Notes to Feminist Perspectives on Sex and Gender

1. The era of gender-marked toys is far from over. For some recent examples, see the category ‘gendered products’ in The Feminist Philosophers Blog (Other Internet Resources).

2. More commonly positions like these are said to be essentialist. However, the entry will avoid this common terminology since feminist usage of the term ‘essentialism’ varies tremendously. (Section 4.2.2. that discusses Charlotte Witt's recent version of gender essentialism is an exception.) ‘Essentialism’ can refer to classificatory essentialism. This is the view that having some feature is necessary for membership in some class (for instance, in order to be a member of the class of red entities, it is necessary to be coloured red). Or, ‘essentialism’ it can refer to individual essentialism. This is the view that having some feature (like being a member of some kind) is essential to individuals qua individuals so that if one were to lose this feature, one would cease to be the same individual entity. (For instance, if being a member of the kind dog is individually essential to Lassie, were Lassie to lose this feature, Lassie would cease to be Lassie.) The two kinds of essentialisms are also often treated as co-dependent: if some feature is essential for class membership, then this feature must also be essential to individual members of that class qua individuals. But this doesn't follow: being coloured red is necessary for membership in the class of red entities but being so coloured isn't obviously essential to red entities qua individuals. For instance, if a red car was painted blue, the car would no longer be a member of the class of red entities, but the car would not cease to be the very same car or the individual entity that it is. (For more on essentialism and for helpful discussions, see Heyes 2000; Stoljar 1995; Stone 2004; 2007; and Witt 1995.)

3. In MacKinnon's defence, Rapaport (2002) argues that even though sexual objectification is the common condition that defines women's gender, it can be manifested in a number of different ways. So, even though women in general are all sexually objectified, this experience need not be uniform: black and white women were simply sexually objectified in different ways.

4. Note that this does not mean Friedan's view is gender realist in the sense discussed here.

5. Confusingly, Butler writes elsewhere: “in no sense can it be concluded that the part of gender that is performed is therefore the ‘truth’ of gender” (1997, 20) – something that appears to contradict her earlier claims. The source of the confusion stems from Butler's equivocation on ‘true’. In this quote, she uses the term to denote ‘independently existing’ rather than ‘real’. So: genders are real only to the extent that they are performed because gender doesn't exist independently of the gendering activities.

6. See also Wittig (1992) who claims that societal power structures falsely teach us that there are two sexes into which individuals are born.

7. One might be tempted to think that the concept woman picks out typical cases of women that function as woman paradigms precisely because they are typical cases. In general, resemblance nominalists hold this: for instance, chosen red paradigms usually include typical red objects like tomatoes, British post-boxes and certain bricks that are chosen precisely because they are typical red objects (Price 1953, 20). But Stoljar does not appeal to typical cases of womanhood when picking out woman paradigms. This is meant to enable individuals (like those Stoljar outlines) who are not ‘typical’ women to count as woman paradigms. And having untypical woman paradigms is meant to enable (for instance) some intersexed individuals and trans persons to belong to the category of women.

8. In Haslanger's earlier work, this analysis was termed ‘analytic’ (see 2000b). Haslanger has subsequently altered her terminology and nowadays terms her analysis ‘ameliorative’.

9. Although Witt's account differs significantly from the other positions discussed in this section, it is not, nevertheless, inappropriate to position it here and to term the position ‘gender realist’. After all, Witt does think that there is something women/ men by virtue of their gender share: a particular social position that has to do with reproductive functions (more about this shortly).

Copyright © 2011 by
Mari Mikkola <>

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