileged access to reality, it may offer true representations that are more useful to women than other truthful representations.
Criticisms of Feminist Standpoint Theory. Longino (1993b) argues that standpoint theory cannot provide a noncircular basis for deciding which standpoints have epistemic privilege. Bar On (1993) argues against grounding women's epistemic privilege in their oppression, via feminine cognitive styles. If the feminine ethics of care provides the epistemically privileged perspective on morality, then our access to moral knowledge is predicated on the continuation of existing gender relations, which produce this ethic. Grounding epistemic privilege in feminine cognitive styles therefore forces a choice between having ethical knowledge and living in a nonsexist society. Bar On also claims that the center-periphery model that underwrites the epistemic privilege of workers does not apply to women. Marx held that class conflict is the central phenomenon that drives all other forms of group conflict, including sexism, racism, imperialism, and national and religious conflict. So understanding class could yield an understanding of other dimensions of inequality. It is no longer plausible to hold that any group inequality is central to all the others; they intersect in complex ways (Crenshaw 1999). This entails that women cannot even have privileged access to understanding their own oppression, since this takes different forms for different women, depending on their race, sexual orientation, and so forth. This critique has been forcefully developed by feminist postmodernists, who question the very possibility of a unified standpoint of women, and see, behind the assertion of a universal woman's viewpoint, only the perspective of relatively privileged white women (Lugones & Spelman 1983).
General Postmodernist Themes. Postmodernism as a North American intellectual movement draws inspiration from a variety of French poststructuralist and postmodernist theorists, including Foucault, Lacan, Derrida, Lyotard, and Irigaray. It embodies a skeptical sensibility that questions attempts to transcend our situatedness by appeal to such ideas as universality, necessity, objectivity, rationality, essence, unity, totality, foundations, and ultimate Truth and Reality. It stresses the locality, partiality, contingency, instability, uncertainty, ambiguity and essential contestability of any particular account of the world, the self, and the good. Politically, the postmodernist emphasis on revealing the situatedness and contestability of any particular claim or system of thought is supposed to serve both critical and liberatory functions. It delegitimizes ideas that dominate and exclude by undermining their claims to transcendent justification. And it opens up space for imagining alternative possibilities that were obscured by those claims.
Although postmodernist themes are often expressed in an obscure jargon, they can be cast in terms more familiar to analytic philosophers. Postmodernists begin with ideas about language and systems of thought. They claim that (what we think of as) reality is “discursively constructed.” This is the linguistic version of the now inescapable (!) Kantian thought that our minds grasp things not as they are “in themselves” but only through concepts, signified by words. “The linguistic sign acts reflexively, not referentially” in a “discursive field.” This is a version of radical meaning holism: signs get their meaning not from their reference to external things but from their relations to all of the other signs in a system of discourse. Meaning holism entails that the introduction of new signs (or elimination of old ones) will change the meanings of the signs that were already in use. Signs therefore do not have a fixed meaning over time. This is a Heraclitean version of historicism: we cannot step into the same stream of thought twice. Together, these ideas support the “rejection of totalizing metanarratives.” There can be no complete, unified theory of the world that captures the whole truth about it. Any such theory will contain a definite set of terms. This entails that it cannot express all conceptual possibilities. For a discourse that contained different terms would contain meanings not available in the discursive field of the theory that claims completeness. Thus, the selection of any particular theory or narrative is an exercise of “power”—to exclude certain possibilities from thought and to authorize others.
Postmodernism extends these ideas about language to social practices more generally. The key idea underwriting this extension is that actions and practices are linguistic signs. Like words, they signify things beyond themselves by means of linguistic devices such as metaphor and metonymy. For example, the elevation of the judge's bench metaphorically signifies his superior authority over everyone else in the courtroom. This permits an analysis of social practices and behaviors as exhibiting the same structure and dynamics as language itself. Just as words get their meaning from their relations to other words rather than from their relation to some external reality, so do actions get their meaning from their relations to other actions, rather than from their relation to some pre-linguistic realm of human nature or natural law. Thus, the superior authority of the judge consists in the conventions of deference others manifest in their actions toward him. It is not underwritten by a supposed natural tendency of humans to obey authority, or by an underlying normatively objective authority. The latter thoughts express essentialist and objectivist power plays, attempts to foreclose contests over practices by fixing them in a supposedly extra-linguistic reality. Such attempts are not only objectionable but futile, because the meanings of actions are constantly being subverted by other actions that, in changing the context of the former actions, changes their meanings. This is why postmodernists celebrate ironic, parodic, and campy renditions of conventional behaviors as politically liberating (Butler 1993). If Marx lamented that history repeats itself twice—first as tragedy, second as farce—postmodernists revel in the same process.
Postmodernists view the self as likewise constituted by signs that have meaning only in relation to other signs. There is no unified self that underlies the play of a stream of signifiers. This is a linguistic version of Hume's fragmented stream-of-consciousness account of the self, but with a social twist. Signs, unlike Hume's simple ideas, form language, which is socially constructed. Thus, although subjectivity is constituted through the production of signs, the self is not free to make of these whatever it wants, but finds itself entangled in a web of meanings not of its own creation. Our identities are socially imposed, not autonomously created. However, this does not foreclose the possibility of agency, because we occupy multiple social identities (e.g., a woman might be a worker, a mother, lesbian, Mexican, and so forth). The tensions among these conflicting identities open up spaces for disrupting the discursive systems that construct us.
Because, in its philosophy of language, words refer to concepts rather than things in the world, postmodernism reproduces in linguistic terms some of the same epistemological conundrums posed in the history of modern philosophy by the veil of ideas. This generates a tendency toward idealism in both traditions. However, given the constant flux of meanings generated by holism, these tendencies cannot secure the certainty or stability that empiricists thought they could attain by resorting to idealism. The more careful practitioners of postmodernism resist wholesale idealism. Claims that bodies, matter, or the objects investigated by the natural sciences are “discursively constructed” or “socially constructed” do not assert that the external world would disappear if people stopped talking about it. Rather, they assert a kind of nominalism: that the world does not dictate the categories we use to describe it, that innumerable incompatible ways of classifying the world are available to us, and therefore that the selection of any one theory is a choice that cannot be justified by appeal to “objective” truth or reality. Even the ways we draw our distinctions between mind and body, ideas and objects, discourse and reality, are contestable.
Feminist Postmodernism. Within feminism, postmodernist ideas have been deployed against theories that purport to justify sexist practices—notably, ideologies that claim that observed differences between men and women are natural and necessary, or that women have an essence that explains and justifies their subordination. The oft-cited claim that gender is socially or discursively constructed—that it is an effect of social practices and systems of meaning that can be disrupted—finds one of its homes in postmodernism (Butler 1990). However, postmodernism has figured more prominently in internal critiques of feminist theories. One of the most important trends in feminist thinking in the past twenty years has been exposing and responding to exclusionary tendencies within feminism itself. Women of color and lesbian women have argued that mainstream feminist theories have ignored their distinct problems and perspectives (Collins 1990; Hull, Scott and Smith, 1982; Lorde 1984). Feminist postmodernism represents both a vehicle for and response to these critiques. It underwrites a critique of the concept “woman”—the central analytical category of feminist theory. And it proposes perspective-shifting as a strategy for negotiating the proliferation of theories produced by differently situated women.
The critique of the concept “woman.” Feminist postmodernists have criticized many of the leading feminist theories of gender and patriarchy as essentialist (Butler 1990, Flax 1990, Spelman 1988). Essentialism here refers to any theory that claims to identify a universal, transhistorical, necessary cause or constitution of gender identity or patriarchy. The objection to essentialism is fundamentally political: in claiming that gender identity is one thing or has one cause, such theories convert discursively constructed facts into norms, difference into deviance. They either exclude women who don't conform to the theory from the class of true “women,” or else represent them as inferior. The critiques of feminist theories by lesbian women and women of color have reinforced skepticism about the unity presumed in the category “woman” by highlighting the intersectionality of identities of gender, race, class, and sexual orientation. The chief faultlines for the fragmentation of the category “woman” have thus been the other identity formations along which social inequalities are constructed.
This critique of “woman” as a unified object of theorizing entails that “woman” also cannot constitute a unified subject of knowing (Lugones & Spelman 1983). The theories of universal gender identity under attack are ones in which the authors, all white middle class heterosexual women, could see themselves. Critics claim that the authors fail to acknowledge their own situatedness and hence the ways they are implicated in and reproduce power relations—in this case, the presumptuous authority of white middle class heterosexual women to define “the standpoint of women”—to speak for all other women and define who they are. Feminist standpoint theorists, who claim an epistemic privilege on behalf of their standpoint, are thereby unmasked as asserting a race and class privilege over other women.
Feminist postmodernists draw two lessons from this critique. First, universal claims about women, gender, and patriarchy should be avoided. Second, feminist standpoint theory's project of identifying a single epistemically privileged perspective is fundamentally flawed, an unjustified assertion of power in the name of an unattainable objectivity. This lesson applies to subaltern feminist standpoints as well. The assertion of a black feminist standpoint, for example, objectionably essentializes black women. Once the postmodernist critique of essentialism is granted, there is no logical stopping point in the proliferation of perspectives.
Perspective shifting. Feminist postmodernism thus envisions our epistemic situation as characterized by a permanent plurality of perspectives, none of which can claim objectivity—that is, transcendence of situatedness to a “view from nowhere.” This position has sometimes been characterized as relativist. Haraway (1991) replies that it rejects both objectivism and relativism for the ways they let knowers escape responsibility for the representations they construct. To claim objectivity for a representation is to claim that “the world made me represent things this way.” To claim relativism is to claim that “my identity (my situation) made me represent things this way (and my identity/situation is not inferior to yours).” Both positions disclaim the active participation of the knower in constructing her representations. Even a photograph, the paradigm of an “objective” representation, reflects the photographer's choice of film, lenses, frames, exposure, and so forth. But the resort to a relativism of identity is no better. In asserting the equality of all perspectives, it claims immunity from the critiques of differently positioned others, and complacency in one's own position. Although it acknowledges the dependence of a knower's representations on the particulars of her situation, it claims that she had no choice about that. Postmodernists, however, reject the fixity and unity of personal identity on which relativism rests. People are not epistemically trapped inside their cultures, their gender, their race, or any other identity. They can choose to think from other perspectives. Thus, although we will always have a plurality of perspectives, their constitution is constantly shifting rather than static, and there is no stable correspondence between individuals and perspectives.
Negotiating the bewildering array of situated knowledges therefore involves two types of epistemic practice. One is acceptance of responsibility, which involves acknowledging the choices of situation that entered into the construction of one's representations (Haraway 1991), and considering how one's situation affects the content of one's representations (Harding 1993). The second is “world traveling” (Lugones 1987) or “mobile positioning”—trying to see things from many other perspectives. Mobile positioning can never be transparent or innocent. Imagining oneself in another's situation is full of risks. It requires sensitive engagement with and sympathy for the others who occupy those positions. Both transform situated knowing into a critical and responsible practice.
Criticisms of Feminist Postmodernism. Both key features of feminist postmodernism—the rejection of “woman” as a category of analysis, and the infinite fragmentation of perspectives—are controversial within feminist theory. A wholesale opposition to large-scale generalizations about women seems to arbitrarily preclude a critical analysis of large-scale social forces that critically affect women (Benhabib 1995). That women in different social positions may experience sexism differently does not entail that they have nothing in common—they still suffer from sexism (MacKinnon 2000). Intersectionality, rather than being a basis for dissolving the category “woman,” may be accommodated through a structural analysis of gender that allows for racialized and otherwise particularized modes of sexist oppression (Haslanger 2000). The postmodernist alternative of fragmentation and multiplicity threatens both the possibility of analytical focus (it is impossible to keep all axes of difference in play at once) and of politically effective coalition building among women with different identities. Carried to its logical conclusion, feminist postmodernism dissolves all groups, thereby reproducing the individualism of the Enlightenment epistemology it claims to repudiate. And the idea of mobile positioning may simply reproduce the objectivism and ideas of autonomy that postmodernists claim to reject, only now in the guise of “the view from everywhere” rather than “the view from nowhere” (Bordo 1990). Critics argue that feminists would do better if they forthrightly appropriated ideals of human rights and autonomy, rather than embracing “the death of the subject” in the fragmentation of the self (Benhabib 1995). Despite these difficulties, postmodernism remains a powerful current in feminist epistemology, due to the acknowledgment by all feminists that a plurality of situated knowledges appears to be an inescapable consequence of social differentiation and embodiment.
Relations of Feminist Empiricism to Empiricism in general. Empiricism is the view that experience provides the sole, or at least the primary, justification for all knowledge. From the classical empiricists to some early twentieth-century theorists, empiricists held that the content of experience could be described in fixed, basic, theory-neutral terms—for example, in terms of sense-data. Most also regarded philosophy as a discipline that could provide a transcendent or external justification for empirical or scientific methods. Quine revolutionized empiricism by rejecting both of these ideas. For Quine, observation is thoroughly theory-laden. It is cast in terms of complex concepts that cannot be immediately given in experience, all of which are potentially subject to revision in light of further experience (Quine 1963). And epistemology, far from providing an extrascientific vindication of natural science, is simply another project within science, in which we empirically investigate our own practices of inquiry (Quine 1969). In these two respects, feminist empiricists are the daughters of Quine. However, Quine accepted a sharp division between facts and values that feminist empiricists argue cannot be sustained within a thoroughly naturalized empiricism. Feminist empiricists are deeply engaged in considering how feminist values can legitimately inform empirical inquiry, and how scientific methods can be improved in light of feminist demonstrations of sex bias in currently accepted methods. Their version of naturalized epistemology therefore does not follow Quine in reducing epistemology to nonnormative psychological investigations, but rather upholds the roles of value judgments in rigorous empirical inquiry (Campbell 1998, Nelson 1990). Quine also presupposes an individualist account of inquiry; his preferred reduction basis for naturalized epistemology is behavioral and neuro- psychology. Feminist empiricists are concerned with the impact on inquiry of social practices relating to gender, race, class and other bases of inequality. They therefore take sociology, history, and science studies seriously. Most also advocate a socialized epistemology, in which inquiry is treated as a fundamentally social process and the basic subjects of knowledge may even be communities or networks of individuals.
The Paradoxes of Bias and Social Construction. The central problematics of feminist empiricism can be captured in two apparent paradoxes. First, much feminist science criticism consists in exposing the androcentric and sexist biases in scientific research, especially in theories about women, sexuality, and gender differences. The force of this criticism seems to rest on a prior empiricist commitment to the view that bias is epistemically bad—that it leads to false theories. Yet, advocates of feminist science urge that feminist values inform scientific inquiry. This amounts to a recommendation that science incorporate certain biases into its operations. Feminist empiricists need to reconcile these conflicting claims. This is known as the paradox of bias. Second, and relatedly, much feminist science criticism is devoted to exposing the influence of social and political factors on scientific inquiry. Scientists advocate androcentric and sexist theories because they are influenced by the sexist values of the wider society. This would seem to imply that, to eliminate these social biases, feminists adopt an individualist epistemology. Instead, feminist epistemologists stress the social construction of knowledge. They urge, not that inquirers insulate themselves from social influences, but that they restructure scientific practices to be open to different social influences. This can be called the paradox of social construction.
Feminist empiricists argue that the key to dissolving both paradoxes is to undermine the assumptions that underlie them: that biases, political values, and social factors can influence inquiry only by displacing the influence of evidence, logic, and whatever other purely cognitive factors tend to lead to true theories. Not all bias is epistemically bad (Antony 1993). There are three general strategies for showing this, which may be called pragmatic, procedural, and moral realist. The pragmatic approach stresses the plurality of aims that inquiry serves. Inquiry seeks truths, or at least empirically adequate representations, but which truths any particular inquiry seeks depends on the uses to which those representations will be put, many of which are practical and derived from social interests. The paradoxes are dissolved by showing how responsible inquiry respects a division of labor between the functions of evidence and social values—the evidence helping inquirers track the truth, the social values helping inquirers construct representations out of those truths that serve the pragmatic aims of inquiry (Anderson 1995b). This view may be joined with a view of nature as rich, complex, and messy. No single theory captures the whole structure of reality, since different ways of classifying phenomena will reveal different patterns useful to different practical interests (Longino 2001). The procedural approach argues that epistemically bad biases can be kept in check through an appropriate social organization of inquiry. A social organization that holds people with different biases accountable to one another will be able to weed out bad biases, even if no individual on her own can be free of bias (Longino 1990). This view may be joined with the idea that the subject of knowledge (Nelson 1993), epistemic rationality (Solomon 2001) or objectivity (Longino 1990, 2001) is the epistemic community, not the individual. The moral realist approach argues that moral, social and political value judgments have truth-values, and that feminist values are true. Inquiry informed by feminist values therefore does not displace attention to the evidence, because the evidence vindicates these values (Campbell 1998).
Feminist empiricists appeal to the pragmatist tradition to undermine the sharp dichotomy between fact and value (Antony 1993; Nelson 1993). They argue (compatibly with other pragmatists, such as Hilary Putnam), that Quine's arguments about the underdetermination of theory by evidence lead to a view of facts as partially constituted by values, and values by facts. In the absence of a sharp distinction between facts and values, it cannot be argued that inquiry explicitly motivated by feminist values is in principle opposed to the truth. Whether any particular feminist, or sexist, theory is true or false will depend on empirical investigation informed by epistemic norms—norms which may themselves be reformed in light of the merits of the theories they generate. This is the project of naturalized epistemology, whereby the vindication of norms of inquiry is sought not outside, but within, ordinary empirical investigation. Feminist empiricist investigations of the interaction of facts and values are further discussed below. Feminist empiricist explorations of how norms of inquiry should be constituted to enhance objectivity are also discussed below.
Criticisms of Feminist Empiricism. Within feminist theory, the intellectual traditions and training of standpoint and postmodernist epistemologists have not kept track of the radical changes in the empiricist tradition inspired by Quine and further developed by feminist empiricists. Consequently, some criticisms of what is called “feminist empiricism” by other feminist theorists do not fit what feminists who call themselves “feminist empiricists” believe. For example, feminist postmodernists criticize feminist empiricists for presuming the existence of an individual, transhistorical subject of knowledge outside of social determination (Harding 1990), even though the naturalized epistemology that feminist empiricists adopt has long since abandoned that conception of knowers in favor of viewing knowers as socially situated. Feminist empiricists are also criticized for accepting an uncritical concept of experience (Scott 1991), even though feminist empiricists accept the theory- and value-laden character of evidence and hence the critical revisability of descriptions of experience in light of new evidence, theoretical, and normative reflections. Feminist empiricists have also been criticized for naively holding that that science will correct the errors and biases in its theories about women and other subordinated groups all by itself, without the aid of feminist values or insights (Harding 1986, 1991). This contrasts with the actual position of those who call themselves feminist empiricists, who argue that science cannot claim to attain objective knowledge of gendered beings or our gendered social world without actively including feminist inquirers as equals in the collective project of inquiry (Longino 1993a, 1993b). More pointedly, the standpoint theorist Hundleby (1997) criticizes feminist empiricism for overlooking the vital role of feminist political activity, in particular, the development of oppositional consciousness, as a superior source of hypotheses and evidence for challenging sexist and androcentric theories.
The history of feminist interventions into most disciplines follows a common pattern. Feminist inquiry begins as a critique of accepted disciplinary methods, assumptions, and canons. As it matures, it develops constructive projects of its own. The history of feminism and science follows this pattern. In the empirical sciences, the pattern helps us see how feminist epistemology negotiates the tension between the two poles in the paradox of bias that lies at the core of the feminist empiricist project. Feminist science critics focus on identifying androcentric and sexist biases in the actual practice of science. This practice began by representing bias as a source of error. But as philosophers and historians of science joined the practice of feminist science criticism, they developed a more sophisticated way of understanding some biases as epistemic resources. Advocates of feminist science develop this theme in seeking to practice science in light of and in the service of feminist aims and values. They thereby represent feminist biases as epistemic resources.
Feminist Science Criticism: Bias as Error. Feminist science criticism originated in the critiques that working biologists, psychologists, and other scientists made of the androcentric and sexist biases and practices in their own disciplines—especially of theories about women and gender differences that legitimate sexist practices. Exemplary works in this tradition include Bleier (1984), Fausto-Sterling (1985), Hrdy (1981), Leacock (1981), Sherif (1987), and Tavris (1992). The criticism takes many forms. (1) Studies of how the exclusion or marginalization of women scientists impair scientific progress. For example, the failure to provide Barbara McClintock with professional standing, resources, and access to graduate students delayed incorporation of her pioneering discoveries of genetic transposition into mainstream biology (Keller 1983). (2) Studies of how the applications of science and technology disadvantage women and other vulnerable groups, treat their interests as less important, or express contempt for them. Examples include eugenics (Hubbard 1990), and economic development policies that reinforce gender hierarchy by offering training and resources to men, but not women, in developing countries (Waring 1990). Such practical ill-effects of science applications can be traced in part to epistemic defects in the underlying science—to bogus concepts of race in the case of eugenics, and to failures to recognize women's work as contributing to the “economy” in the case of sexist development policies. (3) Studies of how science has ignored women and gender, and how turning attention to these issues may require revisions of accepted theories. Hays-Gilpin and Whitley (1998) document particularly dramatic examples of this in the field of archaeology. (4) Studies of how biases toward working with “masculine” cognitive styles—for example, toward centralized, hierarchical control models of causation as opposed to “feminine” (contextual, interactive, diffused) models—have impaired scientific understanding, for example, in studies of slime-mold (Keller 1985b) and molecular biology (Spanier 1995). (5) Studies of how research into sex differences and women's and men's “natures” that reinforces sex stereotypes and sexist practices fail to live up to standards of good science—for example, in drawing inferences on the basis of miniscule sample sizes or correlations not tested against an appropriately designed control group, or in ignoring disconfirming data (Fausto-Sterling 1985, Fine 2010, Tavris 1992). Gender bias may also be revealed in the conceptual framework of the theory in question—for example, in representing subjective gender identification as a dichotomous variable, thereby eliminating other possibilities, such as androgyny, from consideration (Bem 1993).
In all of these cases, gender bias is represented as a cause of error, or at least delay in recognizing the truth. But, as philosophers and historians of science joined the practice of feminist science criticism, alternative models of gender bias were developed, sometimes in cooperation with working scientists. Exemplary works of feminist science criticism by philosophers and historians of science include Haraway (1989), Harding (1986, 1991, 1993, 1998), Lloyd (2006), Longino & Doell (1983), Schiebinger (1989), and Wylie (1996). Although some of this work is devoted to exposing errors caused by sexist and androcentric bias, some of it is devoted rather to showing how the interests in technological control that underlie the modern practice of science limit its scope and what it takes to be significant knowledge (Lacey 1999, Merchant 1980, Tiles 1987). Another core project of feminist science criticism is demonstrating that the evidence assembled on behalf of the theories under study does not compel assent to the theories. The theories go well beyond the data that support them, with the gap being filled by sexist and androcentric assumptions. Thus, Haraway (1989) uses the tools of literary theory to demonstrate how hypotheses in primatology and evolutionary theory depend on narrative conventions (for example, casting the transition from ape to hominid as a heroic drama) and tropes (for example, casting primates as mirrors of human nature). While these narrative conventions and tropes have considerable persuasive power, their appeal is rhetorical, and the evidence does not compel their selection. Beyond this negative critique, feminist science critics are interested in uncovering and defending the viability, and in some cases, the superiority, of alternative nonsexist and feminist theories of the phenomena in question.
To sort out these different accounts of the cognitive role of gender bias, it is helpful to distinguish four dimensions in the evaluation of research programs: (1) conceptual criticism; (2) methodological criticism; (3) evaluating the relation of the available evidence to the program's hypotheses (does the evidence tend to confirm or disconfirm them?); (4) comparing the program's theory to rival theories in terms of their empirical adequacy and other epistemic values. Bias in a research program is revealed as error to the extent that it is shown to generate or rest on (1) confused or nonreferring concepts that purport to refer (for example, the concept of “race” as biological subspecies of human beings); (2) violation of valid methodological principles; (3) belief in a theory in the face of a lack of evidential support for it, or strong evidence against it; or (4) continued commitment to a theory with some evidential support, even when some rival theories dominate it with respect to all epistemic values, including empirical adequacy. Biases shown to generate error in this way should be stopped, through better training of scientists or the adoption and enforcement of methodological principles designed to check their influence. Feminist science criticism in the bias-as-error mode parallels the heuristics-and-biases tradition of psychology (Kahneman, Slovic and Tversky 1982), a tradition which has already been taken up in naturalized epistemology and philosophy of science (e.g., Solomon 2001). On a normative level, it generates methodological principles for engaging in nonsexist science. Exemplary normative (methodological) works generated by feminist science criticism include Altmann (1974) and Eichler (1988).
Bias in a research program is shown to be limiting or partial, but not necessarily erroneous, to the extent that avoids clear error and generates (1) a limited range of concepts and/or (2) uses a limited range of methods, (3) has some empirical successes, while (4) rival theories, depending on different concepts and/or methods, can also claim to avoid clear error and to possess some empirical successes or other epistemic virtues not possessed by the research program in question. Such biases are legitimate: it is rationally acceptable to conduct scientific inquiry under the influence of such biases. Indeed, empirical investigations into the workings of the human mind strongly suggest that we have no choice but to think in accordance with some biases. Moreover, the underdetermination of theory by data implies that without some biases, we would be unable to make sense of our world at all (Antony 1993). When biases are partial but not clearly erroneous, they serve a positive generative function: they produce new concepts, methods, and hypotheses that open up new aspects of the world for understanding. They are resources for enhancing our grasp of the world. From a normative point of view, feminist philosophers of science argue that we have an epistemic interest in ensuring that certain limiting biases do not dominate research to the exclusion of other generative biases that would yield rival theories possessing a different range of important empirical successes. The point in exposing the androcentric and sexist biases lying behind certain research theories is not to show that they are false (they might in the end be empirically vindicated), but to make salient the room for alternative programs not based on such biases.
Feminist Science: Bias as Resource. Most advocates of feminist science argue, in this vein, that scientific inquiries informed by feminist values are based on legitimate, generative limiting biases. They argue not that feminist sciences should exclude other ways of doing science, but that feminist sciences should be included as among the legitimate choices available to investigators. This picture of science is pluralistic, compatible with the postmodern rejection of “totalizing narratives,” but more inclined than postmodernists to explain the persistence of pluralism in the social and applied sciences in scientific realist terms: science is disunified because the world is rich with a multitude of cross-cutting structures, which no single theoretical vocabulary can capture. Different communities have interests in different aspects of reality, so leaving them free to follow their interests will reveal different patterns and structures in the world (Harding 1998; Longino 2001).
Against this pluralistic view, some advocates of feminist science define it in terms of adherence to specific ontologies and methodologies expressing a “feminine” cognitive style (Duran 1991, Keller 1983, 1985a). On this conception, for example, the content of any feminist theory should have a relational rather than an atomistic ontology, favor the concrete over the abstract, avoid generalizations about women in favor of exposing the richness and particularity of different women's lives and perspectives, and so forth. Its methods should encompass intuition, emotional engagement, and other cognitive styles associated with a feminine sensibility. This view has had perhaps its greatest impact in feminist works attacking quantitative methods in the social sciences. For example, Stanley & Wise (1983) argue that only qualitative methods that accept women's reports of their experiences in their own terms, refusing to generalize, can uphold feminist values of respecting differences among women and avoiding the replication of power differences between researchers and research subjects.
Pluralist feminist scientists and philosophers of science have vigorously contested these attempts to define feminist science in terms preferred content and “feminine” method. They argue that many questions of interest to feminists are best answered with quantitative methods (Jayaratne & Stewart, 1991), and indeed that feminists may properly make use of a wide range of methods (Harding 1987, Nielsen 1990, Reinharz 1992). Feminist science is not defined by its content, but rather by the pragmatic interests that generate the questions it asks. (Sometimes this distinction is cast as one between “feminist science” and “doing science as a feminist.”) Feminists are interested in uncovering the causes of women's oppression, revealing the dynamics of gender in society, and producing knowledge that women can use to overcome the disadvantages to which they are subject. Forms of knowledge that simply valorize the “feminine” may not be helpful to women who would be better off not having norms of femininity imposed on them. In any event, feminist pluralists argue that advocates of “feminine” science have not shown that feminine cognitive styles and ontologies are, as a general matter, better able to track the truth (Longino 1989).
If feminist science amounts to “doing science as a feminist”—that is, using science to answer questions generated by feminist interests—one may ask whether it differs in any substantive respect from the science that is already practiced by nonfeminists. Feminist pluralists reply that scientific practice is already highly disunified; philosophies of the special sciences reveal great variations in methods, background assumptions, sources of evidence, cognitive values, and interpretive strategies (Longino 2001). So the dichotomy between feminist and mainstream science presupposed by the question is false. Doing biology, primatology, anthropology, archaeology, psychology, economics, history or any other special science as a feminist—that is, with the aim of answering feminist questions—has resulted in many and various local methodological innovations, discoveries of new sources of evidence, and developments of alternative theories (see, for example, Bell, Caplan and Karim 1993; Haraway 1989; Hays-Gilpin and Whitley 1998; Nielsen 1990). These are then made available to inquirers asking other, nonfeminist questions. Thus, there is no presumption that certain methods, evidence, etc. are uniquely available to serve feminist cognitive interests.
Nevertheless, there are some common threads in “doing science as a feminist” that tend to favor certain types of representation over others (Longino 1994). Feminists are interested in epistemic practices that reveal the operations of gender in the world, and opportunities for women to resist and transform these operations. One way gender bias operates to reinforce sexism is through the perpetuation of categorical, dichotomous thinking which represents masculinity and femininity as “opposites,” femininity as inferiority, and nonconformity to gender norms as deviant. This gives feminists an interest in the value of “ontological heterogeneity”—using categories that permit the observation of within-group variation and that resist the representation of difference from the group mean as a form of deviance. Gender bias also reinforces sexism through single-factor causal models that attribute seemingly intrinsic powers to men by neglecting their wider context. The value of “complexity of relationship” favors the development of causal models that facilitate the representation of features of the social context that support male power, including female participation and complicity. Other feminist cognitive values involve the accessibility of knowledge: feminist favor knowledge that “diffuses power” in being cast in a form usable to people in subordinate positions, who usually lack technical expertise and access to expensive equipment. This interest underlies the appropriate technology movement in developing countries. For similar reasons, feminists are more interested in knowledge applicable to meeting human needs than in research programs with little prospect of advancing these interests. These values are feminist in the sense of advancing feminist interests, but their usefulness is not confined to feminism. None of these feminist cognitive values displace or compete with the search for truth, because doing science as a feminist, like doing science with any other interest in mind (for example, medical or military interests) involves commitment to the cognitive value of producing empirically adequate theories.
The Challenge of Value-Neutrality. The theory and practice of feminist science raises the question of how any inquiry shaped by moral, social, and political interests can simultaneously be faithful to the fundamental epistemic interest in truth. Against the project of feminist science, many philosophers hold that true science is neutral among social, moral, and political values. Lacey (1999) usefully distinguishes the following claims of value-neutrality: (1) Autonomy: science progresses best when uninfluenced by social/political movements and values. (2) Neutrality: scientific theories do not imply or presuppose any judgments about noncognitive values, nor do scientific theories serve any particular noncognitive values more fully than others. (3) Impartiality: The only grounds for accepting a theory are its relations to the evidence. These grounds are impartial among rival noncognitive values.
Of these claims, neutrality is the most dubious, because it depicts the grounds for accepting social, political and moral values as utterly detached from evidence about human potentialities and about what happens when people try to realize these values in practice. If this were true, then the defenders of keeping mathematics a male preserve would not have bothered arguing that women were not intellectually capable of doing mathematics and that their uteri would wander if they tried to do it—and feminists would not have bothered disputing those claims. Neutrality is less a claim about the character of science than about the justification of social and political values. As a categorical claim about the latter, it is false. Taylor (1985) and Tiles & Oberdiek (1995) show, in detailed case studies, how scientific theories do serve some social and political values more than others.
The core claim of value-neutrality, however, is impartiality. The thought that underwrites impartiality is that scientific theories aim at the truth, at what is the case, whereas value judgments deal with what ought to be the case. Even if neutrality is false, because facts constitute part of the warrant for value judgments, the converse is not true. Only facts can supply the warrant for other facts. Autonomy, in turn, is defended as a means to ensure that science satisfies the demands of impartiality. Social and political movements are thought to threaten autonomy because their primary influence on science is thought to consist in pressuring scientists to ignore the facts and validate their worldviews. Defenders of impartiality object to the very idea of feminist science because they view it as threatening impartiality.
The Basic Underdetermination Argument. Feminist empiricists reply to the challenge of value-neutrality by extending Quine's argument that theory is underdetermined by evidence (Longino 1990, Nelson 1993). Any body of observations counts as evidence for particular hypotheses only in conjunction with certain background assumptions. Vary the background assumptions, and the same observations will support quite different hypotheses. For example, the failure to observe stellar parallax in the 17th century was taken as evidence that the Earth stands still by geocentrists, and as evidence that the stars are very far away by heliocentrists. No logical principle stops scientists from choosing different background assumptions against which to interpret their observations. In practice, scientists face some constraints in the selection of background assumptions, based on cognitive values such as simplicity and conservatism (resistance to revising deeply entrenched assumptions on which many other beliefs depend). But with respect to questions still under active investigation, these cognitive values rarely reduce the scope for choice down to one option, and their interpretation and weights are contestable in any event (geocentrism was overturned only by overriding conservatism). Feminist empiricists conclude that, given the scope for choice in background assumptions, no logical or methodological principle categorically forbids scientists from selecting their background assumptions on account of their fit with social and political values, or indeed any other preference or interest. It follows that feminist scientists may select their background assumptions on account of their fit with feminist values.
Putnam (1981) has advanced a similar argument, carried to feminist conclusions by Nelson (1993). Value judgments operate like factual judgments in the web of belief, such that values judgments figure in the background assumptions that support factual judgments, and vice-versa. If the web of belief integrates judgments of fact and of value, then there is no clear distinction between these two judgment types. So there is no good argument against permitting feminist values to shape scientific judgments.
One must be careful not to overstate what the underdetermination argument shows. As Intemann (2005) argues, it does not show that contextual values judgments are needed as background assumptions in science. The underdetermination argument simply pries open a potential space for social values in science. It is not sufficient to demonstrate the legitimacy of any particular ways of introducing feminist values into science. Feminist science critics and feminist scientists agree that there are cognitively illegitimate as well as cognitively legitimate ways for social values to influence science. That is the basis for distinguishing error-generating biases from biases that serve as cognitive resources, a distinction required to dissolve the paradox of bias. Standing alone, the underdetermination argument does not help us discriminate one from the other. Additional criteria are needed.
One lesson about what to look for can be drawn from earlier debates over the theory-ladenness of observation. It is now generally agreed that the theory-laden character of observations does not threaten their status as evidence for a theory, provided that the theories presupposed in those observations do not immediately include the very theory being tested by those observations. Circularity, at least of a narrow sort, should be avoided. Similarly, the chief danger of value-laden inquiry is a kind of circularity of wishful thinking or dogmatism (Anderson 2004). The value-laden character of the background assumptions linking evidence to theories should not foreclose the possibility of discovering that one's values are mistaken, because (for example) they are based on erroneous beliefs about human potentialities and the consequences of putting certain values into practice. (Notice that it makes sense to worry about the danger of wishful thinking only if the neutrality thesis is false.) If women really can't do math, or their uteri really do migrate when they try (causing hysteria, as the sexist theory held), the values incorporated into feminist science should not close off this possibility in advance. Although, in setting out to test these sexist hypotheses, women scientists presuppose their own mathematical competence, this does not preclude their discovering otherwise. They need only open their calculations to public criticism to keep this possibility alive.
The Basic Pragmatic Strategy. The above reflections provide a standard for determining when socially value-laden inquiry has gone wrong. They do not explain what positive epistemic influence they could have. How could they function as an epistemic resource? Some feminist epistemologists at this point stress the pragmatic functions of inquiry (Anderson 1995b). All inquiry begins with a question. Questions may be motivated not only by the purely cognitive interest of curiosity, but by various practical interests in understanding the nature and causes of situations one judges to be problematic, and in finding out how to improve those situations. The resulting product of inquiry should therefore be shaped to these practical-cum-cognitive interests. The pragmatic aspects of inquiry introduce new dimensions of evaluation to theories. We can ask not only whether the theories are backed by sufficient evidence to warrant their acceptance, but whether they are cast in forms that are cognitively accessible to the situated knowers who want to use these theories, whether they are useful to these knowers (help them solve their problems), and whether they answer the questions they were designed to answer. A set of statements can be true, yet fail these pragmatic tests.
Even the staunchest defenders of the value-neutrality of science acknowledge that pragmatic factors legitimately influence the choice of objects of study. In this function, then, pragmatic interests, including social and political values, are epistemic resources: inquirers with different interests will study and make discoveries about different aspects of the world. But the defenders of value-neutral science contend that once inquirers decide where to cast their flashlight, what gets lit up is determined entirely by the nature of the world. Feminist epistemologists argue that the light of practical interests penetrates more deeply into what is discovered than this. Knowers (subjects) play a more active role in constituting the object of knowledge than the flashlight metaphor suggests. (This is one thing feminist epistemologists mean when they say they reject “the subject-object dichotomy”.) “Constitution” has two senses, representational and causal. In the representational sense, knowers constitute the object of knowledge in choosing the terms in which they represent it, and in defining the context in which it is represented as operating. If knowing is like seeing, all seeing is a form of “seeing as”—and different interests will make us see the “same” things differently (Longino 1990). This is a straightforward implication of the fact of situated knowing. In the causal sense, some representations have a causal impact on what is represented. When what we are representing is ourselves, uptake of our self-representations will change who we are and what we do. This follows from our agency, which is the determination to govern ourselves by our self-understandings. This is sometimes what is meant by the claim that subjects, or their identities, are “socially constructed.”
The basic pragmatic strategy for defending feminist science, or any inquiry shaped by social and political values, is to show how the pragmatic interests of that inquiry license or require a particular mode of influence of values on the process, product, and uptake of the product of inquiry, while at the same time leaving appropriate room for evidence to play its warranting role. Values and evidence play different, cooperative roles in properly conducted inquiry; values do not compete with evidence for the determination of belief (Anderson 1995b, 2004).
A Catalogue of Types of Legitimate Influence of Social Values in Science. Feminist philosophers of science stress the variety of roles for social and political values in science, and the contingency of their effects (Wylie and Nelson 2007). We must examine the actual operation of particular values in particular scientific investigations and judge, on a case by case basis, whether the values are closing off the possibility of discovering unwelcome facts, leading scientists to reason dogmatically, or insulating their findings from critical scrutiny, or whether the values are enabling the discovery of new facts—whether they are, in short, obstructing or facilitating the search for knowledge. Such judgments are contextual and subject to revision in light of new evidence. What follows is a catalogue of types of influence of social values that feminist epistemologists and philosophers of science have argued may in principle legitimately influence theory choice (although whether their influence is epistemically good or bad in a particular case requires further investigation).
Selection and weighting of cognitive values. Kuhn (1977) argued that scientists need to appeal to cognitive values to take up the slack between theory and evidence. His list of cognitive values included accuracy (empirical adequacy or truth), scope, simplicity, fruitfulness, internal consistency and consistency with other beliefs (conservatism). As noted above, Longino (1994) argues that feminists have reason to prefer theories that manifest other cognitive values, such as diffusion of power. Diffusion of power, like simplicity, is not a truth-oriented cognitive value. Both count as cognitive values because they make theories cognitively accessible, comprehensible to our finite minds. Diffusion of power recognizes that cognitive accessibility is relative to the situation of the knower. (Longino's characterization of other values of feminist science, such as ontological heterogeneity and complexity of relationship, as “cognitive” values is something of a misnomer—these fit better under the rubrics of classification and models, below.) Both simplification and diffusion of power stand in tension with truth, in that theories that embody them not only ignore many complex, messy truths, but may even make false claims. Whether this is bad depends on whether the truths ignored or the inaccuracies embraced are important, and this can be judged only in relation to the interests of the investigator, or the interests that the investigation ought to serve. All legitimate research programs must seek to incorporate the value of empirical adequacy, which requires at least that theories try to approximate the truth. How much accuracy this requires depends on how much the expected usefulness of the knowledge will be compromised by larger margins of error. The situation and pragmatic interests of the inquirer or of the potential users of a theory may therefore legitimately affect the selection and weighting of cognitive values in theory choice.
Standards of Proof. By convention, social scientists reject the null hypothesis (that observed results in a statistical study reflect mere chance variation in the sample) only for P-values < 5%, an arbitrary level of statistical significance. Bayesians and others argue that the level of statistical significance should vary, depending on the relative costs of type I error (believing something false) and type II error (failing to believe something true). In medicine, clinical trials are routinely stopped and results accepted as genuine notwithstanding much higher P-values, if the results are dramatic enough and the estimated costs to patients of not acting on them are considered high enough. (The cost of not providing a potentially effective treatment may be death, while the cost of providing a useless treatment may be small.) This practice explicitly incorporates social value judgments in the standard of proof required before results are accepted. Hare-Mustin and Maracek (1994) argue, by parallel reasoning, that whether studies that find gender differences, or that fail to find them, should be accepted depends on the relative costs of Alpha Bias (exaggerating differences) and Beta Bias (neglecting differences) in the context at hand.
Classification. The ways observed phenomena are classified may legitimately depend on the values of the researcher. In medicine, the distinction between health and disease reflects moral judgments about human welfare and appropriate ways of dealing with problems, as well as judgments about causation. A condition regarded as bad for human beings is not classified as a disease unless some kind of medical therapy is considered both an appropriate and a potentially effective way to deal with it. Feminist inquiries, too, raise questions about the causes of women's oppression that require classifying phenomena as instances of rape, sexual objectification, sex discrimination, and so forth—classifications all tied to their meeting both empirical and evaluative criteria (Anderson 1995a, 1995b). In general, when the question being asked concerns value-laden phenomena, such as the impact of certain practices on human welfare, or whether certain institutions are fair or discriminatory, the contours of the empirical phenomena to be studied will be defined by evaluative judgments (Intemann 2001, 2005).
Methods. The methods selected for investigating phenomena depend on the questions one asks and the kinds of knowledge one seeks, both of which may reflect the social interests of the investigator. Experimental methods in social science may be good for discovering factors that can be used to control people's behavior in similar settings. But to grasp their behavior as action—that is, as attempts by agents to govern their behavior through their understandings of what they are doing—requires different empirical methods, including qualitative interviews (which allow subjects to delineate their own systems of meaning) and participant observation. Standpoint theories, as critical theories, aim as well at empowering the subjects of study by helping them forge liberatory self-understandings, and these, too, may require different methods of inquiry—for example, consciousness-raising (MacKinnon 1999).
Causal Explanations; Models; Explanations of Meaning; Narratives. For most phenomena, the number of factors that have a causal impact on their occurrence is vast—too large to comprehend or test in a single model. Investigators must therefore select a subset of causal factors to include in the models they test. This selection may be based on considerations of cost or availability—some types of data are hard or expensive to get; cheap and accessible methods may be better suited to testing the causal influence of some variables than others. The selection of causal variables may also be based on fit with the social or personal interests of the investigator (Longino 1990, 2001). These interests often reflect background social and moral judgments of blame, responsibility, and acceptability of change. To take an innocuous case, in most contexts, what is singled out as a cause of dangerous fires is a spark, flame, or flammable material, not the presence of oxygen. The items judged possible to change, or worth changing, are the focus of causal explanation. To take a more controversial case, conservatives are more likely to study divorce and out-of-wedlock birth as causes of women's poverty, whereas feminists are more likely to focus on other causes—for example, the exclusion of women from better-paid jobs, the weak bargaining power of women in marriage, and norms of masculinity that induce fathers to avoid significant participation in child-rearing, thereby forcing women to forego earnings in taking up the slack. Notice that these causal explanations are not incompatible. All the causal factors cited may contribute to the feminization of poverty. More subtly, normative interests may determine whether one models only main effects or also interaction effects on outcomes relevant to human welfare. A variable--say, a certain lifestyle--that has a positive main effect on a population considered in aggregate may have a negative effect on certain minority subpopulations. Whether one models and tests for such effects may depend on whether one believes that one lifestyle does or should fit all, or whether one values pluralism and ontological heterogeneity (Anderson 2004).
Often what inquirers seek is not merely a set of facts, but what the facts mean. The meaning or significance of facts depends on their relations to other facts. Even if two inquirers agree on the causal facts, they may still disagree about their meaning because they relate the facts in different ways, reflecting their background values. Feminists may agree with conservatives that divorce is a cause of the feminization of poverty, but deny that this means that women are better off married. They argue that marriage itself, with its gendered division of domestic and market labor, constitutes one of the major structural disadvantages women face, setting them up for worse outcomes in the event of divorce (Okin 1989). Conservatives, viewing marriage as an indispensable condition of the good life, are no more willing to view marriage in this light than most people would be willing to blame oxygen for the occurrence of house fires. It might be thought that scientists should stick to the facts and avoid judgments of meaning. But most of the questions we ask demand answers that fit facts into larger, meaningful patterns. Scientists therefore cannot help but tell stories, which require the selection of narrative frameworks that necessarily go beyond the facts (Haraway 1989). This selection may depend both on their fit with the facts and on their fit with the background values of the storyteller.
Framework Assumptions. As we ascend to higher levels of abstraction, very general framework assumptions come into play in constituting the object of study. Some of these are disciplinary. Economics studies humans as self-interested, instrumentally rational choosers. Social psychology studies humans as responding to socially meaningful situations. Behaviorism studies humans as influenced by objectively defined environmental variables. Behavioral genetics studies humans as influenced by their genes. These are all forms of “seeing as.” Longino (1990) and Tiles (1987) argue that the selection of framework assumptions may depend on their fit with the interests of the inquirer. Feminists are interested in promoting women's agency, so they tend to prefer frameworks that permit the representation of women as agents. This selection does not guarantee that they will confirm the background assumption that women are agents. Causal models that include only agentic variables may not explain much of the variation in women's behavior; models that include both agentic and nonagentic variables may find that the latter explain all of the variation. The value-laden selection of framework assumptions need not lead to a vicious circle of reasoning, because it is still left up to the evidence to determine how successful the assumptions are in explaining the phenomena of interest.
Pluralism as the upshot of value-laden inquiry. Because the interests and values of inquirers vary, and inquirers select background assumptions in part for their fit with their interests and values, their background assumptions will also vary. Rather than lamenting this fact, feminist epistemologists urge us to embrace it (Haraway 1991, Harding 1998, Longino 2001). A pluralism of theories and research programs should be accepted as a normal feature of science—as it is, certainly, in the human sciences. As long as the different research programs are producing empirical successes not produced by the others, and avoiding clear error and viciously circular or dogmatic reasoning, there is good reason to treat the value-biases animating them as epistemic resources, helping us discover and understand new aspects of the world and see them in new perspectives, rather than as obstacles to the search for truth. Feminist science takes its place as one set of legitimate research programs among others, rather than as something that replaces the others. This generates the disunity of science, but does not imply relativism. Value-laden research programs are still open to internal and external critique. A naturalized epistemology that rejects neutrality allows that observations may undermine any background assumptions, including value judgments (Anderson 2004).
Feminist Critiques of Objectivity. Feminist critiques of objectivity are directed not against all claims to objectivity, but against particular conceptions of objectivity. The conceptions of objectivity considered problematic by feminists include the following: (a) Subject/object dichotomy: what is really (“objectively”) real exists independently of knowers. (b) Aperspectivity: “objective” knowledge is ascertained through “the view from nowhere,” a view that transcends or abstracts from our particular locations. (c) Detachment: knowers have an “objective” stance toward what is known when they are emotionally detached from it. (d) Value-neutrality: knowers have an “objective” stance toward what is known when they adopt an evaluatively neutral attitude toward it. (e) Control: “objective” knowledge of an object (the way it “really” is) is attained by controlling it, especially by experimental manipulation, and observing the regularities it manifests under control. (f) External guidance: “objective” knowledge consists of representations whose content is dictated by the way things really are, not by the knower. These ideas are often combined into a package of claims about science: that its aim is to know the way things are, independent of knowers, and that scientists achieve this aim through detachment and control, which enable them to achieve aperspectivity and external guidance. This package arose in the 17th-18th centuries, as a philosophical account of why Newtonian science was superior to its Scholastic predecessor. According to this account, the predecessor science, which represented objects as intrinsically possessing secondary qualities and ends, confused the way things are in themselves with the ways they are related to emotionally engaged human knowers, who erroneously projected their own mental states and value judgments onto things. Adoption of the objective methods listed above enabled the successor scientists to avoid these errors and achieve an “absolute” conception of the universe (Williams 1978). Feminists object to each element in this package as a normative ideal and as a general description of how science works.
Subject/object dichotomy. If the object of science is to grasp things as they are, independent of knowers, then it is important to draw a sharp distinction between the knower and the known. Feminists argue that the assumptions that science or “objective” inquiry aims at, and achieves, such “absolute” knowledge presupposes a problematic ontology. When the objects of inquiry are knowers themselves, these assumptions rule out the possibility that knowers' self-understandings help constitute the ways knowers are. It therefore rules out the possibility that some of our characteristics, such as our gender, are socially constructed. Ironically, these assumptions may lead people to make the very projective errors the objectivity package is supposed to avoid: attributing to the essential natures of the objects of study what are actually products of people's contingent beliefs and attitudes about those objects (Haslanger 1995).
Aperspectivity. The ideal of aperspectivity is justified as a means to achieve knowledge of the way things are, independently of their relations to knowers. If one views things from no particular position, without any presuppositions or biases, then the only thing that guides belief-formation is the object itself (external guidance), not the knower. Feminists question the intelligibility of a “view from nowhere,” and a presuppositionless, bias-free science, for both postmodernist (Haraway 1991) and pragmatist (Antony 1993) reasons. Representations of the world reflect the interests, positions, and biases of observers, and could hardly do otherwise, given that scientific theories always go beyond the evidence offered for them. Biases are necessary to get theorizing off the ground. Therefore, our proper project should not be to give up on presuppositions or biases, but to empirically study which biases are fruitful and which mislead, and reform scientific practice accordingly, as naturalized epistemology would recommend (Antony 1993). Some feminist critics argue that the assumption of aperspectivity is not just an epistemological error. It generates further errors in scientific theories of the world, which have pernicious consequences for those occupying subordinate social positions. In the most radical form of this critique, the practice of objectivity—assuming that observed regularities reflect the intrinsic natures of things, and treating those things accordingly—when adopted by those in power, produces the very regularities taken to vindicate that assumption. When male observers exercise the power to make women behave in accordance with their desires (for instance, to elicit female submission to their aggressive sexual advances), but assume their own aperspectivity, they misattribute the behavior to women's intrinsic natures (feminine passivity) rather than to their own socially positioned power. The androcentric projection of masculine desires onto women, posing as aperspectival, constitutes an exercise of male power that causes women to behave in accordance with men's wishes. This process constitutes the “objectification” of women. It is harmful to women, because it legitimates the same sexist practices that reinforce the projection, in a morally vicious circle. And it is epistemically flawed, in that it misrepresents the modality of observed regularities (as necessary, rather than socially contingent), as well as their cause (as generated by the intrinsic nature of the things observed, rather than by the observer's own stance toward what is observed.) (MacKinnon 1999, Haslanger 1993).
Detachment. The ideal of objectivity as detachment, according to which good scientists should adopt an emotionally distanced, controlling stance toward their objects of study, is defended as necessary to avoid projective error. Keller suggests that it is responsible for the symbolically “masculine” standing of science that marginalizes women in science (because women are stereotyped as emotional). Moreover, it reflects an androcentric perspective, in that it serves mens' neurotic anxieties about maintaining sharp boundaries between self and other, and keeping the “feminine” at arms-length (Keller 1985a, Bordo 1987). Other criticisms of objectivity-as-detachment focus more on the epistemic defects of emotional distance. A “feeling for the [individual] organism” may sensitize a scientist to critical data (Keller 1983, Ruetsche 2004).
Value-neutrality. The ideal of objectivity as value-neutrality is justified as a psychological stance needed to guard against temptations toward wishful thinking and dogmatic, politically motivated or ideological reasoning. Feminists argue, on the basis of historical and sociological investigations of the history and current practice of science, that this insistence on the value-neutrality of scientists is self-deceptive and unrealistic (Potter 1993, 2001; Longino 1990, 2001; Harding 1991, 1998; Wylie 1996). Indeed, it is self-defeating: when scientists represent themselves as neutral, this blocks their recognition of the ways their values have shaped their inquiry, and thereby prevents the exposure of these values to critical scrutiny. Advocates of neutrality think the only influences of evaluative presuppositions on science are pernicious. Feminists argue that this stance ignores the many positive roles value judgments play in guiding the process and products of inquiry noted above. Other procedures are available to block the effects of wishful thinking and political dogmatism on what claims science ultimately accepts, without requiring scientists to bracket their value judgments (Anderson 1995, 2004, Longino 2001).
Control. Experimental contexts, in which scientists elicit regularities in the behavior of the objects of study by manipulating them under controlled conditions, are often taken to generate epistemically privileged evidence about the objects of study. Such evidence is thought to ground knowledge of how the objects “really are”, in contrast with evidence about the objects of study generated through “subjective” modes of interaction with them, such as participant observation, dialogue, political engagement, and caring for their needs. Feminists argue that the stance of control is a stance of social, often specifically male, power. The epistemic privilege it enjoys reflects both androcentrism (a male point of view, misrepresented as universal) and the social prestige attached to whatever is gender-symbolized as “masculine” (Merchant 1980, Smith 1974). Such considerations do not provide legitimate grounds for granting epistemic privilege to the stance of control. At the same time, they underrate the epistemic value of experiences gained from loving or cooperative engagement with the objects of study. The chief feminist complaint against objectivity-as-control is not that it grounds false theories, but that the theories it produces generate only a partial view of the potentialities of the objects of study, reflecting and serving interests in control over the objects, but not interests in engaging with the objects in other ways, or in enabling the objects of study, if they are human, to govern themselves (Tiles 1987).
External guidance. The ideal of external guidance assumes that to achieve knowledge of the way things “objectively” or “really” are, independent of knowers, one's beliefs must be guided by the nature of the object, not by the presuppositions and biases of the knower. Feminists argue that the contrast between external and internal (“subjective”) guidance poses a false dichotomy. The underdetermination of theories by evidence entails that theories cannot be guided purely by the nature of the object. Inquirers must make numerous, contingent choices along the way, concerning how to conceive and represent the object of knowledge, what aspects of it to study, how to interpret evidence concerning the object, and how to represent the conclusions drawn (Longino 1990, Nelson 1990). The pretense that sound scientific theories are the products of purely external guidance obscures the forces shaping these choices and absolves scientists from responsibility for defending them. For example, feminists have paid particular attention to the ways choices of metaphors and narrative genres constrain scientific explanations (Haraway 1989, 1991). The decision to narrate the fertilization of egg by sperm as a romance casts the sperm in an active role, and egg in a passive one, obscuring the causal role of eggs in bringing about fertilization (Martin 1996). Similarly, the decision to narrate the transition from ape to hominid as a heroic drama dictates a focus on presumptively male activities, such as hunting, as the engine of evolution, obscuring less dramatic alternatives that are at least equally supported by the data, but that focus on presumptively female activity (balancing child care needs with gathering) or on behaviors, such as language use, that are shared by both males and females (Haraway 1989, Longino 1990).
These feminist criticisms of different conceptions of objectivity share some common themes. The problematic conceptions of objectivity generate partial accounts of the world, which they misrepresent as complete and universal. The forms of partiality they underwrite are either androcentric (represent the world from a male point of view), symbolized as “masculine,” or serve male interests (or the interests of other dominant social positions). They are justified by appealing to models of cognition that represent error and bias in terms of qualities that are gender symbolized as “feminine” and stereotypically attributed to women. Such conceptions of objectivity, because they recommend avoidance of the “feminine,” function to exclude women from participation in inquiry or deprive them of epistemic authority. The problematic conceptions of objectivity ignore the knowledge-enhancing, epistemically fruitful uses of supposedly “feminine” approaches to theorizing (e.g., uses of emotional engagement and explicit attention to perspectival knowledge). By representing partial perspectives as aperspectival and externally guided, these problematic conceptions of objectivity induce systematic mistakes on the part of those who embrace these conceptions. Ironically, the mistakes they induce, such as projective error (mistaking qualities of the knower or relations of knower to known for intrinsic qualities of the object known) and partiality, are the very errors these conceptions of objectivity are supposed to avoid. Moreover, these conceptions of objectivity tend to prevent adherents from recognizing and correcting these errors, and so tend to entrench them in scientific practice.
Feminist Conceptions of Objectivity. The feminist critiques of objectivity just surveyed identify errors and illegitimate biases in inquiry, and therefore presuppose their own conceptions of objectivity. Feminist epistemologists and philosophers of science avoid ontological accounts (such as subject/object dichotomy), which define objectivity in terms of an a priori idea of what counts as really real, preferring to leave open to inquiry what sorts of entity exist. Instead, feminist conceptions of objectivity are procedural. Products of inquiry are more objective, the better they are supported by objective procedures. Some of the more influential feminist conceptions of objectivity include the following:
Feminist/nonsexist research methods. Rather than offering a comprehensive account of objectivity, some feminists have offered methodological guidelines for avoiding the sexist and androcentric errors and biases that feminists have identified in mainstream science. Eichler (1988) offers an exemplary work of this kind, explaining how to avoid androcentrism, overgeneralization, gender insensitivity, and sexual double standards in research. More ambitiously, feminists have sought research methods that embody feminist values—for example, ensuring that gendered features of social phenomena are made salient (Nielsen 1990, Reinharz 1992). Some theorists argue that feminism requires controversial methodological standards, such as preferring qualitative over quantitative methods, or not questioning female subjects' own interpretations of their experiences (Stanley & Wise 1983). But other feminist researchers vigorously contest such claims (Greaves, Wylie & Staff, 1995; Jayaratne & Stewart 1991). Harding (1987b) persuasively argues that there is no single feminist method; doing science as a feminist requires that one be willing to adopt various methods, depending on the question under investigation.
Emotional engagement. Various feminist theorists have stressed the epistemic fruitfulness of emotional engagement with the object of study. Emotions serve critical epistemic functions in moral and political inquiry, attuning observers to evaluatively relevant features of the world (Jaggar 1989, Little 1995, Anderson 2004). In social scientific inquiry more generally, emotional engagement with one's subjects of study may be necessary both to elicit and interpret behaviors of scientific interest. Ethnographers may need to win the trust of their subjects to get them to open up, and to achieve a rapport with them to understand what they are up to. Sympathetic identification with the subjects of study may generate important criticisms of dominant theories and significant rival hypotheses (Hrdy 1986). Keller (1985a) has developed the idea of objectivity as (non-neurotic) emotional engagement in her ideal of “dynamic objectivity.” Dynamic objectivity utilizes a mode of perception based on loving attention toward the object. Keller argues that it is superior to objectivity-as-detachment, in that it does not express a neurotic need to allay anxieties about maintaining the independence of the self by dominating the object of study. Longino (1993b) has objected to Keller's ideal on the ground that, even if it is true that dynamic objectivity involves a less neurotic mode of interaction with the world, this does not show that it is epistemically superior. Keller's case study of Barbara McClintock's pathbreaking discovery of genetic transposition (1983), represented as an exemplary manifestation of dynamic objectivity, demonstrates the epistemic fruitfulness of loving attention to the objects of study without fully answering Longino's challenge. (It is one thing to demonstrate that a mode of engagement is epistemically fruitful, another to demonstrate that it is epistemically superior, across-the-board, to other modes of engagement).
Reflexivity. Harding (1993) argues that the objectivity of a representation is greater, the more reflexive is its process of generation. Reflexivity demands that inquirers place themselves on the same causal plane as the object of knowledge. They must make explicit the social positions, interests, background assumptions, biases, and other contingent, perspectival features of themselves that shaped the questions, methods, interpretations, and modes of presentation of the claims the knower accepts as knowledge. Reflexivity affirms the partiality of representations without denying their possible claim to truth. A representation can be true without being the whole truth about the object represented. It enhances objectivity by avoiding a narcissistic confusion of one's own partial perspective with a comprehensive view, and by highlighting contingencies of representation that could be questioned. Harding argues that inclusion of marginalized groups into inquiry will improve reflexivity, because the marginalized are more likely to notice and take issue with features of accepted representations that are due to the unquestioned adoption of the perspectives of the dominant. Democratic inclusion is therefore an implication of reflexivity. Harding's ideal of “strong objectivity” includes both reflexivity and democratic inclusion as the key features of more objective processes of inquiry. She casts this ideal as a reconfiguration of standpoint theory, because it accords the standpoints of marginalized groups an indispensable role in producing objective knowledge. However, strong objectivity does not accord epistemic privilege to the standpoints of the oppressed, considered by themselves. Rather, it prefers representation produced by communities that include them over representations produced by communities that exclude them.
Democratic discussion. Longino (1990, 2001) has developed most fully a conception of objectivity based on democratic discussion. Her key idea is that the production of knowledge is a social enterprise, secured through the critical and cooperative interactions of inquirers. The products of this social enterprise are more objective, the more responsive they are to criticism from all points of view. This idea builds on a long tradition including J.S. Mill, Karl Popper, and Paul Feyerabend (Lloyd 1997a). Feminists develop this tradition by offering (i) a more articulate conception of “all points of view,” stressing the influence of the social positions of inquirers on the representations they produce; (ii) a more empirically informed account of the social interactions characteristic of different communities of inquiry (e.g., Potter 1993, 2001); (iii) a greater stress on the importance of equality among inquirers. In Longino's influential account, a community of inquirers is objective—entitled to credit its products as knowledge—if it: (1) offers public venues for the criticism of knowledge claims; (2) responds to criticisms by changing its theories according to (3) publicly recognized standards of evaluation; and (4) follows a norm of equality of intellectual authority among its members. The requirement of equality of intellectual authority secures the democratic credentials of the theory. It is also its most criticized element, given the need to recognize differences in expertise and competence among inquirers. Advocates of the democratic discussion model of objectivity have responded by refining the norm of equality so as to distinguish legitimate differences of expertise and competence from illegitimate exercises of social power to exclude some criticisms, such as those emerging from disadvantaged social positions, from a serious hearing (Anderson 1995c, Longino 2001).
Pluralist Themes in Feminist Conceptions of Objectivity. The conceptions of objectivity criticized by feminists identify objectivity with a single point of view, the “view from nowhere,” and dismiss all other points of view as false or biased. Most feminist conceptions of objectivity accommodate both methodological and theoretical pluralism. Different communities of inquiry take an interest in different aspects of the world, and develop various partial theories to satisfy varied epistemic and pragmatic values. While no empirical theory can be justified unless it is supported by evidence, the underdetermination of theories by evidence permits the development of a plurality of theories, each of which may claim its own successes. Most feminists resist the thought that these varied theories, to the extent that they contain truths, must eventually be unified into a single grand theory of everything, based on a single observation language and a single set of theoretical terms. As long as different communities of inquiry and their associated theories are producing empirical successes in accordance with publicly recognized standards, while holding themselves accountable to criticism from all sides, their products may each count as objective, however irreducibly plural the content of their theories may be (Longino 2001, Harding 1991, 1998).
Recent work in naturalized epistemology has stressed our pervasive epistemic interdependence, especially due to our unavoidable reliance on testimony (Nelson 1990). Because inquiry is collaborative, what we believe is partially determined by who we believe. Decisions about who to believe depend in turn on attributions of epistemic authority, which depend on judgments of people's competence or expertise, epistemic responsibility, and honesty or sincerity. Feminist epistemologists explore the ways gender and other hierarchical social relations influence attributions of epistemic authority, considering their impact on (1) general models of knowledge; (2) the epistemic standing of knowers; and (3) whose claims various epistemic communities accept, and ought to accept, as credible, and (4) how this affects the distribution of knowledge and ignorance in society, perhaps keeping entire communities systematically ignorant of certain truths.
Epistemic Authority and General Models of Knowledge. At the most abstract level, gendered ideas about epistemic authority can distort our general models of knowledge. Code (1991) argues that contemporary analytic epistemology's core model of propositional knowledge implicitly presupposes a male knower. The instances of knowledge analytic epistemology takes to be paradigmatic when it analyzes the formula “S knows that P” are propositions about readily observable mind-independent objects. To take these as the paradigmatic instances of knowledge invites a model of the knower as emotionally detached, impersonally oriented to things rather than persons, and oriented in an “objective” posture toward the object of knowledge. These features of knowers are symbolically gendered masculine and stereotypically attributed to men. This fact, in conjunction with the cultural representation of masculinity and femininity as opposed and mutually exclusive, implicitly denies epistemic authority to women. Code pays attention to this injustice as well as to the ways gender symbolism and gender stereotypes distort epistemology's model of knowledge. She argues that knowledge of other persons rather than of propositions should be taken as a primary model of knowledge. Such second-person knowledge calls the implicit masculinity of knowers into question, since getting to know others typically requires intimacy, dialogue, empathy and other characteristics that are gender symbolized as “feminine.”
While Code's proposal to replace propositional knowledge with personal knowledge as the core model of knowledge has not been generally followed, recent epistemology's focus on the indispensability of testimony to inquiry has enabled feminist epistemologists to take Code's ideas in a different direction, by investigating the dependence of propositional knowledge on knowledge of persons. In contexts where unimpeded communication against a background of overwhelming consensus is taken for granted, this fact is obscured. It is explicit in anthropology, where inquirers must face not just language barriers but an alien world that they initially lack the conceptual resources to interpret. Anthropologists are keenly aware that they must cultivate personal relationships of trust with native informants to gain access to the natives' situated knowledge of their cultures. This requires reflection on the ways differences in power, interest, personality, and social situation between the anthropologist and his or her informants influence the testimony elicited in personal interaction and its interpretation. Feminist epistemology has investigated reflexive sociology to call into question models of testimony as a transparent and unidirectional transmission of objective information, highlighting instead testimony's dialogic, strategic, and empathetic features, as well as the importance and difficulty of cultivating epistemically fruitful relations of mutual trust across differences in power (Bergin 2002; Lugones 1987).
Epistemic Injustice. Other feminist epistemologists focus on the impact of gender and other hierarchical social relations on the epistemic authority accorded to knowers. Dominant groups tend to accord epistemic authority to themselves and withhold it from subordinates by constructing prejudicial stereotypes of subordinates as incompetent or dishonest. They promote, as external markers or assurances of epistemic competence, trustworthiness, and hence authority, characteristics they have, or are stereotypically supposed to have (such as a gentleman's sense of honor or an “educated” accent), that subordinates lack or are stereotypically supposed to lack (Addelson 1983; Shapin 1994). They also hoard opportunities for gaining access to these markers—for instance, by denying subordinate groups access to higher education. Such power-distorted practices of assigning epistemic authority commit an epistemic injustice against members of subordinate groups, undermining their ability to participate in collaborative inquiry. Fricker (2007) calls this “testimonial injustice.” The core case of testimonial injustice occurs when people discount the credibility what others say on account of prejudice against their social group.
Additional types of specifically epistemic injustice follow from or are akin to testimonial injustice. Fricker (2007) identifies “hermeneutical injustice” as one such consequence. This occurs when the interpretive resources available to a community render a person's experiences unintelligible or inadequately interpreted, due to the epistemic marginalization of that person or members of her social group from participation in practices of meaning-making. An example of hermeneutical injustice is the dismissal of women as humorless or hypersensitive for getting upset at what was seen as mere cloddish courtship, joking, or horseplay before the concept of sexual harassment was available to make sense of their experiences. That this was an injustice and not merely a failure of understanding is due to the fact that the victims of harassment were prejudicially denied effective access to the practices of meaning-making whereby they could have made their experiences intelligible to others. Hermeneutical injustice is thus a consequence of testimonial injustice. Hookway (2010) identifies an injustice analogous to testimonial injustice in practices that exclude people from participating in inquiry more generally. Such participation need not take the form of offering testimony, but may involve other acts such as asking questions, suggesting hypotheses, raising objections, and drawing analogies. When others fail to take such contributions seriously out of prejudicial stereotyping of the contributor, this is also an injustice. It injures the speaker not as a knower but as a participant in inquiry.
Feminist epistemologists offer various responses to the problem of power-distorted assignments of epistemic authority. Bar On (1993) argues that claims to speak and be given a serious hearing need to be detached from claims to epistemic authority. While agreeing with Bar On that the original claim of feminist standpoint theory to some kind of epistemic privilege must be abandoned, Janack (1997) and Fricker (1999) argue that we cannot avoid judgments of epistemic authority; hence our task must be to reconfigure the norms for ascribing epistemic authority more justly. Fricker (2007) argues that to correct for testimonial injustice, hearers need to cultivate the virtue of epistemic justice, which she characterizes as a disposition, rooted in one's “testimonial sensibility” or second-nature perception of others' credibility, to neutralize the effects of prejudicial stereotypes that would otherwise influence one's credibility judgments. Jones (2002) proposes specific rules for checking such biases when confronted with testimony one finds astonishing. These include undertaking independent assessments of the credibility of the witness and the plausibility of what they say; and letting the presumption against accepting some astonishing testimony be rebutted when one has good reason to distrust one's distrust of the witness. Alcoff (2010) suggests that correcting for testimonial injustice requires the adoption of standpoint epistemology: what is needed is not merely neutralizing prejudice, but actively according epistemic privilege to the marginalized. Rolin (2009) and Code (2008) point out that doing so requires not just unilateral adjustment of credibility estimates by hearers, but empowerment of speakers and advocacy on their behalf.
Should the case for changing norms of epistemic authority be made simply on grounds of justice to inquirers, or can an epistemic case be made for it as well? Bar On (1993) and Janack (1997) suggest that the case for epistemic inclusion is moral rather than epistemic. Code (2004), among many others, argues that besides committing an epistemic injustice against members of subordinate groups, power-distorted allocations of epistemic authority lead to biased and partial theories that tend to reinforce social inequality. Harding (1993) and Longino (1990, 2001) agree that more inclusive and egalitarian communities of inquiry are not just morally but also epistemically superior, in that they are able to produce less biased, more objective theories. The premise of situated knowledge entails that information is asymmetrically distributed across social positions. Any moderately complex inquiry will need to be undertaken by a community of inquirers who draw from these dispersed sources of knowledge, pooling information and perspectives and making it available to the community as a whole. This process requires that those with relevant situated knowledge be recognized as having epistemic authority to testify about it. Situated knowledge is unavailable, or imperfectly available, to the community insofar as it allocates epistemic authority to individuals in ways not warranted by their underlying epistemic competence and trustworthiness, or in ways that prevent people in certain social positions from improving their epistemic competence and establishing relations of trust with others. The theories that result from such distorted allocations of epistemic authority will tend to be partial and biased.
Many feminist epistemologists advocate democratic, egalitarian norms for allocating epistemic authority as a way to overcome epistemic injustice and produce more objective theories (Anderson 1995c; Longino 1990, 2001; Potter 1996) This raises the question of what a democratic allocation of epistemic authority would look like. Should norms for ascribing epistemic authority treat group identity as irrelevant, so that, other epistemically relevant features being held equal, individuals of different genders, races, castes, etc. should be granted equal epistemic authority? Or might an inquirer's social identity be relevant to the epistemic authority she can legitimately claim? Longino's (1990, 2001) norm of “tempered” equality of intellectual authority could be read to suggest a group-blind norm for allocating epistemic authority. Other feminist epistemologists, some influenced by standpoint theory, argue that group identity can contingently confer an epistemic advantage with respect to answering certain questions, or getting access to certain critical evidence relevant to answering them. Hence, allocations of epistemic authority may sometimes be sensitive to group membership, depending on the context and question being asked (Alcoff 2001; Anderson 1995c; Wylie 2003). This does not necessarily entail holding that A has more epistemic authority than B with respect to question Q in virtue of A's social identity. It may simply entail that a community of inquirers that includes members with A's social identity has more epistemic authority than one that lacks such members.
Epistemologies of Ignorance.Recent work in social epistemology has shifted attention from distorted patterns of knowledge to distorted patterns of ignorance. Injustice in according people status as knowers and inquirers generates unjust ignorance. Some theorists focus on the epistemic injustice of depriving members of subordinate groups of education and information in general (Coady 2010). However, the dominant focus is on how privileged groups, or society as a whole, can be systematically ignorant in ways that damage the interests of subordinate groups. Research focuses on ignorance of two sorts of subject matter. First, society could have access to, but forget or suppress, knowledge useful to subordinated groups--for example, about the anatomy and role of the clitoris in women's sexual enjoyment (Tuana 2006), or about tropical plants that are effective abortifactants (Schiebinger 2007). Second, it could forget or suppress knowledge about its own injustices. How, for example, could the Americans persist in imagining the history of the “frontier” as empty land waiting to be settled, erasing the memory of repeated ethnic cleansing of Native Americans (Mills 2007)? Since accurate information on such important matters is available, some explanation is needed for why it is ignored or forgotten. In some cases, ignorance can be traced to segregation of situated knowers, preventing knowledge or understandings held by subordinate groups from disseminating to others (Margonis 2007). Members of subordinate groups may even have strategic, self-protective interests in hiding knowledge about themselves from dominant groups (Bailey 2007). Most importantly, however, dominant groups have interests in avoiding the truth about their own injustices. Importantly, the dominant may at some level be aware of this truth, or have reason to suspect that it might be true, but refuse to publicly acknowledge it, so that it is not common knowledge. The varieties of ignorance and mechanisms for generating and maintaining it are areas of active investigation (Proctor & Schiebinger 2008, Sullivan & Tuana 2007, Tuana & Sullivan 2006.
9. Trends in Feminist Epistemology: Interactions of Standpoint Theory, Postmodernism, and Empiricism
When Harding (1986) proposed her classification of feminist epistemologies into empiricism, standpoint theory, and postmodernism, she cast them as offering three fundamentally contrasting frameworks. Empiricism was thought to presuppose an unsituated, politically neutral subject of knowledge, whereas standpoint theory and postmodernism offered different approaches to the problem of situated knowledge—the first upholding an epistemic privilege of one situation over others, the other embracing a relativism of standpoints. Trends in feminist epistemology in the last twenty years have blurred the distinctions among feminist empiricism, standpoint theory, and feminist postmodernism—trends Harding herself both predicted and advanced (1990, 1991, 1998). Most importantly, all three approaches to feminist epistemology embrace pluralism and reject totalizing theories. All three approaches also reject the traditional epistemological project of validating epistemic norms from a transcendent viewpoint, because they deny that there is any such viewpoint to be had. Early theorizing in feminist epistemology tended to explore global questions about gender and knowledge: are dominant conceptions or practices of science, objectivity, and knowledge masculine or androcentric? Do men and women have different cognitive styles manifested in different orientations to knowledge? The field has steadily evolved toward local investigations of the varieties of ways gender is implicated in knowledge practices in specific subject matters, among particular communities of inquiry, using distinct methods. This turn to the local has facilitated the convergence of the three types of feminist epistemology.
Feminist standpoint theory. The postmodernist critique of standpoint theory, in conjunction with the proliferation of subaltern women's standpoints (black, Latina, lesbian, postcolonial, etc.) has led most standpoint theorists to abandon the search for a single feminist standpoint that can claim overarching epistemic superiority. Feminist standpoint theorists have therefore moved in a pluralistic direction, acknowledging a multiplicity of epistemically informative situated standpoints (Harding 1991, 1998; Collins 1990). They claim that there are important things to learn from taking seriously the perspectives of all marginalized groups—not just of various groups of women, but men and women in postcolonial societies, men and women of color, gay men, and so forth. A system of knowledge that draws on their insights and starts from their predicaments will be richer than one that draws only on the insights and starts from the predicaments of privileged groups alone (Harding 1993, 1998). One way of understanding this claim is methodological: thinking from subaltern standpoints is more fruitful than confining one's thinking to dominant perspectives. This shifts the privilege claimed on behalf of subaltern standpoints from the context of justification to the context of discovery. Another way to understand the claim is in terms of pragmatic advantages: thinking from these standpoints enables us to envision and realize more just social relations (Hartsock 1996). Shifting from claims of general epistemic privilege in access to truth to claims of practical advantage in discovering morally or politically significant truths has been a key strategy defenders of standpoint theory (Collins 1996; Harding 1996; Hartsock 1996) have used against postmodernist critics such as Hekman (1996). Many standpoint theorists have also turned to focusing more sharply on the epistemic value of the experiences of subordinated people, as opposed to making categorical claims about group differences in cognitive style. In her important discussion of debates in feminist standpoint theory, Wylie (2003) confirms that a consensus has emerged among feminist epistemologists on two points: (1) a rejection of “essentialism” (the idea that the social groups defining any standpoint have a necessary and fixed nature, or that their members do or ought to think alike) and (2) a rejection of attempts to grant “automatic epistemic privilege” to any particular standpoint. Instead, Wylie stresses how the social situation of “insider-outsiders” (members of disadvantaged groups who need accurate knowledge of the worlds of the privileged in order to navigate them successfully) can sometimes afford a contingent epistemic privilege or advantage in solving particular problems. Thus, standpoint theorists' focus on pluralism reflects a productive interaction with feminist postmodernism; their shift toward pragmatism, experience, and contingent epistemic advantages of the disadvantaged reflects a productive interaction with feminist empiricism.
In recent years theorists have devoted considerable effort to precisely identifying particular contingent cognitive advantages that may be afforded by the adoption of a feminist standpoint. The focus is on specifying the claim of epistemic advantage with sufficient precision that it could be empirically testable, or at least open up areas in which plausible empirical hypotheses of epistemic advantage could be tested. Thus, Solomon (2009) suggests that the achievement of a feminist standpoint involves characteristics that have been empirically associated with creative thinking; Ruetsche (2004) that it could involve Aristotelian “second-nature capacities” to recognize certain kinds of evidence—for example, social interactions among primates—relevant for understanding primate social organization. Other standpoint theorists have stressed the cognitive advantages of a feminist standpoint for revealing and uncovering phenomena in domains of interest to feminists. Rolin (2009) points to the superior capacity of a feminist standpoint to reveal how power relations obscure their operations and effects, and enable inquirers to overcome these obstacles to understanding by empowering those subordinated by power relations (for example, by means of consciousness raising). Scientists who have investigated the causes of women's underrepresentation in the sciences from a feminist standpoint have produced more empirically adequate theories, using more normatively adequate conceptions of bias and discrimination, than nonfeminist researchers (Rolin 2006, Wylie 2009).
Feminist postmodernism. Wariness of the fractionating and centrifugal forces in postmodernism has led some feminists sympathetic to postmodernism to seek middle, more stable grounds that feminist empiricists, standpoint theorists, and postmodernists can share. Haraway (1989) stands out among feminist postmodernists for the tributes she pays to the achievements of feminist scientists working within empiricist standards of evaluation. She also seeks to reconstruct ideas of objectivity and epistemic responsibility consistent with situated knowledge (1991). Fraser (1995) and Fraser & Nicholson (1990) also urge a reformulation of the lessons of postmodernism, toward pragmatism, fallibilism, and contextualization of knowledge claims—all features fully compatible with naturalized feminist empiricism—as against categorical rejections of large-scale social theory, history, normative philosophy, and even humanist values. While it remains to be seen whether feminist postmodernists will actually take up these calls, they signal directions in which postmodernism could be taken.
Feminist empiricism. While early, nonphilosophical feminist science criticism by working scientists may have presupposed a naive version of empiricism, attempts by feminist epistemologists to make sense of feminist science criticism have, following Quine, incorporated explicitly pragmatist and naturalizing themes into feminist empiricism. Thus, feminist empiricists today stress the centrality of situated knowledge, the interplay of facts and values, the absence of transcendental standpoints, and the plurality of theories. These themes converge with those of postmodernism. The femininist empiricist commitment to revealing the varieties of ways gender operates in various domains, including scientific inquiry, has also converged with feminist standpoint theorists' recent emphasis on identifying local, contingent, empirically testable cognitive advantages supplied by various versions of a feminist standpoint.
Remaining differences. The differences that remain among feminist postmodernists, empiricists, and standpoint theorists partially reflect different choices of tools. Feminist postmodernists use the tools of poststructuralism and literary theory. Feminist empiricists prefer the tools of analytic philosophy of science. Some versions of standpoint theory, such as Collins' (1990), rest on an identity politics alien to both postmodernists and empiricists. (To the extent that standpoint theory remains tied to a materialist epistemology, as in Hartsock (1996) and MacKinnon (1999), it is fully compatible with feminist empiricist naturalized epistemology.)
Other differences reflect different attitudes toward and conceptions of objectivity. Although feminist postmodernism has relativist tendencies, its skepticism and stress on instability undermines both the purportedly all-encompassing stance of objectivity and the self-contained, complacent parochiality of relativism. What's missing is not the thought that critique is possible, but any form of critique that enables one to build and synthesize rather than tear down and deconstruct claims to know. Although Haraway reconceives objectivity in terms of epistemic responsibility, it is hard to hold knowers accountable for their claims if they never stick to any claims for very long (Bordo 1990). After twenty-five years of development, it is getting harder to identify points of disagreement between feminist empiricism and feminist standpoint theory, given standpoint theory's stress on identifying contingent, local, empirically supported epistemic advantages of a feminist standpoint. Intemann's important assessment of the two theories (2010) argues that the remaining disagreements boil down to two. The first concerns where the two theories locate the cognitive advantages of a diversity of participants in the scientific community. Feminist empiricists stress the importance of including inquirers with diverse values and interests, so that they can check each others' biases, whereas feminist standpoint theory stress the importance of including inquirers with diverse situated experiences, so they can bring a wider range of evidence to bear on theorizing. The second concerns the role of values in promoting objectivity. Feminist empiricists stress how value pluralism within the scientific community enables the exposure and critical scrutiny of unexamined background assumptions and multiplication of potentially fruitful hypotheses. Feminist standpoint theorists argue that better values produce better theories. Intemann argues that feminist empiricists should take on board both claims of standpoint theory. Feminist empiricists have already done so, as long as these claims are kept contingent and local (Anderson 2004, Wylie and Nelson 2007). Some feminist standpoint theorists, however, deny that inclusion of antifeminist standpoints, or bad values, can be epistemically justified (Intemann 2010, Hicks 2011).
Outside critics of feminist epistemology have argued that the entire research program is flawed at its foundations. Leading critiques of feminist epistemology include a collection of essays in the Monist, 77(4) (1994), Gross and Levitt (1994), Haack (1993), and Pinnick, Koertge and Almeder (2003). The most important criticism of feminist epistemology, found in all these works, is that it corrupts the search for truth by conflating facts with values and imposing political constraints on the conclusions it will accept. Truths inconvenient to a feminist perspective will be censored, and false views promoted because they support the feminist cause. In a closely allied charge, also found in these works, critics accuse feminist epistemologists of a corrosive cynicism about science, claiming that they reject it wholesale as a raw imposition of patriarchal and imperialist power. Feminist epistemologists are said to hold that there are no objective standards of truth and that beliefs are governed by the struggle for political power. On this account, feminists are seen as holding that, since everyone else is engaged in a cynical power-play, they may as well join the battle and try to impose their beliefs on everyone else.
Defenders of feminist epistemology reply that these criticisms depend on serious misreadings of the feminist research program. They argue that feminists do not reject objectivity and science, but rather seek to improve it by correcting sexist and androcentric biases in scientific inquiry, and by promoting criticism of research from all points of view (Lloyd 1995a, 1995b, 1997a, 1997b, Nelson 1990). Nor do they deny that science as currently constituted discovers genuine truths. The complaint is rather that, as dominantly practiced, it offers a partial view of the world that is primarily oriented to discovering those truths that serve particular human interests in material control and maintaining current social hierarchies (Harding 1986, 1998, 1993; Tiles 1987). Feminist epistemologists observe that the democratic and egalitarian norms for cognitive authority they accept, along with their requirement that the scientific community be open and responsive to criticism from all quarters, are incompatible with censorship of evidence, argument, or conclusions on political grounds, and with ignoring or suppressing evidence that undermines any theory, including theories inspired by feminist values (Longino 1990, 1993a, 2001; Anderson 2004—see Other Internet Resources). Although facts and values are intertwined, they play fundamentally different roles in shaping sound scientific inquiry, such that attention to values does not displace or compete with regard for the evidence (Anderson 1995b).
A second major charge outside critics make against feminist epistemology is that it accepts traditional stereotypes about women's thinking (as intuitive, holistic, emotional, etc.) and uncritically valorizes these stereotypes. This leads to several problems. There is no evidence that women all do think alike or that thinking in a “feminine” way reliably leads to truth. Acceptance of conventional stereotypes about women also puts unjust pressure on women who think otherwise to conform to feminine cognitive styles. (Haack 1993). Valorization of “feminine” ways of thinking may also trap women in traditional gender roles and help justify patriarchy (Nanda 2003). Promotion of feminist epistemology may carve out a limited “separate sphere” for female inquirers, but one that will turn into an intellectual ghetto, much as female scholars in an earlier era were largely confined to “feminine” fields such as home economics and nursing (Baber 1994).
Defenders of feminist epistemology reply that the critics are attacking an obsolete version of feminist epistemology that was only briefly—and even at the time, controversially—entertained when the field was launched in the 1980s (Wylie 2003, Anderson 2004—see Other Internet Resources). It has since been superceded, for many of the reasons the critics have articulated, plus others arising from the critiques of black and Latina feminists and feminist postmodernists.
Further development of external critiques of feminist epistemology awaits the critics' engagement with the feminist epistemology's defenders and with current developments in the field.
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