Notes to Feminist History of Philosophy

1. Phyllis Rooney summarizes feminist criticisms of the "maleness" of reason in (Rooney 1994).

2. Kant's derogatory remarks about women are in his pre-critical work Observations on the Beautiful and Sublime p. 111 (Goldthwaite ed.). Robin Schott presents a critical, feminist reading of Kant's conceptual framework in (Schott 1988).

3. Feminists use the idea of a gendered notion to mean different things. In this article I draw a distinction between holding that a notion is intrinsically gendered, and holding that it is extrinsically gendered. Other feminists, however, use the idea of a gendered notion in ways that do not map easily onto my distinction. For example, as I discuss below, Genevieve Lloyd argues for the symbolic gendering of philosophical notions, and it may be that her interpretation does not map onto the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction. And Sally Haslanger argues that objectivity is a gendered notion in the philosophy of Catharine MacKinnon in a way that is neither extrinsic nor intrinsic.

4. (Tuana 1992) also provides a feminist reading of the history of philosophy.

5. (Keller 1985) is a classic source for feminist criticism of the rise of modern science.

6. (Lloyd 1993b, ix). In another essay Lloyd explains that in her view there is an important connection between gender metaphors in philosophical texts and real world gender divisions and the way that gender identity is formed in a culture. See (Lloyd 1993a).

7. In (Scheman 1993), Naomi Scheman develops parallels between the Cartesian subject--disembodied, rational, and unitary--and the repression and projection characteristic of paranoia. Her analysis, like Bordo's, makes use of psychoanalytic categories but it does not make a historical, cultural claim as Bordo does.

8. For a discussion of Irigaray's contribution to feminist scholarship on the history of philosophy see (Deutscher 1997).

9. Bordo and Lloyd differ in other important respects as well. Bordo is interested in providing a social and psychological explanation for the masculinization of philosophy by Descartes. Why did Descartes conceive of reason and objectivity in a masculine guise? The social answer is that during his life European culture was undergoing a gynophobic spasm. The psychological answer depends upon object relations theory, and the development of that theory along gender lines by Chodorow and others. Lloyd is not interested primarily in the causal question addressed by Bordo. Moreover, she thinks that the maleness of reason in the philosophical tradition is primarily symbolic or metaphorical rather than social or psychological. Ultimately, then Bordo and Lloyd differ as to what is meant by the maleness of reason.

10. For a discussion of the omission of Simone de Beauvoir from the philosophical canon see the introduction to (Simons 1995).

11. (Atherton 1993). Celia Amorós has retrieved the arguments in support of the equality of the sexes made by the 17th century Cartesian philosopher Francois Poullain de la Barre (1647-1723). See (Amorós 1994).

Copyright © 2007 by
Charlotte Witt <cewitt@cisunix.unh.edu>

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