Psychoanalytic Feminism

First published Mon May 16, 2011

This article will discuss psychoanalytic feminism, not feminist psychoanalysis (i.e., except indirectly, it will not address ideas about developing feminist principles in clinical practice, although most of the authors discussed below are trained analysts). Psychoanalysis develops a theory of the unconscious that links sexuality and subjectivity ineluctably together. In doing so, it discloses the ways in which our sense of self, and our political loyalties and attachments, are influenced by unconscious drives and ordered by symbolic structures that are beyond the purview of individual agency. It might appear at the outset that any alliance between feminism and psychoanalysis would have to be coordinated on treacherous ground: in Sigmund Freud's lecture on “Femininity,” for instance, while discussing the “riddle of femininity” (Freud 1968 [1933], 116) or of sexual differentiation, Freud's rhetoric impeaches women as “the problem” (113) and excuses members of his audience from this indictment by offering the hope that they are “more masculine than feminine” (117). Many feminists have been wary both of the biases contained in Freud's oratory and of the overt content of his claims. This article will explain how and why feminist theory has, nonetheless, undertaken a serious reading of Freud and developed careful analyses of his fundamental concepts, working out their limits, impasses, and possibilities.

In the same essay cited above, Freud writes that “psychoanalysis does not try to describe what a woman is—that would be a task it could scarcely perform—but sets about enquiring how she comes into being, how a woman develops out of a child with a bisexual disposition” (Freud 1968 [1933], 116). In using the term ‘bisexual,’ Freud refers to a quality of the sexual instinct, not a relation to a sexual object (which would be denoted by the term ‘inversion’); the bisexual child is one who psychically is not yet either a man or a woman, whose instinctual life functions prior to sexual difference. Freud here portrays femininity as one trajectory of the Oedipal Complex and indicates that sexed identity is a fragile achievement rather than a natural given or essence. By circumscribing the terrain on which the psychoanalytic account of sexual difference moves, and by seeing unresolved, even unresolvable, riddles where others might see the work of nature or culture, Freud problematizes any causal, seamless, or direct tie between sex, sexuality, and sexual difference. Psychoanalytic inquiry does not fit comfortably with, and even unsettles, biological theories of sex and sociological theories of gender, thus also complicating the sex/gender distinction as it has often been formulated in feminist debates. While sex and gender are sometimes construed in feminist theory in terms of the contrast between biology and culture, or nature and nurture, Freud's theory, as discussed below, challenges these dualisms, developing an account of the sexual drive that traverses the mental and the physical, and undergoes idiosyncratic vicissitudes rather than assuming a uniform anatomical or social shape. Whatever the hazards of Freud's writings on women, then, his work explores in new ways the meaning and possibilities of sexed identity. Likewise, as I will argue below, psychoanalytic feminism interrupts many assumptions about what feminism is and the conceptual and material objects it theorizes, including especially the very concept of woman. In unsettling our understanding of this concept, psychoanalysis also poses questions to feminism about the value of difference and the quest for equality, and the unresolved tensions between these divergent pursuits.

While there is no doubt a vast ouvre of disparate positions that might fall within the framework of psychoanalytic feminism, what is shared in common is a descent from, respect for, and some minimal borrowing of Freudian accounts of the unconscious, even while criticizing and/or revising his theoretical apparatus. Any properly psychoanalytic theory must at the least offer an account of the unconscious and its bond with sexuality and, arguably, death. Precisely this descent, however, has also provided a barrier to feminist deployment since Freud is sometimes read, at least superficially, as proffering misogynist, and perhaps Procrustean, elaborations of psychic structuration, curtailing and diminishing the diversity of individual women's experiences into a restricted and unvarying formula that will fit within its own theoretical parameters. Nevertheless, Freud's reflections and hypotheses concerning hysteria, the Oedipal Complex, female sexuality and femininity, and women's role in civilization, among other ideas, have provided the volatile grounds, the sites of contention, for feminist re-articulation. Before any of the multiple and divergent articulations of psychoanalytic feminism can be discussed in more detail, we must thus first establish their historical roots and the conceptual terrain on which they arise. Since a great deal of psychoanalytic feminist theory is specifically concerned with revising the Oedipal narrative of Freud, this article will devote particular attention to Freud's theories of the unconscious as they pertain to the Oedipal Complex.

1. The Freudian Riddle of Femininity

Rooted in both clinical practice with patients and speculative attempts to apprehend and delineate foundational concepts, Freud's psychoanalysis aims to offer descriptions of psychical structures that underlie and account for individual experience in the variety of its empirical formations. Rather than the rationally self-interested individual presumed by liberal political theory or the self-contained and independent cogito presumed by Cartesian epistemology, Freud puts forward a divided subject, unknown to itself, an ‘I’ traversed by multiple agencies. According to Kristeva, “Freud's discovery designated sexuality as the nexus between language and society, drives and the socio-symbolic order” (Kristeva 1984, 84). Freud's break-through insight, in other words, is that sexual bonds initiate us into subjectivity and civilization.

Freud distinguishes human drives from instincts insofar as drives (unlike instincts) have no pre-given aim or object supplied by nature and follow no pre-set biological path. For those who inhabit a human world, drives might come to be attached to any number of aims or objects, and felt through any number of bodily locales. Drives, according to Freud, become specified in these ways through the mediation of ideas or representations. Human embodiment is thus imbued with opaque meaning, and sexuality emerges from a kind of instinctual inadequacy that presents desire as a difficulty or problem, and propels its increasing complexification.

The core of Freud's claim about the impact of sexuality on psychic processes can be discerned starting with Freud's early works on hysteria, although a crucial transformation in his thinking must be clarified. In Studies in Hysteria (1895), written in collaboration with Josef Breuer, Freud examines the phenomenon whereby a symptom might exist in the absence of an organic lesion. Hysteria is diagnosed when it is an idea or memory that makes one ill, without any physical disease being the cause. By definition, hysteria is ideogenic (caused by an idea), as it designates the process by which a troubling but repressed idea is converted into a bodily symptom. Freud initially posits that hysterical symptoms arise as a result of violent childhood seduction (what today would be called molestation), a real trauma that is then retroactively set in motion by a second, comparatively more mild, event, after a period of latency. The ‘seduction hypothesis’ is an attempt to explain the aetiology of hysteria (the origins of neurosis) by the traumatic force of a premature sexual experience occurring in early childhood, an external event that impinges upon the psychical apparatus but whose memory is repressed, cut off from consciousness. The repressed memory becomes somatized (enacted on the body and in bodily symptoms) when a later event, usually occurring in puberty, catalyzes the earlier memory traces. The talking cure is developed as a way to bring repressed memories forward and abreact or release them, re-binding the idea to its severed and dispersed affect (unrepressing it) and thereby dissolving the bodily symptom.

In the later Three Essays on the Theory of Sexuality (1905), Freud contends, contrary to the earlier supposition that sexuality intervenes from the outside, that sexuality is a primordial and innate (if also inchoate) force of infantile life, arising from the bodily sensations that accompany the life processes. In the interim between these two works, Freud had abandoned the seduction hypothesis and replaced it with the thesis of infantile sexuality and the idea that symptoms are brought about via the conflicts and repressions of unconscious fantasy. In other words, it is no longer repressed memory that makes one ill and traumatic sexual violence no longer figures as the primary cause of symptoms. Instead of an actual past experience, Freud posits fantasy as the determining factor of neurotic symptoms. To understand the significance of this transition in his thinking, we must grasp what Freud means by psychical reality and its distinction from material reality. In contrast to the historical, intersubjective domain of material reality, psychical reality is the vital domain of fantasy and intra-psychic life, operating independently of objective considerations of veracity. In Freud's view, unconscious fantasies are not lies or deceptions, but reveal a truth, not about the objective world, but about the internal life of the subject, who one is and what one wants. It might be better to say that fantasies conceal this truth, since conscious articulations of desire and identity will often lead us astray, expressing but distorting, manifesting but denying, the subject's wishes.

As Freud documents in “Remembering, Repeating, and Working-Through” (1914), the conjectural move from memory to desire and from fact to fantasy is also a move from external scenes of seduction to internal psychical acts, from past events to present-day forces, and from passive submission to active maintenance of discord. Instead of an external event impinging upon a child's undeveloped sexuality, the idea of infantile sexuality presupposes both an energetic drive force at work from earliest childhood and an internal or intrapsychic dissension, a subject at odds with its own desires. The thesis of infantile sexuality universalizes the event of trauma, locating its experience in the instinctual excitations that overwhelm the psychical apparatus which is prematurely affected. In discarding the seduction hypothesis, Freud not only discovers the domain of fantasy and psychical reality, but he also paves the way for considering the energetics of the libido, the intrapsychic conflict that is intrinsic to human being, and the idea of responsibility for the dissonances of desire and the skirmishes that shape a life and its patterns. While controversy has swirled around Freud's rejection of the seduction hypothesis, without the scandalous supposition of infantile sexuality there would be no psychoanalytic theory of the unconscious. Although some revisionists have argued that Freud abandons his principles and betrays his patients, in fact Freud never abjures the reality of sexual abuse or denies that some children are molested. Rather, the transformation in his thinking concerns the aetiology of hysteria in a diagnostic sense; neuroses are no longer said to originate in (presumably rare) childhood sexual violence, and thus they can be seen to pervade rather than oppose whatever might be considered normal sexual development. In discarding the idea of a primary or ontological innocence of the psyche which is then violently imposed upon from the outside, Freud arrives at the fundamental premise of psychoanalytic thought.

The exemplar of this phantasmatic activity of the unconscious is the Oedipal Complex. In Freud's later writings on femininity, including “Femininity” (1933), “Female Sexuality” (1931), and “On the Psychological Consequences of the Anatomical Distinction between the Sexes” (1925), Freud postulates that the little girl's Oedipal Complex runs a different course than the little boy's and holds a different relation to castration anxiety. Crucially, Freud maintains that femininity cannot be grasped from a biological or conventional perspective (Freud 1968 [1933], 114). Another way of putting this is that sexual difference is centrally concerned with psychical reality rather than material reality, with the realm of fantasy rather than nature or culture. The Oedipal story is the story of psychic development, the story of how we become subjects and in becoming subjects, how we become sexually differentiated.

The boy and the girl start off, pre-Oedipally, in the same emotional place, attached to the mother, and it is because of this shared starting point that Freud claims the little girl is a little man; they are not yet distinct or sexually differentiated. It is for this reason as well that Freud maintains the idea of a single, masculine, libido: the libido is not neutral in Freud's view since its original object is the mother and this desire for the mother is associated by Freud with masculinity and activity, just as he associates infant clitoral pleasure with phallic enjoyment. Still Freud acknowledges that in the libido's most primordial stages, there can be no sexual distinction. It is not until children pass through the Oedipal Complex that they can properly be said to have a genital organization since this is acquired through a relation to castration and is the last stage in sexual development (following oral, anal, and phallic stages). Hence both children at infancy are ‘little men,’ their desire construed through the terms of a single masculine libido.

Freud seems genuinely puzzled by how femininity comes about: given the girl's prehistory of love and attachment to the mother, why would she switch allegiances to the father? And since, prior to genital organization, she too goes through a phallic (masturbatory) stage, why would she switch the site of bodily pleasure from the clitoris to the vagina? These are among the mysteries he means to designate when referring to the riddle of femininity. That he understands it to be a riddle also intimates that he understands sexual identity not as a natural pre-given essence, rooted in anatomy, but rather as a form of individuation and differentiation realized through complex interaction between the bodily drives and familial others. The boy's story is more seamless and continuous since he retains his phallic pleasure and, although he must displace the immediate object of his desire (no longer the mother, but someone like her), can look forward to substitute objects. The boy's Oedipal attachment to the mother follows uninterruptedly from a pre-Oedipal attachment and it is brought to an end by the threat of castration emanating from the father. At the conclusion of the Oedipal Complex the boy identifies with the father, establishes a super-ego within, and abandons the immediate object of desire with the promise that he too will one day possess a similar object modeled on the mother. But the girl's Oedipal Complex is necessarily more complicated since it can only be instigated by a break from the pre-Oedipal relation to the mother and is therefore a secondary formation. Freud postulates that it is the realization that the beloved mother is castrated that prompts the little girl to turn her love toward her father. For the girl, in other words, castration does not resolve the Oedipal Complex but leads her to enter it, and for this reason Freud claims that it is never wholly brought to a conclusion or demolished, thus accounting, in his view, for girls' weaker super-egos and lesser capacity for sublimation. The girl turns from her mother not in fear but in contempt and because of envy for what the mother does not possess. The father represents for her neither a threat (she finds herself already castrated) nor the prospect of a fulfilled desire in the future (the only replacement for the missing penis is a child of her own), as he does for the boy who can identify with him and hope to eventually have what he has. The father's only promise is thus as a refuge from loss, represented by the mother who bears this loss and who is at fault for the girl's own. In the girl's Oedipal scenario, the father, unlike the castrated mother, stands for the virile capacity of desire itself, which she herself lacks but might reclaim through another man's provision of the opportunity to have a child. In the trajectory of the girl's Oedipal Complex, femininity is realized as the desire to be the object of masculine desire.

Freud's theories of sexuality and the unconscious implicate not only individual psychology but also the constitution of social life. Formed in ambivalent relation to others, sexuality and sexual identity permeate the bonds of civilization and ramify throughout all social relations. In turning his attention to broader cultural questions, Freud offers a story or myth of the origin of political structures that parallels and echoes his understanding of the individual psyche. To understand the political import of the Oedipal Complex, it will be helpful to place it more generally within the scope of Freud's understanding of group psychology. In Group Psychology and the Analysis of the Ego (1921), Freud contests any clear-cut opposition between group and individual psychology and alleges that human infancy is from the beginning immersed in a world of others. Even in ostensibly individual psychology, there is always another involved, as model or object, as site of identification or as object of love. Identification and love, which form the core of identity, are already “social phenomena” and, inversely social relations are themselves premised on developments that occur in the family. It is thus mistaken to sever individual from group psychology as though they were not by nature intermingled or to suppose that there is some kind of special social instinct separate from the drives that energize the individual. Put another way, the individual subject is neither formed wholly independently in a kind of solitary interiority nor formed as merely an effect of exterior social forces.

Totem and Taboo (1913) is Freud's attempt to explain the origin of social life, the bonds that, on his account, hold men together, on the basis of psychic phenomena. Freud envisages a primitive pre-political sociality in which a primal horde of brothers is oppressed by a powerful father who claims for himself all the women, all the enjoyment, available in the community. The brothers are deprived or exiled, and they are motivated to bond together to overthrow the father; they aim, that is, to kill the father and take for themselves his women, offenses that mirror, at a collective level, the Oedipal desires of male children. In Freud's story, the father's murder results not in lawless freedom and unlimited access to sexual objects (a fraternal civil war), but rather in the creation of totems and taboos—the primal father becomes a totemic figure, a revered ancestral object, and the brother's actions in killing him and claiming his women are reconceived as the prohibited transgressions of murder and incest. The two blood taboos that are instituted as law, the prohibitions on incest and murder, thus have a common origin and emerge simultaneously, and together they mandate the social processes of exogamy (marriage outside one's own kin) and totemism (communal bonds of affiliation established through the medium of a common ancestor). Freud thereby allies political formation with the two primal wishes of children and the two crimes of Oedipus, predicating exogamy on the incest taboo, and fraternal bonds on the sacralization of life and the prohibition on murder. Totemism and exogamy also entail fraternal equality: in order that no one take the place of the father and assume his singular power, the brothers are equally constrained and equally respected, the distribution of women equally allotted. Depicting the creation of a stable society grounded in law (though founded in violence), Freud's tale serves as a paradigm for not only rudimentary, but also enduring and contemporary, political relations, which he views as rooted in unconscious drives but oriented toward achieving a stabilization or equilibrium of those drives at the communal level. In Freud's narrative, it is the father/son relationship that matters for the establishment of this semi-stable political relation, a band of brothers with equal rights. This lineage founds political order in murderous fraternity, with women as objects of exchange not citizen-subjects.

Moreover, in explaining the advent of lawful existence, Freud identifies something recalcitrant, intractable in social arrangements—a kind of self-assault (the super-ego) that links pleasure with aggression, and thus that carries a potentially destabilizing force. The sons' attitude toward the father is one of ambivalence, hatred qualified by admiration, murder followed by guilt and remorse. The brothers commemorate this loss and maintain their bond with one another in the public ceremony of the totem meal where together they consume a common substance (the father's body transubstantiated into the sacrificed totem), and thereby affirm their fellowship and mutual obligation. This confirmation of shared paternal substance and kinship, and the collective affect of love, loss, guilt, and mourning, maintains ties of identity. The law that emerges from the father's murder ritualizes and enforces his edicts, forbidding murder and incest in the public realm, and takes hold internally in the superegoic 'no' of prohibition, producing a permanent sense of guilt that drives civilization and renders it a perpetual source of discontent. Women, however, appear not as subjects of the law but as objects of its exchange; moreover, given the indefinite prolongation of their Oedipal Complex, women will be more likely to be hostile to the edicts of civilization insofar as these infringe upon family life.

The relation between father and son is also contained, if concealed, in the account Freud offers in The Ego and the Id (1923) of how the ego emerges. There Freud writes that identification is “the earliest expression of an emotional tie with another person” (Freud 1968 [1923], 37), i.e., it is prior to object-cathexes or relations of desire. The primordial libidinal, but non-objectal, attachment is with the father of “personal prehistory” (Freud 1968 [1923], 37). The subsequent and recurring retreat from object-cathexis (investment of instinctual energy in an object) to identification (withdrawal of that energy into the self), is the primary mechanism of ego-formation, taking the lost object into oneself. Since the ego is the “precipitate” of abandoned objects, it is configured through loss, in a melancholy reabsorption that incorporates via identification objects from which the ego would otherwise be exiled. Just as the father retains dominance in political life after his death, so he dominates psychic life even prior to the ego's formation. In Freudian theory, the father's reign is pervasive, his sovereignty extended in every domain. Freud's privileging of paternal and fraternal relations provides the impetus for much of psychoanalytic feminism, as will be discussed below.

2. Feminist Criticism of Psychoanalysis

Even in Freud's circle, not all analysts agreed with Freud's assessment and there were debates concerning women's sexuality and the roles of castration and penis envy therein, notably among Karl Abraham, Ernest Jones, Helene Deutsch, and Karen Horney. Horney in particular argued for an inherent feminine disposition that is not merely a secondary formation premised on castration and she took issue with the ostensible effects of penis envy and women's supposed feelings of inferiority. As with some later feminist criticisms of Freud, Horney attempted to retrieve female sexuality, and by extension a valid form of feminine existence, by appealing to a genuinely independent nature and holding culture culpable for women's subordinate status. By thus reasserting the primacy of biological and social forces, however, Horney disputes precisely the idea that is central to Freud's hypothesis and that marks psychoanalysis as a unique field of inquiry, that of a distinctive psychical realm of representation that is unconscious.

Somewhat later, Simone de Beauvoir addressed the discourse of psychoanalysis in The Second Sex (1989 [1949]), devoting an early chapter to her distrust of “The Psychoanalytic Point of View” (Beauvoir 1989, 38–52). Like Horney, Beauvoir denounces Freud's idea that there is but one, masculine, libido and no feminine libido with “its own original nature” (Beauvoir 1989, 39). Freud, in her view, takes for granted what he needs to account for, namely the value placed on virility. Beauvoir takes Freud to task for not considering the social origins of masculine and paternal power and privilege and deems his theory inadequate to account for woman's otherness. If women envy men, she argues, it is because of the social power and privilege they enjoy, and not because of anatomical superiority. Unlike the determinisms and objectifications of human life offered by biological science (which treats human beings as determinate objects in the natural world and thus not as free or self-determining subjects with agency), but similar to the “economic monism” of historical materialism (Beauvoir 1989, 52), psychoanalysis is characterized by Beauvoir as “sexual monism” (Beauvoir 1989, 52): everything in its purview is interpreted through a single lens. Beauvoir indicates at the opening of the chapter that psychoanalysis offers a perspective which she does “not intend to criticize as a whole” (Beauvoir 1989, 38), especially since it does understand that “no factor becomes involved in the psychic life without having taken on human significance” (Beauvoir 1989, 38), but she questions both its dogmatic reliance on determinate elements of development and its “embarrassing flexibility on a basis of rigid concepts” (Beauvoir 1989, 38). Most seriously, in Beauvoir's view, psychoanalysis allots to women the same destiny of self-division and conflict between subjectivity and femininity that follows from social dictates and biological norms. Psychoanalysis presents the characteristics of femininity and subjectivity as divergent paths, incompatible with one another. Women might be able to be full persons, subjects with agency, but only at the expense of their femininity; or they can embark on the course of femininity, but only by sacrificing their independence and agency. This either/or between the masculinization of subjectivity and the submission to femininity retains the moral, political, and metaphysical opposition between free self-creation and corporeal incarceration that precludes the possibility of being both a woman and a subject.

Beauvoir alleges that psychoanalysis holds women to a fixed destiny, a developmental and teleological life process, precisely insofar as it defines subjects with reference to a past beyond their control. By assigning to women an essence or determinate identity, the psychoanalytic reliance on sexual categories once again renders woman as the other to a subject rather than a subject herself, and thereby denies her existential freedom. In Beauvoir's view, however, if women are not themselves subjects, but that in contrast with which men's subjectivities are constituted, they are still freely responsible for this situation, insofar as women collaborate in this process by seeing themselves through the eyes of men, justifying their existence through their romantic relationships, and attempting to mirror men's being. By casting women's otherness as an effect not only of their social situation (with its power relations), but also of their choices (and hence responsibility), Beauvoir preserves women's freedom, unlike the psychoanalytic discourse that she claims rejects “the idea of choice and the correlated concept of value” (Beauvoir 1989, 45).

Beauvoir's misgivings about Freud's account of femininity stem from two sources, a feminist suspicion that women, in psychoanalytic discourse, are understood on the basis of a masculine model, and an existentialist conviction that human beings are self-defining, choosing themselves through their own actions. Following her existentialist convictions, Beauvoir insists that even when women abdicate their freedom, they do so as agents responsible for their own destinies, not merely as passive victims following a developmentally determined fate. Following her feminist convictions, Beauvoir recognizes that women's choices may be constrained by powerful social and bodily forces, but insists that women nonetheless bear ultimate responsibility for realizing their own possibilities by emancipating themselves. Her reading of Freud is thus largely directed against the perceived determinism of psychoanalysis and less against the idea of an unconscious per se, although she does want to defend the notion of a unitary subject at the origin of choice, insisting that “psychic life is not a mosaic, it is a single whole in every one of its aspects and we must respect that unity” (Beauvoir 1989, 44), a supposition that certainly limits the affinities between existentialism and psychoanalysis. Nonetheless, Beauvoir's dispute with Freud appears to be less about whether constraint is part of our being in the world, and more about where that constraint is located: psychoanalysis locates constraint internally, in the constitution of the psyche itself, not only in the situations of social life, whereas Beauvoir locates it externally, in the cultural forces that impact even the most intimate sense of our own agency. Beauvoir thus claims that her own interpretations of women's femininity will disclose women in their liberty, oriented freely by the future and not simply explained by a past. She thereby ratifies the promise of existentialism for feminism.

Beauvoir's own project of elucidating the paradoxical relation between femininity and subjectivity is nonetheless influenced by psychoanalytic concepts and appropriates its theoretical insights in various ways. The Second Sex highlights the practices by which women become women through their appropriation of bodily (sexual) difference, as well as the manner in which a human being generally is limited and compelled by bodily and unconscious forces. Indeed Beauvoir and Freud seem to agree that one is not born but becomes a woman, i.e., that femininity involves some sort of (social or psychical) process rather than a biological or natural given. Both are interested in the ‘how’ of this process, how one becomes a woman, although, as discussed above, they disagree about what this ‘how’ is. Moreover, in her articulation of women's ambivalent attitudes toward embodiment, sexuality, and maternity, Beauvoir is clearly indebted to the attention psychoanalytic practice gives to listening to women's first person narratives, interpreting the emotional impact of events that can not be easily categorized, and heeding attachments that carry both affection and resentment. Like Freud, Beauvoir recognizes that we are embodied as sexual beings and that our bodies not only testify to our own finitude and limits but also matter as sites of encounters with others, encounters that are multivalent—including loving connections and threatening defenses, moments of affirmation and of dissolution. Beauvoir refuses any political program that demands we deny our bodily possibilities in order to be fully human and proclaims that bodies and bodily difference are integral to projects of selfhood, and not merely accidental contingencies of a rational and disembodied mind. For Beauvoir, as for Freud, there is no such thing as a disembodied, non-sexed human being; any ideal of the human apart from sexual identity or difference is an abstraction that can only be affirmed on the basis of a mind/body dualism. Femininity for her is not merely a mystification that imprisons women's subjectivity (even if its social construal has had this effect). Finally, like Freud, Beauvoir is fully aware of the impact on children of their domestic situation, the way familial life resonates with meaning that informs not only intimate relations but relations to the larger world.

Beauvoir's portrayal of living a feminine existence, of sexual difference as an embodied situation, developed through a series of phenomenological descriptions, tries to understand how women have been cast as other in the drama of masculine subjectivity and doubts the premise that this is an historical event, occurring at some definitive point in time. Beauvoir herself has often been (mis)read in a way analogous to her (mis)reading of psychoanalysis, as proferring a determinate succession of experiences for women, rather than describing socially extant processes. But The Second Sex depicts the effects on women's character of inequitable social arrangements; it neither proffers a normalized destiny for women nor presupposes a common metaphysical identity. Even so, in many ways Beauvoir's work is more easily aligned with the sociologically oriented Anglo-American feminists than with Irigaray and Kristeva.

3. Language, Law, and Sexual Difference

In considering the background of psychoanalytic feminism, a large portion of which is rooted in or aligned with what gets called French Feminism, the French context of psychoanalytic theory is also crucial, and in particular the work of Jacques Lacan. Lacan's work has been both a powerful influence on, and an object of critique for, feminist appropriations of psychoanalysis, and his ideas have been taken up, transformed, and challenged by Luce Irigaray and Julia Kristeva (both of whom are discussed below), among others. Lacan's work is both praised for its de-biologization of Freud and pilloried for its phallocentrism. These two aspects are in fact imbricated, as both hinge on Lacan's elaboration of language as a symbolic order that precedes and makes possible human subjectivity. In order to stay focused on the feminist deployment of the psychoanalytic theoretical apparatus, I will concentrate first on Lacan's understanding of the intersection of language and law in the symbolic order, and then on his account of the ego's formation in the imaginary order. The imaginary and symbolic are modes of representation that make the world and the self intelligible. The symbolic is Lacan's term for the way in which reality becomes intelligible and takes on meaning and significance, through words; the imaginary refers to the mode of intelligibility offered by images. The concordant and conflicting mediation of the world by images and words coordinates, or makes sense of, reality and instigates both subjectivity and social relations. As with Freud, maternal and paternal figures are central to his account of subjectivity.

Lacan characterizes his own work as fundamentally a return to Freud, albeit one that brings the insights of structural linguistics, especially Ferdinand de Saussure and Roman Jakobson, and structural anthropology, primarily Claude Levi-Strauss, into the domain of psychoanalysis. Even so, his returns are also revisions; he not only retrieves but renovates Freud's central concepts. According to Lacan, Freud's theory of sexuality anticipates a theory of signification that he could not yet elaborate. The anthropological and linguistic lineage of Lacan's thought is central to this conceptualization of a “symbolic universe.” Lacan explicitly endorses Levi-Strauss's conception of the transcendental law at the origin of human sociality as the incest taboo; he writes that “the fundamental or primary law, the one where culture begins in opposition to nature, is the law of the prohibition of incest” (Lacan 1992 [1986], 66–7). The intrusion of language and law institutes a break with nature, one that transfigures the world by imbuing it with meaning. Following the logic of Totem and Taboo, social identities are constituted on the basis of exclusions that establish kinship networks. These social bonds are maintained through mandates and prohibitions (what is required and what is forbidden), and in particular through the mandate of exogamy (with its structures of exchange) which determines that “the Oedipus complex is both universal and contingent” (Lacan 1991b [1978], 33): paternal prohibition provides the conditions for human sociality without the prohibition itself being innate. Lacan thus accounts for the transgenerational transmission of elementary structures of kinship without appealing to any natural necessity. Lacan takes this law of kinship (dictating desire and its limits) to be fundamentally co-terminous with the order of language since it is instituted through a symbolic articulation.

Lacan calls the paternal prohibition (the incest taboo) the ‘law of the father,’ and he develops the connection between law and language by way of a pun. In French Non (No) and Nom (Name) sound alike. The no that prohibits (the father's law) and the name that establishes authority (the father's name or the proper name) are conferred simultaneously. By submitting to the law of the father (his no and name) the child assumes a symbolic identity and place in the human universe of meaning, i.e., the child becomes a subject, bound by law and bearer of language. With this compliance, the child takes on a life of desire and incompletion, pursuing lost objects with no firm ground or fixed purpose, a lack of plenitude in being that Lacan designates as castration.

As discussed above in the section on Freud, Freud understands women to be ‘castrated,’ deprived of a penis, and men to live under the threat of castration. Lacan complicates this theoretical perspective by deeming all subjects, all speaking beings, to be castrated, by which he means deprived of the phallus, which is not the same as the penis. While the penis is a biological organ, the phallus is a signifier which invokes or points toward other signifiers, or toward a system of signifiers. The moment of castration is the primordial moment of loss, the fracturing of being by language. With entry into the reign of law and language, subjects are cut off from the immediacy of bodily experience; relations to things, and to oneself and others, are now mediated by words and representations. The distinction between phallus and penis can be seen to carry forward Freud's own distinction between instinct and drive, since in each case the latter term indicates that the experience of the body has meaning insofar as it takes place in the medium of language and in a world of others.

Castration takes place when the child recognizes lack in the mother and her maternal omnipotence is annulled. The mother, for the child, ceases to be the all-powerful provider of every satisfaction as she herself is a desiring being deprived of satisfaction. This conundrum of maternal desire points elsewhere, toward “the law introduced by the father” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 582). The paternal prohibition intervenes to warn the child that s/he is not the answer to the question of the mother's desire. Galvanized by the mother's lack, the law of the father (which need not be embodied in an actual person) takes the place of the desire of the mother, substitutes for it, occludes it. Indeed the paternal function, working through name and law, indicates a dead father, just as Freud understands in Totem and Taboo that the murdered father, the precondition of law, is stronger than the living one. In the Lacanian version of the Oedipal Complex, human beings achieve a sexual position by traversing the Oedipal Complex, i.e., by submitting to castration, also called the phallic function, and thereby entering into signification. There is thus no sexual difference prior to representation.

Here we arrive at the phallocentrism, if not the patriarchalism, of Lacan's thought, the central role of the phallus in his thinking about subjectivity and sexual difference. According to Lacan, the phallus instates the signifier into the subject regardless of any “anatomical distinction between the sexes” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 576). The phallus, in other words, is responsible for the child's passage from immersion in perceptual immediacy to a representational domain in which the world takes on meaning. It is this claim that de-biologizes Freud, since it articulates the function of the phallus apart from any particular bodily attributes. Lacan insists that the phallus is a signifier, not an image or bodily organ, and that in relation to it all are castrated. The father's No effectively says to the child ‘you are not the object of the mother's desire’ or ‘you are not her phallus, the thing that fulfills her.’ As such, it also conveys the message that the child too is lacking or desiring. Although Lacan distinguishes between a ‘seeming to be’ which characterizes femininity, in the attempt to be the phallus that one is not (to be the object of desire), from a ‘seeming to have’ which characterizes masculinity in the attempt to have the phallus that one does not have (to possess the object of desire), he still maintains that everyone is lacking the phallus in some way, either in the mode of not being it or in the mode of not having it. Nonetheless, while Lacan centers human experience not on the supposed biological fixity of anatomical distinctions, but on a representational economy, the phallus retains its associations with masculinity and remains the focal point of sexual identity.

As already discussed, Freud had theorized that there is only one libido and it is masculine. In “The Signification of the Phallus,” Lacan explicitly addresses, and criticizes, the alternative view that there might be two libidos, which he satirizes as a kind of sexual equality, the “equality of natural rights” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 577). This is the view I earlier mentioned as belonging to Karen Horney who defends the idea of an inherent, underived, biologically-based, nature of feminine sexuality. Lacan also disparages the idea that the final stage of genital sexuality is directed toward the entire person in his or her personhood, the achievement of a kind of tenderness toward the whole being of another (Lacan 2006 [1970], 580). Lacan disputes both of these positions as normalizing and biologizing and claims that the psyche is not harmonized with nature in either of these ways. In contrast to this fantasy of sexual complementarity, the idea that men's and women's sexual interests converge, Freud, Lacan claims, understood “the essential disturbance of human sexuality” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 575), that we are always lacking, always in search of aims and objects, “the deviation of man's needs due to the fact that he speaks” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 579), and that this discordance means also that there is no symmetrical or harmonious sexual relation between well-integrated and self-realized men and women.

This symbolic dimension of human relations must be clearly distinguished from the imaginary as the domain of the ego. The imaginary order is most fundamentally and plainly elucidated in Lacan's essay “The Mirror Stage as Formative of the I Function as Revealed in Psychoanalytic Experience,” where he elaborates Freud's insights in The Ego and the Id, taking up the idea that the ego is first and foremost a bodily ego formed through the “projection of a surface” (Freud 1968 [1923], 27), a visual representation of an external veneer or façade. Lacan concurs, writing that consciousness occurs “each time … there's a surface such that it can produce what is called an image” (Lacan 1991b [1978], 49). The mirror stage commences, pre-Oedipally, when the infant is around 6 months old. The infant at this age is literally infans, without speech and moreover, without bodily coordination or motor control. Born prematurely, at a point prior to any adequate capacity for self-care, the infant is wholly instinctually inept. By identifying itself with an image, a coherent unity that contrasts to its own fragmented and dispersed bodily existence, the infant forms a preliminary self, one animated by an illusion but an illusion that allows it to anticipate its own future organization.

Lacan's account of the mirror stage establishes the ego as fundamentally imaginary, formed through the infant's specular captivation with the unitary form presented in images of itself which it assumes as its own through identification. This perceptual image of coherent bodily contours and boundaries is at odds with the infant's motor incapacity and the “turbulent movements” or fragmented drives that animate its own body and processes. The ego, with its illusion of self-mastery and containment, is formed through misrecognition, an anticipatory identification with an idealized, stable, self-enclosed, citadel of self. This identification with an image of oneself sets up the ego as rivalrous, narcissistic, and aggressive. While the act of misrecognition becomes the basis for a sense of self or for self-consciousness, it is also an act of alienation, exclusion, or self-division; by erecting an imaginary ideal, representing oneself in a perfected image, the self is also split and rendered unconscious to itself, cut off from the multiplicity of dispersed drives.

For Lacan, the ego is a “knot of imaginary servitude” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 80) and thus the site of the subject's stagnancy and inertia. The mirror stage also forms the basis of Lacan's critique of ego psychology; whereas the latter takes strengthening the ego to be the aim of analytic practice, Lacan takes the aspirations of the ego to be a “lure” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 78) of self-possession, an armor that rigidifies the subject and resists freedom and movement, a defensive structure that provides an alienating identity. With this theory of the ego, Lacan presents a subject at odds with itself, non-self-identical, in “primordial Discord” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 78), torn between unity and anarchy, organization and chaos, integration and fragmentation. The withdrawal of the self from itself proceeds from the reflexivity of representational practices of language. The ego as object is trapped in oppositional relationships, including with itself, and cannot therefore be equated with the subject as speaking being who, in the use of words, signifiers that are differentially related to one another, is capable of more complex plays of presence and absence; language, unlike perception (I perceive an object or I don't), can evoke simultaneously the presence and the absence of the thing (I can represent objects that are not present).

While the advent of the symbolic order is tied to Oedipalization, and the imaginary order is tied to the pre-Oedipal period, it would be mistaken to think of the imaginary and symbolic in only developmental or chronological terms as they are also ongoing structures of experience. Even in the seemingly dyadic relation between mother and child, Lacan argues, a third term is always at work. Initially this third term is simply a question, the question of the mother's desire, of what she wants, but already this question interrupts or destabilizes the child's position, rents dyadic unity, even as the child takes itself to be this object of desire, since it indicates in a preliminary way that the mother is lacking, that she is not whole, entire, omnipotent. The question of desire, in other words, means that the phallic mother of the imaginary is already the castrated mother of the symbolic, and that the imaginary unity of the ego, with its oppositional relations, is bound to be sublated into a symbolic relation of difference.

It is important, however, not to conflate the mother with the woman or maternity with femininity. Lacan famously declares that “there's no such thing as Woman, Woman with a capital W indicating the universal” (Lacan, 1998 [1975], 72), a metaphysical concept with determinate and substantive content. In asserting that ‘The Woman’ does not exist, Lacan indicates that something of the psyche escapes castration, limitation, signification, and the demands of the law of the father. Symbolic and imaginary representations leave something out, hit their limit, produce an impasse that presents a fracture or fissure in the symbolic order. While sexual difference is mediated by representation, it cannot be fully contained within its terms.

The idea that sexual difference is not biologically innate but established through language and law has led some feminists to conclude that Lacan is on the side of social constructionism but this would be mistaken. Lacan is adamant that the choice between nature and culture is a false one, and that language is not a “social phenomenon” (Lacan 2006 [1970], 578). Language and law, personified by the name of the father, are irreducible to social practices and processes and are in fact the condition of their possibility. While Lacan is criticized for constituting sexual difference on the basis of the phallic function and subjectivity on the basis of paternal authority, what the Lacanian project does provide for feminism is not the idea of a malleable culture, susceptible to human mastery, as distinct from a fixed nature that escapes it, but the more disconcerting idea that human mastery, of ourselves, of others, of nature and culture, is itself illusory. Rather than the promise of a rational progress toward greater and greater equality, respect for individual difference, and universality, Lacan's insights, like Freud's, point toward the precariousness of identity and social bonds and to the instability of the drives that attach us to one another. Subjectivity and sexuality are not natural adaptations but deviations, detours, breaks from nature that undermine identity and divide or limit any unity of self or community. In addition to the distinctiveness of his method, focus, and insight, this willingness to grapple with the limits of self-mastery is one reason why Lacan has been taken as an innovative and amenable resource for some feminist theorists. In exposing the inadequacies of social or empirical accounts of sexual difference, identity, and the power relations built upon them, Lacan confronts the fundamental structures at the root of empirical socio-historical circumstances.

4. French Feminism

French Feminism is in many ways a misnomer since the authors thus characterized are rarely of French origin or nationality (although French is the predominant language of their writing) and not necessarily overtly self-identified as feminist. The writers affiliated with French Feminism, including Luce Irigaray, Julia Kristeva, Sarah Kofman, Catherine Clement, and Helene Cixous, among others, variously ask about the relation between the maternal and the feminine, doubt that we can say what a woman is, worry about Freud's lack of attention to mothers, play with writing style, wonder about feminine subjectivity, ask if women can be subjects or citizens without adapting to masculine norms, impeach Lacan's phallocentrism, and suspect that access to language assimilates women into neutralized brothers. Unlike Beauvoir, they are philosophically and temperamentally more sympathetic to the split of subjectivity detailed by psychoanalysis, the idea that I am not I, that self-division rather than self-identity is the fundamental feature of human existence, and therefore that the subject is not a unitary point of origin for choice. Like Beauvoir, they ask whether the structures of femininity and the structures of subjectivity are compatible, commensurable, reconcilable, and are vexed by the apprehension that they are fundamentally at odds. While they aim to disentangle femininity from maternity, and provide a critique of their conflation, they also take seriously the significance of maternity for women and for children of both sexes. Because they concede the limits of socio-cultural explanations for women's lack of standing in the social contract, and take femininity and the feminine body as points of departure for speech or writing, they have often been accused of essentialism. Below I focus on the work of Irigaray and Kristeva, examining how they engage with and transform the ideas of Freud and Lacan, and how they articulate sexual difference as integrally connected to the foundation, and disruption, of a symbolic order.

4.1 The Impasse of Feminine Subjectivity

Irigaray characterizes her own project as taking place in three stages: first, deconstructing the masculine subject; second, figuring the possibility for a feminine subject; and third, construing an intersubjectivity that respects sexual difference (Irigaray 1995a, 96). Sexual difference, in her view, is not a system of domination to be overcome but a cultural process and practice to be achieved and nourished; the actual relations of domination and subordination that characterize Western politics, society, history, literature, language, and law, epitomize for Irigaray the reign of sexual indifference, the fraternal order of equal brothers/citizens that is inattentive to the self-division of nature, its immanent sexual differentiation. Irigaray's writings implicate Freud in this culture of sexual indifference, his work a symptom of masculine metaphysics and its dream of self-identity and self-mastery. I will discuss Irigaray's understanding of sexual indifference further below, after first describing and elucidating her style of writing.

Irigaray's writing style is often mimetic, an approach that she claims has been “historically assigned to the feminine” (Irigaray 1985b, 76) and therefore that she adopts deliberately in order to “try to recover the place of her exploitation by discourse” (Irigaray 1985b, 76). Irigaray's writing does not proceed propositionally, laying down theses and supporting arguments, nor is it formulated through conventionally linear explanations. This is not to say, of course, that she does not draw conclusions or that her writing is empty of insight. But these insights are reached by mirroring the text she is reading, allowing it to play out its tensions and contradictions, juxtaposing, transfiguring, and intensifying its crises and putting its parapraxes (its textual and conceptual slips of the tongue) on display. Her writing is driven by the vagaries of the author before her, and makes appear, or unmasks, the structuring forces of the text and its impasses and limits. This reading strategy goes to work on the unconscious logic of a text, revealing the author's underlying fantasies and anxieties by amplifying and reflecting them, and thereby attempting to loosen the masculine hold on the symbolic by conveying its unstated postulates and conversing from a different perspective. Intently attentive to the signifer, to the words and silences of psychoanalytic texts, she aims to retrieve the bodily in language, something underlying symbolic processes of representation, and to invent a new language and imagine new forms.

Speculum of the Other Woman (her dissertation and the work that got her exiled from the Lacanian school) includes “The Blind Spot of an Old Dream of Symmetry,” Irigaray's long essay on Freud's writings on femininity. Irigaray's essay on Freud begins by tackling head-on his articulation of the riddle of femininity (Irigaray 1985a, 13) in his lecture on “Femininity.” Here already we can recognize both Irigaray's unique style and her critical project, and the way these two features of her writing are imbricated and entangled with one another, propelling a distinctively mimetic method of reading, repeating, and reproducing the text, mirroring Freud's speculative discourse but also transforming and sabotaging its terms. Her text opens as Freud's does, with his words, and is comprised of long quotations that follow the course of Freud's essay. Insofar as this appropriation might at first appear as the passive listening of a dutiful daughter, Irigaray performs a kind of masquerade of femininity: receptive, submissive, obedient. But this performance does not merely reiterate or reproduce; in exemplifying the ways in which women have no language of their own, can only speak in or through the voice of the father, she is establishing the symbolic terrain upon which any critique must move while also subverting its presuppositions. Her own words are inserted as commentary, question, counterpoint, breaking open the Freudian text, usurping its privileges, revealing its wounds. By engaging Freud in a conversation, she insists on her own status as a speaking subject, and not merely an object of study in support of the expansion of a sexist science.

Irigaray's insistence on her own speech is especially crucial given Freud's reprimand to women: “you are yourselves the problem” (Freud 1968 [1933], 113). Freud's lecture had ventured to address the question of sexual difference, and had endeavored to complicate rather than simplify our perceptions and certainties concerning its meaning and status. Irigaray, however, by retrieving and replaying Freud's voice, attempts to show that he remains caught up in certainties and dogmatisms about sex, so that ultimately his discourse is one of sexual indifference, as I will discuss next. Freud is thus not the master of Irigaray's essay: his words do not so much determine her trajectory as reveal their own (freely) associative character, his own unmastery, the egoic and identificatory fantasies that haunt his texts on femininity.

According to Irigaray, Freud's work is sexually indifferent because of its assumption of a kind of symmetry or harmony between masculine and feminine identities and sexualities. With regard to sexual desire, Freud assumes that ‘normal’ women will desire men and be desired by them and thus that each sex can fulfill the longings of the other. With regard to sexual identity, Freud models the feminine Oedipal Complex on a masculine paradigm and origin, with the feminine as its distorted copy. In both cases, Freud contrives to understand women as the complementary other to men, an other modeled on the same. Irigaray considers this to be a monosexual, homosocial economy governed by specular opposition or mirroring. It is this sexual indifference that is referenced in the title of Irigaray's essay as “the old dream of symmetry.” But, as also indicated by her title, Irigaray believes this dream is premised on a “blindspot.” Freud characterizes the girl's relation to the maternal figure as an “especially inexorable repression” (Freud 1968 [1931], 226) and views the little girl as a little man; the mother/daughter relation is not seen or apprehended by him. The crime here, in Irigaray's view, is matricide and the suppression of maternal genealogies or lines of descent. The law of the father, the patrimonial order by which sons inherit the father's name by submitting to his prohibitions, privileging this name over the maternal body, appropriates even birth to the father. The maternal lineage is suppressed. Irigaray argues that this means that a pre-Oedipal mother-daughter relationship has not been taken up by the signifying order; in fact that order retroactively denies that such a relation ever existed, since a daughter becomes a daughter properly, becomes feminized or sexually differentiated (as a girl or woman), only post-Oedipally. In Lacanian terms, Freud excludes the mother/daughter relation from the symbolic order. Not only is the maternal connection lost or repressed, but the ability to name or identify the loss as a loss is also barred. Banished from memory, the loss of the mother cannot be mourned. Irigaray claims that it is this genealogical asymmetry, with the father's name memorialized and the mother's body sacrificed to it, that sustains the legitimacy of patriarchy and propels the fantasy of a harmony of sexual difference, the conviction that the sexes are reciprocal and complementary in their identities and desires.

Sexual difference, in Irigaray's reading of Freud, is thus subsumed under or derived from “the problematics of sameness” (Irigaray 1985a, 26) and oriented by the fantasy of auto-genesis, being one's own origin, an ideal of self-mastery that is not threatened by any real difference. Freud's account of sexuality presupposes that the sexual subject is male, and even that there are no women, only mothers or those destined to become mothers, that is that the meaning of being a woman is fully exhausted in the meaning of being a mother. In the psychical pre-history of the little girl as elaborated in the idea that “the little girl is a little man” (Freud 1968 [1933], 118), she will not have been a daughter. As little girls diverge from little boys, as they cease to be little men, they are expected to be appealing visual objects, the mirror of men's desires, enabling men to represent themselves, shore up their self-image with an adoring reflection. Irigaray sees in this account a masculine desire for women's desire to be directed toward men. Women are expected to provide the mirror that supports men's projects, nurtures and nourishes their identities, energizes their drive for mastery, by presenting themselves as an alter ego. This imaginary, specular, order is matricidal, feeding on the blood of women, leaving unpaid its fundamental debt to the mother, and abandoning the subjectivity of the daughter. By repressing dependence on the maternal origin of life, the masculine is marked as originary, that from which differentiation proceeds. What functions as a primal loss for boys/sons, the cause of their desire, can only function as a gap in language, an absence of meaning for girls/daughters, an exile from desire, language, and other women, an irretrievable void that cannot be recuperated in language because it is instigated by language, by the entry into symbolic order called forth by the paternal prohibition of the father's no/name. Irigaray's concern is that for Freud, the mother is only a mirror and her relationship is always to a son; there are no mother/daughter relations. Not only is Western culture premised on matricide, which she claims is more primordial than the patricide of Totem and Taboo, but this matricide is forgotten and the mother remains unmourned.

Repressing any maternal genealogy, political life has been predicated on the lineage between fathers and sons and the bonds of brotherhood, appropriating universality and citizenship to men and rendering women as objects of their desire and exchange. The exploitation of women is not merely a phenomenon that takes place within the social order, it is its very foundation and premise. Irigaray calls the fraternal order “hom(m)osexuality,” meaning both that it is an order of the same (homo) and that it is the order of men (homme): the regime of sexual indifference ignores relations among women, and especially between mothers and daughters, and situates women as the medium of men's alliances with one another, as the buried support and energetic reserves of the body politic. This forgetting of the mother supports vertical and horizontal relations between men but leaves women unrepresented in language (as subjects) and incapable of achieving representation in the body politic (as citizens). Irigaray's own project thus aims to criticize the hom(m)osexual order and its specular economy, to reinvigorate mother/daughter relations to make possible a feminine subjectivity, and to cultivate sexual difference in the political realm, in civil identity. Developing the resources for transformation, i.e., for women to become citizens and subjects, entails disrupting the transmission of power between men and rethinking the passage from nature to culture represented by the Oedipal Complex. This task requires intervening in the symbolic and imaginary realms, creating a new language that would not be severed from the body and ending the division of labor between love and law.

The structure of the representational economy, its association of subjectivity with masculinity, precludes the convergence of being a woman and being a speaking being. Although of course there are words for women, these words constitute her only with reference to masculinity, as a photographic negative of man, or in response to a patriarchal exertion of feminine norms and expectations. They secure her in a masculine universe, they say in advance what she is, they render her captive to an idea of feminine essence. By contrast, Irigaray seeks to create a representation for women that would not be a designation of what she is, defining her by and holding her to some concrete essence, but would allow her to exist on her own terms and speak for herself. Irigaray believes that this type of self-determination is barred by the exclusion of mother-daughter genealogies, an exclusion that works to assign woman to a maternal destiny (as mothers of men). Neither denotative nor expressive, neither speaking of woman (as though woman were a determinate object of study) nor speaking as one (as though the aim were to express an inner essence), Irigaray's writing establishes a reflexive relation to language. By acquiescing, in her mimetic writing style, to the cultural expectation of feminine artifice, Irigaray stages her own exiled agency and thereby extends the possibilities for being a woman to include being not only an object in or reference of language but a transformer of language. Without claiming to say what a woman really is, to get right what the symbolic order gets wrong, she shows that in speaking differently, the very meaning of being a woman (or being a man) can be transformed, so that sexual difference remains open to new possibilities. She thus does not so much refute Freud's account of the Oedipal Complex and the little girl's purported masculinity as re-present its primal crime against women, the Oedipal exclusion of maternal dependency, thereby altering the scene of its representation.

Irigaray also challenges the Lacanian idea of the law of the father and the phallic signifier, pillorying the way in which natural birth has been assigned to maternity while cultural birth is assigned to paternity, equating the woman-mother with body and the man-father with language and law, and relegating the bodily process of parturition (maternity) to mute nature while valorizing the symbolic process of legitimation (paternity) as constitutive of civilization. Human subjectivity has been masculinized, while human flesh is both feminized and animalized. Irigaray aims to provoke a legitimation crisis in the paternal legacy and the name of the father that bestows on the child a political and familial identity.

The erasure of sexual difference enables a metaphysics of substance in which sexual identity is a matter of fixed and pre-determined being, of underlying essences or common properties, rather than a form of becoming and self-generation. Irigaray's genealogical account of sexual difference resists both the idea of an invariant universal (and hence sexually neutral) human essence that subtends (and thereby expels) human multiplicity and the idea of sexual essences that consist in self-enclosed identities between which there is an uncrossable divide. That is, she rejects the ontological assumptions of both universal equality and separatism, taking both to be implicitly masculine and patriarchal, bound to a metaphysical essentialism that aims to capture diversity in first or final principles, or to subsume particulars under general concepts. Challenging the logic of the one and the many, Irigaray takes the self-division of nature, its being-two, as a model of autonomous self-development. When Irigaray says that human nature is two, she does not mean that there are two fixed sexual substances, but that to be natural is to be embodied, finite, divided, that the fundamental character of nature is growth through differentiation. Human nature, in her view, is not disembodied or neutral; it is always distinctively sexed or sexuate, a neologism for sexed, but not necessarily erotic, bodily difference. Viewing the natural body as self-differentiating rather than self-identical, Irigaray also articulates distinctive capacities for generation corresponding to differing morphological possibilities (the possibilities of bodily form) that entail “different subjective configurations” (Irigaray 2001 [1994], 137).

If human nature is two, and always divided, Irigaray argues, then civil identity is also two and divided; the two of nature needs to be brought into the two of culture. The one is an illusion of patriarchy, while the two threatens the phallocentric order and challenges the supposition that universality must be singular. The scandalous idea of a feminine subjectivity means that the universal must be doubled. Doubling the universal does not, for Irigaray, mean merely replacing a neutral universality (something that holds true for all human beings) with two wholly distinct and separate truths. A universal that has been doubled has also been split or divided from itself, no longer one, and Irigaray sees in this the possibility for cultivating sexual difference and overcoming a culture of sexual indifference that is dependent on the idea of the generic human.

If the other has always been formulated on the basis of the same, as merely a specific difference from some underlying generic identity, there has only been complementarity and opposition, there has never been an actual other subject, each with its own path of development. Women have mirrored men's subjectivities, reflected their egos back to them in an illusion of wholeness and unity, submitted to the demand that they perform or masquerade femininity. Given this criticism of the exploitation of otherness, and despite her criticism of a feminist politics of equality, Irigaray thus cannot be simplistically aligned with the project of difference, if this means asserting features of women's biological or social specificity as essential and innately valuable attributes, since these Irigaray takes to be framed already and in advance by a patriarchal symbolic and imaginary order. Irigaray's affirmation of sexual difference does not mean affirming the feminine traits that have been ascribed to women, since these are actually, in her view, the traits of sexual indifference, defined only with reference to men. Sexual difference has yet to appear and it is her task to bring it into being.

Being-two is counterposed to the metaphysical alteration between the one and the many, with its incessant oscillation between the essentialism of a rigid identity and the laissez-faire contingency, independent of any determining essence, of unlimited multiplicity and atomistic individualism. It is on the basis of this being-two that Irigaray attempts to build an ethics of sexual difference, a political relation between-two, with civil rights appropriate to sexuate identity, so that one's identity as a citizen is not cut off from the body, and law is not severed from nature. If sexual difference is not simply an effect of oppression, then freedom does not mean freedom from sexed embodiment. While political neutrality can only recognize disembodied subjects deprived of their bodily life, for Irigaray, citizens are not abstractions. The doubled, non-neutral, universal allows for distinctively feminine (and distinctively masculine) subjects to be recognized politically.

Similarly to Beauvoir, who ascertains that language and culture constitute the subject as masculine, and the feminine as other to him, Irigaray maintains that inhabiting a feminine subjectivity is paradoxical in a fraternal social order. But, for Irigaray, both Beauvoir and Freud fail to address sexual difference insofar as they retain a singular notion of masculine subjectivity, Freud because he presumes the libido is always masculine, and Beauvoir because she reckons the aim of women's emancipation as equality with men (for instance by concluding the Second Sex with a call to brotherhood and seeming, arguably, to be calling for women to assimilate to masculine norms of selfhood). Irigaray rejects the project of equality, since ‘equality’ can only ever mean equality to men, and proposes instead doubling the notion of subjectivity in line with the subject's own self-division. This might seem unnecessary, especially to equality-oriented feminists, since of course, women can, at least in much of the liberal, democratic world, be citizen-subjects, just like men. But Irigaray's point is that women can have the rights of men only so long as they are like men, i.e., insofar as they are brothers, subsumed into the neutral individuality of the liberal social contract. This purportedly equal access to citizenship and subjectivity thus does not resolve the paradox, since it merely takes the side of subjectivity over that of femininity, retaining the constitution of the feminine as lack, the inverted image of man, the other of the same, that which stands in the way of political agency and obstructs autonomy, and which thus must be overcome in order to achieve self-determination. In the prevailing social contract, femininity and subjectivity remain opposed.

Irigaray does not think she can say what a woman is or what femininity is. Familial, social, and symbolic mechanisms of exchange have denied femininity its own images and language, fashioning women through men's language, images, and desires, and thereby producing an apparent, but false, symmetry within a single, monotonous, language. Against this homogeny, with its same and its other, Irigaray construes the production or work of sexual difference, sexual difference as a relation between-two, to be the path toward liberating both femininity and masculinity from their metaphysical and political constraints by allowing them each to cultivate their own interdependent natures. The idea of a between-two does not mean a singular path that is shared by both, but rather indicates, in addition to the value of a specifically feminine sexual identity and a specifically masculine sexual identity, the ethical path of an intersubjective relationality that allows them to appreciate and value one another. Since the between-two is premised on being-two (self-differentiated), it is in the cultivation of this sexual difference that we will find the possibility of an ethical sexual relation, what Irigaray calls an ethics of sexual difference. For Irigaray, then, contra Lacan, there can be a sexual relation. Irigaray's undertaking thus involves not merely an assertion of difference against equality, nor certainly a simple reversal; such stances take place on the basis of an already existing symbolic order and imaginary relation and are themselves what need to be interrogated. To find a language for feminine sexuality and feminine subjectivity, we must go “back through the dominant discourse” (Irigaray 1985b, 119) with its metaphysical assumptions of substance or essence, and its concept of identity which adheres to the regime of sexual indifference.

Although Irigaray often invokes the maternal as the source of life and subjectivity, she does not equate maternity with femininity or the mother with the woman. Among many others, Jessica Benjamin (whose work will be discussed below) seems to share the mistaken view that Irigaray's theoretical project is premised upon valorizing “female genitals as a starting point for a different desire” (Benjamin 1988, 276). No doubt this (mis)interpretation stems from Irigaray's difficult text “When Our Lips Speak Together.” But what Irigaray means by ‘speaking from the body’ is moving away from a singular conception of origin and desire, and most especially the origin of desire. Her writing of women's bodies, like her retrieval of mother/daughter genealogies is a strategy of language and imagination, situating the body as fluid border, the site of the overflow of culture into nature and vice versa, rather than a self-enclosed egoic center. She is not an essentialist who views women's biology as their destiny. Instead she challenges the nature/culture divide, and the either/or of biology or civilization.

4.2 Subjectivity, Alterity, and Alienation

While often grouped together in cursory overviews of so-called French Feminism, Irigaray and Kristeva have fundamentally disparate projects (and locations in the academy), both with regard to their critical analyses and with regard to their political enterprises. Whereas Irigaray was a student of Lacan who breaks with (even as she is inspired by) his teachings from her earliest work, Kristeva has a much more ambiguous relationship to his school of thought and was never his student or attended his seminars. Their respective views can perhaps best be captured with respect to their attitude toward the symbolic violence of castration (the Oedipal Complex) and the social contract. As explained above, Irigaray envisions a sexuate culture that would overcome the Oedipal demands of a sacrificial economy and restore feminine genealogies to the work of civilization. Kristeva, by contrast, argues that there is no subjectivity beyond sacrifice and does not believe Oedipus can or should be overcome. Kristeva and Irigaray do not form a cohort and they do not respond to each other's writings. But they both have psychoanalytic training and practices and both attend to the body and the drives, taking up the theme of loss or exile of the mother's body and the impact of matricide on social relations. Kristeva even (echoing Irigaray) condemns humanism as “the fraternity of the same” (Kristeva 1998, 168) and, like Irigaray, she plays with writing style, offering experimental, innovative, sometimes imagistic portraits of psychical moods, maternal practices, and artistic endeavors.

Kristeva's connection to feminist thought is also unsettled and volatile, although her focus on questions pertaining to language, femininity, and the maternal body has made her work amenable to feminist interest and development. In her essay “Women's Time,” she classifies the feminist movement into three distinct times or generations, each with its own approach to and vision of justice. The first generation is universalist in principle and aspires to give women a place within history and the social contract; this generation takes equality as its mission and asserts women's identification with the dominant values of rationality. Kristeva aligns Beauvoir with this project of pursuing access to universal subjectivity. The second generation is reactive, rejecting the idea of assimilation to values taken to be masculine; this generation insists on feminine difference. While Kristeva does not mention Irigaray, it seems clear that Kristeva would align her with this strategy and the project of recognizing feminine specificity. In Kristeva's view, the first generation is so committed to universal equality that it denies bodily difference, and the second generation is so committed to difference that it refuses to partake of a history it deems to be masculine. The third generation follows neither the path of fixing identity nor the path of neutralizing difference in the medium of universality. Instead it embraces ambiguity and non-identity, respecting both the value of participating in historical time and the ineluctability of bodily difference. The third generation recognizes that it is as embodied beings that we enter into the social contract and community with others.

Since Kristeva believes that there is no subjectivity and no sociality without the violence of the symbolic contract and the splitting of subjectivity, the feminism that she proposes would not take refuge from this violence either by standing outside history (as the second generation does), or by denying women's bodies and desires (as the first generation does). Taking seriously the intransigence of sexual difference, and the violent fractures within and of identity, Kristeva advocates feminist support for alienation that would not pretend to reconcile the rupture between body and law (what Lacan calls castration) and would refuse the solace of identity. Kristeva mentions the bodily experience of pregnancy, an experience of being split, of being two in one, as manifesting the instability of, and alterity within, identity.

This insistence on the fragility and precariousness of identity can be grasped in the first instance by looking at Kristeva's understanding of the drives and language. Kristeva introduces the notion of the semiotic as the affective dimension of language that facilitates its energetic movement. The semiotic is the materiality of language, its tonal and rhythmic qualities, its bodily force. In Kristeva's account, the drives are not simply excluded by language but also inscribed as an alien element within it. While more primitive than signification, the semiotic participates in signifying practices.

Kristeva's elaboration of the semiotic situates it at a point prior to the Lacanian imaginary, i.e., prior to the moment at which the infant identifies with its own ego and distinguishes itself from an object. Still in porous relation to another body, without clear borders or limits, the infant is propelled by the anarchic, heterogenous, rhythmic flow of drive energy “which has no thesis and no position” (Kristeva 1984, 26). Mobile and provisional, moving through the body of the not-yet subject, the semiotic is a chaotic force anterior to language, unlocalizable because it courses through an as yet undifferentiated materiality in which the infantile body is not yet distinct from the maternal body. Kristeva calls this stage pre-thetic since it is prior to the reign of propositions, judgments, positions, and theses, these being subsequent possibilities that might arrest or seize a movement that always exceeds them. Since the image is itself a kind of sign, a first representation, the advent of the imaginary demarcates the first thetic break, a break from nature and into the realm of convention. What Kristeva means by the thetic then includes both the imaginary (the mirror stage) and the symbolic (the Oedipal Complex) dimensions of Lacan. Only with the advent of the thetic phase, the “threshold of language” (Kristeva 1984, 45), can there be said to be signification proper along with negation as judgment. In thereby altering Lacan's understanding of the imaginary or mirror stage, she attends to the pre-Oedipal mother/child relation in a way he does not, while also elaborating on an underdeveloped theme in Freud's work.

Freud distinguishes between auto-erotism and primary narcissism, attributing to the latter a new psychical action. While auto-erotism precedes the formation of the ego and the individuation of the self, primary narcissism only ensues with the preliminary development of egoic unity, when the ego is able to demarcate itself from the surrounding world and take itself for an object. The semiotic corresponds to the diffuse drive energy of auto-erotism and Kristeva takes up Freud's challenge to assess the psychical action of ego-formation that enables primary narcissism, which she attributes to a primary identification with the imaginary father. In Tales of Love, which jumps off from Freud's claim in The Ego and the Id that identification with the father of individual pre-history is prior to and more primary than object-cathexis, Kristeva offers an original account of the pre-Oedipal period, finding a paternal figure there. Since the bond of identification precedes any bond with objects, the imaginary father is what makes possible the initial separation between ego and object, or rather proto-ego and proto-object. This father is not the first object, but the first identification, making language and love possible, movement within and among a world of others. This identification, Kristeva hypothesizes, alters maternal space, interrupts it with something beyond its borders. But it also indicates that there is a preliminary pre-thetic symbolic capacity at work in infantile life. As the drives expel, detach, or isolate a proto-object, the space of differentiation is supported by identification with the imaginary father, who holds it open. The imaginary father is here associated with love (unlike the symbolic father who is associated with law), an invitation to language and subjectivity, to become a being who can have relations with others.

Kristeva accepts Freud's insight that the thetic break, or the prohibitory break of the Oedipal Complex and the dead father, that founds law and sociality is violent and murderous (Kristeva 1984, 70). The capacity for representation transforms our perceptual universe, entailing that no bodily immediacy is possible, that all experience will be mediated by significatory practices and filtered through the ego's organization. But although this rent in experience is suffered by the signifying child as a loss to be mourned, it is also, Kristeva claims, a gift, the gift of a self that can navigate language. With words and memories available, the child can compensate for the loss of objects in perception (in the exemplary case, learning to endure the mother's absence). On Kristeva's view, “the structural violence of language's irruption as the murder of soma, the transformation of the body, the captation of drives” (Kristeva 1984, 75), is preceded by a loving father who makes possible the preliminary individuation of the infant from the mother. Although symbolic violence is integral to the maintenance of a social order, the promise of language on Kristeva's account is initially brought forward by love, not by law. Unlike Irigaray, who wants to retrieve the pre-Oedipal period in order to reclaim feminine genealogies, Kristeva wants only to redescribe it in order to reassess its import for individuation and creative self-transformation. She takes infantile matricide (separation from the mother) to be a necessary condition of subjectivity and not a remnant of patriarchal violence.

Still, Kristeva charts differing arcs for the paternal and maternal relationships in the constitution of subjectivity. The imaginary father empowers a new psychic space premised on the distinction between internal and external, self and other. The breaking in of the signifier inaugurates individuation, the assumption of bodily form and corporeal unity, and thereby entails loss of the maternal body. In Kristeva's view, matricide, repression of the maternal body, is a necessary event on the way to subjectivity. The bodily exchange between mother and child can serve as a barrier to love, imprisoning the child in an overwhelming bond. The loving mother provides the first approach to language and law by demonstrating love for an object who is not the child, a third outside this dyad who makes the dyadic relationship itself possible and releases the emotional pressure of it. The loving father proffers a kind of promise, even as he disrupts fusion with the mother, allowing and encouraging the child to represent itself. Kristeva's thought here follows Lacan's idea that a mother whose only object of desire is her child will produce a child who cannot move beyond the psychosis of being the phallus for her.

Signification and language are sites of sublimation, creative workings out of the drives, but they can be stalled by abjection and melancholia which are both preconditions for, but also limits to, subjectification. Kristeva identifies abjection and melancholia as sites of psychical (and social) crisis rooted in narcissistic disorder. In them, the tenuous processes of ego-formation risk collapse; faced with difficulty clarifying the boundaries of the self, the subject reverts to ambivalent aggressivity. While Kristeva understands narcissism to be a fundamental, if unstable, structure of the psyche, abjection and melancholia are problematic relations to the maternal body and its loss (or the malfunctioning of its loss). They are experiences of disintegration or dissolution of the ego without reorganization, but also of its rabid fortification.

In Powers of Horror: An Essay on Abjection, the abject is described as neither inside nor outside, neither subject nor object, neither self nor other, troubling identity and order with the instability of boundaries, borders, and limits. Kristeva offers the examples of bodily fluids, sweat, blood, pus, milk, as non-objects that are banished in the course of ego-formation. These non-objects also include the mother's body; indeed the maternal body is a privileged site of abjection, as it is that which must be excluded in order for individuation and separation to take place, so that one can distinguish self from other and establish a dyadic (imaginary) relation out of undifferentiated maternal space or the semiotic chora, the pre-spatial relation of fluid (although not entirely unregulated) drives. The abject can then also be called the primally repressed, primal because prior not only to the secondary symbolic prohibition of the incest taboo or Oedipal Complex, but also prior to the establishment of any identity.

The abject is horrifying, repellent, but also fascinating; it is strange but familiar. The process of abjection is not merely a symptom of phobia or borderline disorder, but a necessary and even recurring ordeal in any subject's transition to identification with the father and accession to language. It is the most archaic form of negativity, an exclusion or expulsion which functions by securing the borders of self, carving a space, marking a divide, out of which the ego can emerge. Kristeva calls it the violent attempt “to release the hold of maternal entity” (Kristeva 1982, 13) or rather what will have been the mother, since this process establishes the distinction between the maternal body and the infant in the first place, making possible primary narcissism. The abject exposes the precariousness of the subject/object divide, the fragility of identity, the need to constitute oneself against the threat of, and desire for, dissolution.

Although this is not primarily Kristeva's concern, abjection can also be understood as a social phenomenon, one with political implications. The psychically primitive experience of egoic instability can be propelled into the political realm, and be socially accentuated or reinforced. In abjection, subjects confront what they must exclude or expel in order to maintain identity, that is, they confront their own dependency, mortality, finitude, and materiality. This strangeness experienced at the porous edges of identity can rebound into troubling relations with others, including especially with others who are perceived as lacking intelligible identity, socially marginal, or refusing cultural assimilation. While Kristeva's own focus is less on what is abjected than the process of abjection, that is, less on the expelled non-object than on the violence of separation that brings objects (and others) into being, her work provides the theoretical underpinnings to ask questions about who bears the burden of abjection, how and why some are figured as inhuman, animal, or alien. Her analysis of abjection exposes the ways in which social life is dependent on jettisoning or containing disorder and disruption, and managing the fear of contamination.

The confusion of borders, the ambivalent relation to maternal space at the outskirts of narcissism, also motivates melancholia. The idea of the maternal as the primally repressed recurs in Black Sun: Depression and Melancholia, where Kristeva claims, “matricide is our vital necessity” (Kristeva 1989, 27), the founding partition that facilitates the birth and growth of the ego. Kristeva praises the child, the “intrepid wanderer” who “leaves the crib to meet the mother in the realm of representations” (Kristeva 1989, 41). Maintaining that the organization of the psyche is premised on loss, Kristeva also understands that the suffering entailed by loss can derail the formation of a self, that loss itself can become the dominant reality for some who are unable to establish a secure relation to themselves. While mourning, for Kristeva as for Freud, enables a subject to, gradually and painfully, let go of loss by establishing a relation in language to it, melancholia is a practice which enables the subject to hold onto lost objects, most especially the mother or, better, the dead (or repressed) mother. The loving father facilitates mourning and linguistic creativity; the deadening mother disables self-creation. The generation of the ego out of expulsion, the division of unity, is not simply a mournful moment, but also potentially a joyous one, in which the advent of language, the promise of the father, offers reparation and life with a world of others, so that words can provide the nourishment that the breast previously had. The father makes it possible to fill the void with language and the formation of signifying bonds.

In Kristeva's understanding of melancholic breakdown, the problem is similar to the one discussed above in the section on Irigaray, namely that loss goes unnamed and unmourned but thereby stays unprocessed within, leaving the subject stagnant and inert. Women, in Kristeva's view, suffer the loss of creativity, the incapacity for sublimation, more severely than men. Women's access to language, and creative self-transformation, is more vulnerable to disturbance both because of the (previously discussed) inexorable repression of their pre-Oedipal relation to the mother and because they have greater difficulty establishing a primary identification with the father. Whereas the loss of the archaic bond with the maternal body is (potentially) sublated by men into the rhythms of language, for women it often becomes a dead space where once there was life, filled only with loss and emptiness. Imprisoned by an undead, unmourned, mother, excluded from language or representation, women are vulnerable to the devastations of symbolic sacrifice without recompense.

Psychoanalysis is presented as a counter-depressant, as are art and writing, able not only to keep the drives or semiotic forces moving through language but also to foster their revolutionary potential to transgress symbolic limits and laws and to creatively rework self and society. Accessing the drives and rhythms that symbolic law and order typically repress, psychoanalytic practice, like the poetic text, revitalizes or reactivates the semiotic chora, a connection to the maternal body or to femininity. Such practices let loose the disorganizing energies of the body, the pleasurable rupture of sense and nonsense. They take productive advantage of the dialectical discord between semiotic and symbolic and thus keep this discord oriented toward dissent and protest rather than inner collapse.

Although the semiotic resists the symbolic order, or cannot be contained by it, the two are always entangled and imbricated in language; drives both support and subvert the symbolic operation, bringing bodily rhythms and forces to signification, both impelling and pulling apart its organization and stases. This disruptive potential of semiotic drives and rhythms is associated with negativity as a force of revolt, an excess, most archaically, the force of bodily expulsion, but more generally the forces that continually spur the dissolution of one's own organization. Negativity maintains life, keeps it going by circulating energy, rendering the subject always in process. Through its movement, the subject is not a rigid identity, but always developing, reconfiguring itself through the interplay of drives and language, in the tensions between body and mirror image and between mirror image and self.

While Kristeva advocates for ‘poetic revolution,’ (meaning the ongoing process of reconfiguring language and oneself by exploiting the heterogeneities between semiotic and symbolic elements), she is sometimes read as a conservative thinker because of her commitment to maintaining a symbolic order and social contract. The danger of a too strong or too weak symbolic order is that it encourages a return to abjection or melancholia, to the point prior to ego-formation, to a dissolution of the borders that maintain social life and creative subjectivity, contributing to the ego's collapse into an empty abyssal void and discouraging semiotic creativity. Such a fragile, fragmented, disintegrating ego, always in search of objects to heal the rift of being, dreaming of a return to unity but suffering the nightmare of upheaval and collapse of identity, is especially susceptible to the traumatic impact of encountering the stranger, the unfamiliar other or alien who provokes turmoil and who is repudiated in a rebound to delirious narcissism and a reassertion of self-mastery and self-identity. The stranger disturbs boundaries, indicating the failure to fully eliminate the refuse of identity and purify oneself. Kristeva sees in the ethics of psychoanalysis, premised on self-division, being strange to oneself, the possibility of establishing an ethical relation to alterity, inviting it into our political bonds (and warding off the most virulent forms of abjection). Where Irigaray aims to introduce sexual difference into the social contract and the domain of law and rights, Kristeva proposes that we introduce self-discord.

5. Anglo-American Psychoanalytic Feminism

There are a number of Anglo-American (and Australian) feminist theorists and scholars who read Lacan and laid the groundwork for the passage from French to English and from France to the US, Britain, and Australia in the 1970's, 1980's, and early 1990's. Among these are Juliet Mitchell (Psychoanalysis and Feminism), Teresa Brennan (The Interpretation of the Flesh: Freud and Femininity), Elizabeth Grosz (Jacques Lacan: A Feminist Introduction), Jane Gallop (Reading Lacan and The Daughter's Seduction), and Jacqueline Rose (Sexuality in the Field of Vision). While writing in English, these theorists take their bearings from the French Lacanian approach to psychoanalysis and can generally be classified in the field of what today gets called “Continental Feminism.” Responsible for revitalizing psychoanalysis for feminist thought and countering earlier feminist dismissals, they aim to reclaim Freud's central analyses for feminist purposes. Juliet Mitchell, for instance, develops the insight indispensable to any feminist reading, that “psychoanalysis is not a recommendation for a patriarchal society, but an analysis of one” (Mitchell 1973, xiii). Mitchell and Rose are also the co-editors of Feminine Sexuality, a selection from Lacan's seminars, for which both editors wrote influential introductions.

This section will address, however, not the Lacanian inspired feminist appropriation of psychoanalysis in the English speaking world, but the Anglo-American development of feminist psychoanalysis that has descended from and is indebted to British object relations theory and its focus on the pre-Oedipal mother-child bond, especially the work of Melanie Klein and Donald Winnicott. Authors who work in this vein include Nancy Chodorow (The Reproduction of Mothering), Dorothy Dinnerstein (The Mermaid and the Minotaur), and Jessica Benjamin (Bonds of Love and Like Subjects, Love Objects). What distinguishes this Anglo-American tradition from the French-influenced one is its emphasis on pre-Oedipal sociality or intersubjectivity and its focus on the values of integration, harmony, and wholeness, as opposed to those of self-division and respecting the alien within.

The remainder of this section will focus on the work of Benjamin as exemplary of the Anglo-American approach, and clarify its differences from and similarities with the French approach. Like Irigaray, Benjamin is perturbed by the psychoanalytic depiction of social life as the world of men, developed on the basis of the father-son relation and its aggression, hostility, love, and mourning. Deploring this “struggle for power” (Benjamin 1988, 6) in which women are merely the triangulating object of desire, Benjamin argues that, in the formation of identity, subjects become bound by love to oppressive social relations. She worries that “domination is anchored in the hearts of the dominated” (Benjamin 1988, 5), that women are erotically attached to patriarchal power, and she believes that psychoanalysis can help explain how and why this is so. Psychoanalysis thus offers to Benjamin insights not only into the individual psyche but also into the organization, structure, and distribution of political power and hierarchy. Her aim is “to grasp the deep structure of gender as a binary opposition which is common to psychic and cultural representations” (Benjamin 1988, 218). Unlike Kristeva and Irigaray, both of whom problematize the duality and comprehensiveness of the nature/culture distinction, and emphasize transformation of symbolic bonds, Benjamin highlights the role of (contradictory) cultural stereotypes in bringing forth gender as we know and live it, and emphasizes the need for social transformation.

Taking what she calls an eclectic approach, and eschewing methodological orthodoxy with regard to Freudian metapsychology and the theory of the instincts, Benjamin establishes her project on the basis of a two person relational perspective, with the other as a separate independent subject. Rather than an undifferentiated unity governing early infantile life in the pre-Oedipal period, which would make of the infant merely a “monadic energy system” (Benjamin 1988, 17), she maintains that a genuine duality and relationality exists from the start and that the process of growth entails development within relationships rather than a development of them. The infant, she postulates, is a fundamentally active and social creature, reaching out to the world and expressing a desire for recognition. The knots of identity are formed via the interplay of this desire with the response of another who variously affirms or defies the child. Benjamin claims that this emphasis on sociality and intersubjectivity is not intended to disregard the intrapsychic elements of subject formation, and in fact she argues for “the interaction between the psyche and social life” (Benjamin 1988, 5). She holds that the inner and the outer are not competitive but complementary theoretical perspectives. Nonetheless, she does want to situate identity generally, and gendered identity more specifically, within the purview of the subject's multiple and ambiguous social identifications.

Domination, she argues, ensues from the failures of recognition built into the political and social order, not merely failures that take place at the personal or individual level in a single relationship. Borrowing an initial insight from Foucault, Benjamin looks at the way power shapes and forms identities and desires, producing gendered relations (Benjamin 1988, 4). Borrowing another insight from Hegel, Benjamin depicts the dialectic of recognition in the struggle for identity as a “conflict between independence and dependence” (Benjamin 1988, 33). In her view, however, the Hegelian tale, like the Freudian one, erroneously begins with a “monadic, self-interested ego” (Benjamin 1988, 33) and it thus concludes with the inevitability of breakdown and domination. According to Benjamin, Winnicott resolves the Hegelian and Freudian dilemma (Benjamin 1988, 38), the solitary egoism of the fight to the death, by reformulating the problem of recognition at the level of fantasy and distinguishing between internal and external worlds. The infant feels confident in asserting its independence, and destroying its object in fantasy, so long as that object is discovered to have a secure external existence in reality. In other words, the fantasy of destruction is appeased by its failure; the infant destroys internally but externally is relieved to still have an object to address and interact with. More particularly, the infant destroys or separates from the mother internally and in fantasy, but simultaneously retains a relation to her externally and in reality. The good enough mother must foster this relationship between two separate egos, neither allowing the child to succeed in destroying or dominating her, nor allowing herself to squash the child's nascent attempts at self-assertion. The mother-child relation is then a kind of revised neo-Hegelian struggle for power, retaining the aim of mutual recognition or respect, but risking domination and rebellion. The violent conflicts within are not repressed but neutralized and pacified in the reality of intersubjective life that affirms and recognizes autonomy.

Asking, as do Chodorow and Dinnerstein, about the genesis of patriarchal power, Benjamin concludes, as they also do, that a main source or component lies in exclusive childrearing by women/mothers, which occasions the related risks of collapsing maternal authority into mere dominance, supporting the fantasy of maternal omnipotence, centering potent ambivalence on the mother, and fostering rigid gender identities and identifications. While the boy attains autonomy via loving identification with the father and separation from the mother, the girl's relation to paternal power is complicated by its inaccessibility to her. If she seeks “liberation in the father” (Benjamin 1988, 99), she connects her femininity to submission rather than agency, and attaches to masculinity as an idealized object of love (and as its love-object), conferring on it value while devaluing the mother, and creating a divide between feminine sexuality and autonomous subjectivity. Benjamin argues, however, that the “protean impersonality” (Benjamin 1988, 216) of male domination cannot be addressed by a critique that focuses solely on the family and childcare and that power relations cannot be overcome solely through a transformation in caretaking roles, although the equation of women with motherhood is certainly one component of the problem. If gendered identities are encouraged by social power relations—masculinity is developed as a denial of dependency and assertion of independence, while femininity is developed in an identification with nurturing and concession of autonomy—then real transformation requires attention to social roles and “cultural representations” (Benjamin 1988, 217), since “the core feature of the gender system—promoting masculinity as separation from and femininity as continuity with the primary bond—is maintained even when mother and father participate equally in that bond” (Benjamin 1988, 217). In Benjamin's theoretical model, children are responsive not only to their social environment, but also to ideas with opaque meanings (mandates, expectations, prohibitions, exhortations, etc.) that are often covertly, indirectly, or unknowingly conveyed in parental language and edicts. Gender equality thus requires that women be recognized, by themselves and by men, as subjects in culture and that intersubjectivity itself be revalued.

Benjamin's analysis can be distinguished from those of Irigaray and Kristeva precisely by the way in which it tends to conflate or collapse the distinction between representation and social roles. While Anglo-American psychoanalytic feminism theorizes gender as derived from or dependent on social (including familial) inequalities and power relations, and thus aims to reduce its psychic effects by redressing social and familial domination/subordination, French feminism does not calibrate the psyche on socio-cultural relations but on imaginary and symbolic representations. Benjamin's partitioning of intrapsychic life into internal and external relations, and her vision of intersubjective equilibrium is, in contrast to Irigaray and Kristeva's assertion of discord within and between subjects, oriented by the conviction that social harmony is desirable and attainable.

6. Conclusion

Psychoanalysis presents a critical and diagnostic project, not necessarily a normative or liberatory one. In developing a theory of the drives and the non-rational forces that move and impel us, the idea that we are opaque rather than transparent to ourselves, incapable of complete self-knowledge or self-mastery, psychoanalytic theory also challenges the rationalist, humanist ego and proposes that our ethical characters and political communities are not perfectable, exposing the precariousness of both psychic and political identity. The unconscious cannot be assumed to be inherently either a transgressive or a conservative force, but an unreliable one, promoting revolt or rebellion sometimes, intransigence and rigid border preservation at other times.

Although they are in often uneasy alliance, the psychoanalytic account of the unconscious provides feminist theory with resources for both political and ontological inquiry. Ontologically, psychoanalysis offers a distinctively psychical understanding of sexual difference, how we come to inhabit our bodies and our identities, and misinhabit them, an analysis reducible to neither social nor biological categories. Politically, psychoanalysis offers a depiction of the forces that impel us to organize, disorganize, and reorganize the bonds that hold us together. By offering insight into the formation of subjectivity and the animating fantasies of social life, psychoanalysis thus also facilitates feminist analysis of the obdurate elements of patriarchal social relations, including the symbolic bonds and internal forces that undergird identity and attach sexed subjects to relations of dominance and subordination. Psychoanalytic feminist attention to the core constituents of civilization, to the nuclei of sexual difference and communal affiliation, helps explain the perpetuation of masculine power and enables feminist theorists to articulate possible correctives, challenges, routes of amelioration, or ethical interruptions that go to the roots of political life and to its beyond and do not simply operate on the given social terrain.

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  • –––, 1984b, Envy and Gratitude and Other Works 1946–1963, New York: Free Press.
  • Kofman, Sarah, 1985 [1980], The Enigma of Woman: Woman in Freud's Writings, trans. Catherine Porter, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Kristeva, Julia, 1982 [1980], Powers of Horror: An Essay on Abjection, trans. Leon S. Roudiez, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1984 [1974], Revolution in Poetic Language, trans. Margaret Waller, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1986, “Women's Time,” in The Kristeva Reader, ed. Toril Moi, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1987 [1983], Tales of Love, trans. Leon S. Roudiez, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1989 [1987], Black Sun: Depression and Melancholia, trans. Leon S. Roudiez, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1991 [1988], Strangers to Ourselves, trans. Leon S. Roudiez, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1998, “The Subject in Process,” in The Tel Quel Reader, eds. Patrick ffrench and Roland-Francois Lack, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2002 [1997], Intimate Revolt: The Powers and Limits of Psychoanalysis, trans. Jeanine Herman, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Lacan, Jacques, 1977 [1973], The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book XI: The Four Fundamental Concepts of Psychoanalysis, trans. Alan Sheridan, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1982, Feminine Sexuality, eds. Juliet Mitchell and Jacqueline Rose, trans. Juliet Mitchell, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1991a [1975], The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book I: Freud's Papers on Technique, trans. John Forrestor, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1991b [1978], The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book II: The Ego in Freud's Theory and in the Technique of Psychoanalysis, trans. Sylvia Tomaselli, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1992 [1986], The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book VII: The Ethics of Psychoanalysis, trans. Dennis Porter, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1993 [1981], The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book III: The Psychoses, trans. Russell Grigg, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1998 [1975], The Seminar of Jacques Lacan, Book XX: On Feminine Sexuality: The Limits of Love and Knowledge, trans. Bruce Fink, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 2006 [1970], Ecrits, trans. Bruce Fink, New York: Norton.
  • Laplanche, J. and Pontalis, J.-B., 1973 [1967], The Language of Psycho-Analysis, trans. Donald Nicholson-Smith, New York: Norton.
  • Mitchell, Juliet, 1973, Psychoanalysis and Feminism, New York: Vintage Books.
  • –––, 1982, “Introduction—I,” in Feminine Sexuality, eds. Mitchell and Rose, New York: Norton.
  • Rose, Jacqueline, 1982, “Introduction—II,” in Feminine Sexuality, eds. Mitchell and Rose, New York: Norton.
  • –––, 1986, Sexuality in the Field of Vision, London: Verso.
  • Winnicott, D.W., 2005, Playing and Reality, New York: Routledge.

Further Reading

  • Beardsworth, Sara, 2004, Julia Kristeva: Psychoanalysis and Modernity, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Beauvoir, Simone de, 2010 [1949], The Second Sex, trans. Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier, New York: Knopf.
  • Burke, Carolyn, Naomi Schor, and Margaret Whitford, eds., 1994, Engaging with Irigaray: Feminist Philosophy and Modern European Thought, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Butler, Judith, 1990, Gender Trouble: Feminism and the Subversion of Identity, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 1993, Bodies that Matter: On the Discursive Limits of Sex, New York: Routledge.
  • Chanter, Tina, 1995, Ethics of Eros: Irigaray's Re-writing of the Philosophers, New York: Routledge.
  • Chanter, Tina and Ewa Ziarek, eds., 2005, Revolt, Affect, Collectivity: The Unstable Boundaries of Kristeva's Polis, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Cimitile, Maria, and Elaine Miller, eds., 2007, Returning to Irigaray: Feminist Philosophy, Politics, and the Question of Unity, New York: Routledge.
  • Copjec, Joan, 1994, Read My Desire: Lacan Against the Historicists, Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • –––, 2002, Imagine There's No Woman: Ethics and Sublimation, Cambridge: MIT Press.
  • Cornell, Drucilla, 1991, Beyond Accommodation: Ethical Feminism, Deconstruction, and the Law, New York: Routledge.
  • de Lauretis, Teresa, 1984, Alice Doesn't: Feminism, Semiotics, Cinema, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 1994, The Practice of Love: Lesbian Sexuality and Perverse Desire, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Deutscher, Penelope, 1997, Yielding Gender: Feminism, Deconstruction, and the History of Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 2002, A Politics of Impossible Difference: The Later Work of Luce Irigaray, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Diprose, Rosalyn, 1994, The Bodies of Women: Ethics, Embodiment and Sexual Difference, New York: Routledge.
  • Ferrell, Robyn, 1996, Passion in Theory: Conceptions of Freud and Lacan, New York: Routledge.
  • Gatens, Moira, 1995, Imaginary Bodies: Ethics, Power and Corporeality, New York: Routledge.
  • Grosz, Elizabeth, 1991, Sexual Subversions: Three French Feminists, Sydney: Allen and Unwin.
  • Huntington, Patricia, 1998, Ecstatic Subjects, Utopia, and Recognition: Kristeva, Heidegger, Irigaray, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Oliver, Kelly, 1993, Reading Kristeva: Unraveling the Double-bind, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 1997, Family Values: Subjects Between Nature and Culture, New York: Routledge.
  • –––, 1998, Subjectivity without Subjects, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • –––, 2004, The Colonization of Psychic Space: A Psychoanalytic Social Theory of Oppression, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Oliver, Kelly (ed.), 1993, Ethics, Politics, and Difference in Julia Kristeva's Writing, New York: Routledge.
  • Pateman, Carole, 1988, The Sexual Contract, Palo Alto: Stanford University Press.
  • Sjoholm Cecilia, 2005, Kristeva and the Political, New York: Routledge.
  • Shepherdson, Charles, 2000, Vital Signs: Nature, Culture, Psychoanalysis, New York: Routledge.
  • Silverman, Kaja, 1988, The Acoustic Mirror: The Female Voice in Psychoanalysis and Cinema, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • –––, 1996, The Threshold of the Visible World, New York: Routledge.
  • Stone, Alison, 2006, Luce Irigaray and the Philosophy of Sexual Difference, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Whitford, Margaret, 1991, Luce Irigaray: Philosophy in the Feminine, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Zakin, Emily, 2000, “Bridging the Social and the Symbolic: Toward a Feminist Politics of Sexual Difference,” in Hypatia vol. 15, no. 2, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Ziarek, Ewa, 2001, An Ethics of Dissensus: Postmodernity, Feminism, and the Politics of Radical Democracy, Stanford: Stanford University Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • French Feminist Theory, at the Women's Studies Resources website, maintained by Karla Tonella, University of Iowa.
  • philoSOPHIA: A Feminist Society.
  • Luce Irigaray, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Sarah K. Donovan (Villanova).
  • Literary Theory, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Vince Brewton (U. North Alabama).
  • Jacque Lacan, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Matthew Sharpe (U. Melbourne).
  • Sigmund Freud, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Stephen Thornton (U. Limerick).

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Emily Zakin <zakinea@muohio.edu>

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