Feminist Perspectives on Sex Markets

First published Wed Feb 18, 2004; substantive revision Wed Sep 7, 2016

Markets in sexually-explicit materials (pornography) and sexual services (prostitution) raise numerous worries for philosophers and feminists. The main concern is that such markets appear to be inescapably and seriously harmful to women—both individual women and women as a group. Deploying concepts from moral and political philosophy, and philosophy of language and art, feminist philosophers have analyzed how prostitution and pornography harm women.

1. Pornography

1.1 Why Do Feminists Single Out Pornography?

Anne Eaton argues that pornography shows the subordination of women to be sexually pleasurable and, for this reason, it is more effective than other representational materials in shaping viewers’ attitudes and desires (Eaton 2007: 680). Pornography engages and trains us to be sexually aroused at images depicting women as social inferiors, and thereby reinforces the “mechanisms, norms, and myths” that sustain women’s unequal social status (679). Eaton acknowledges that not all pornography eroticizes inequality and focusses her critique on “inegalitarian pornography”. She hypothesizes that the harms caused by exposure to inegalitarian pornography range from increasing rates of sex discrimination, sexual harassment and assault to degrading the status of women. Eaton recognizes that her causal model requires empirical support, and that the studies needed to confirm or refute it have not yet been done. Because inegalitarian pornography is not the only kind of mass culture that promotes sexist attitudes and behavior, it can be difficult to separate out the effects of sexist materials that are sexually graphic from those that are not.

In the early years of the second-wave feminist movement, activists campaigned against all violent and sexist popular media. Carolyn Bronstein argues that the shift from condemning violent and sexist media images to condemning only pornography (even nonviolent porn) involved two main factors. First, radical feminists began to view the proliferation of hardcore pornography as part of the wider backlash to advances in women’s equality. The saturation of society with Playboy, Hustler, Deep Throat, adult bookstores, and eventually cable television and video pornography in the 1960s and 1970s was interpreted by some activists as an orchestrated campaign to keep women in their assigned social sphere. Some feminists accused their opponents of disseminating uniquely seductive and powerful misogynist propaganda that falsely and maliciously depicted women as desiring and deserving of coercive and degrading sexual use. Second, Bronstein alleges that, by targeting pornography as the culprit rather than sexism in the media, the feminist anti-pornography movement took advantage of the conservative climate of the 1980s. Religious social conservatives, in particular, had become increasingly critical of the sexual revolution of 1960s, and they saw the growth of the pornography industry as evidence of their country’s cultural shift. The convergence of aims among feminists and some conservatives enabled the former to garner financial support from non-feminist, and even anti-feminist organizations (Bronstein 2011: 322).

The anti-pornography movement’s groundwork culminated in the development of a new approach for restricting pornography, which did not rely on the government’s censorship of obscene speech. Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin wrote a model anti-pornography ordinance, which was soon adopted by the city of Indianapolis with the help of evangelical Christian organizations (Bronstein 2011: 324). The ordinance defined pornography as the “sexually explicit subordination of women, graphically depicted, through pictures and/or words”, and it allowed potential victims to bring civil lawsuits against the producers and distributors of materials with the specified content. In response, many free speech activists organized to challenge this new law, and similar ones proposed in cities around the country. In 1986, the Supreme Court found the Indianapolis ordinance to be unconstitutional and, not long after, the feminist anti-pornography movement fell into disarray.

Although the second-wave feminist anti-pornography movement has now evolved into the third-wave sex-positive feminist movement, a number of feminist academics are attempting to revive societal opposition to pornography (Eaton 2007; Langton 2009; Hornsby 1995; Brison 1998). By utilizing the tools of philosophical analysis and empirical social science, feminist academics aim to strengthen the intellectual foundations of the anti-pornography movement. With a better understanding of the impact of pornography on individuals and society, and the psychological and social mechanisms that can explain its influence, communities can mobilize more effective responses to its production, distribution, and consumption. Now that the Internet enables pornography to reach wider audiences, its impact may be greater than ever.

Helen Longino was one of the first feminist philosophers to articulate a theory of how pornography harms women. She argued that pornography shows men and women taking pleasure in activities that objectify women and treat women as less than human. By depicting female subjects as dehumanized objects, pornography promotes the idea that women can be treated without moral regard (i.e., raped and subjugated). Longino writes,

What’s wrong with pornography, then, is its degrading and dehumanizing portrayal of women, and not its sexual content. Pornography, by its very nature, requires that women be subordinate to men and mere instruments for the fulfillment of male fantasies (Longino 1980: 45)

Following the philosopher Immanuel Kant, Longino assumes that sex is morally problematic because it is difficult, if not impossible, to have sex without treating another person as a “mere means” to our own satisfaction. Sexual desire is irrational and leads us to reduce others to their sexual body parts, and thus is objectifying, dehumanizing, and degrading. Longino adds a feminist element to Kant by arguing that, because men have greater social power than women, men are able to use women as instruments to satisfy their sexual ends. Pornographic depictions of heterosexual sex, then, glorify and promote the immoral and subordinating treatment of women by men.

Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin’s well known analysis of pornography similarly incorporates a Kantian model of sexual morality with a feminist spin (Shrage 2005). Heterosexual acts are inherently violent to women in that they involve men treating women as interchangeable objects whose integrity and boundaries are not respected. Ordinary heterosexual acts, for Dworkin, involve men invading and occupying women’s bodies (Dworkin 1987). Pornography, then, is equated with visual evidence and documentation of the abuse of particular women, and those who view it collaborate in their violation. According to MacKinnon, women in patriarchal societies are not free to refuse sex with men, and therefore their participation in sex with men is not fully consensual. Sex with persons incapable of giving genuine consent, made into a public spectacle via pornography, expands the temporal and spatial parameters of the crime. When women view pornography they often relive their own violation and public humiliation. Therefore, pornography has the power to repeatedly traumatize women and does not merely record a past abuse, according to MacKinnon and Dworkin. Adult pornography is similar to child pornography, which records and amplifies the abuse of molested children. Both allow others to participate in and exploit someone’s victimization for sadistic pleasure. Moreover, MacKinnon contends that adult pornography is a tool that can be used to obtain a woman’s cooperation with her abuser, just as child pornography can with a child. She writes that pornography is used by men “to train women to sexual submission” (MacKinnon 1987: 188).

MacKinnon also claims that “specific pornography does directly cause some assaults. Some rapes are performed by men with paperback books in their pockets” (MacKinnon 1987: 184). And because “pornography conditions male orgasm to female subordination” (MacKinnon 1987: 190), it indirectly and subconsciously elicits from men controlling sexual behaviors. Pornography shapes both female and male sexual desire into victim/abuser roles, and represents predatory sexual behaviors as natural forms of sexual and gender expression. Pornography is therefore harmful to men who consume it, as well as to women who have sexual contact with men, on and off screen. In MacKinnon’s words, pornography represents

sex forced on real women so that it can be sold at a profit to be forced on other real women; women’s bodies trussed and maimed and raped and made into things to be hurt and obtained and accessed, and this presented as the nature of women; the coercion that is visible and the coercion that has become invisible—this and more bothers feminists about pornography … pornography causes attitudes and behaviors of violence and discrimination that define the treatment and status of half of the population. (MacKinnon 1987: 147)

For these reasons, anti-pornography feminists generally hold that pornography is not simply a sexist nuisance that can be addressed by calls for consumer boycotts and corporate responsibility. Instead, pornography “nourishes sexism” (Longino 1980: 54) and disrespect for women in ways that eventuate in violations of women’s basic moral and civil rights.

Longino argues that pornography should not be given the same legal protection as other expressive materials. Along with MacKinnon, she proposes that pornography should be restricted, not as a form of obscene expression, but as a product that can cause serious injuries to women, individually and as a group. Longino contends that liberal toleration of pornography constitutes acceptance of the immoral treatment of women (Longino 1980: 48). MacKinnon and Dworkin take this argument a step further and allege that pornography often records acts of criminal rape and, therefore, its dissemination further compounds the injuries of such criminal acts (MacKinnon 1987: 128, 148–49; Dworkin 1979: 201). Toleration for pornography disempowers all women because it perpetuates a climate in which women constantly feel threatened by rape, which makes it impossible for them to exercise the formal rights they have won. MacKinnon and Dworkin’s model ordinance sought to make “pornography actionable as a civil rights violation” so that women would have legal recourse when pornographic materials prevent the exercise of their rights or cause personal injuries (MacKinnon 1993: 22, 121, n. 32). By protecting the speech of pornographers and shielding them from liability, according to MacKinnon, the state fails to protect women’s equality and civil rights.

MacKinnon and Dworkin offer only anecdotal empirical support for their claims about the harmfulness of pornography. But their work inspired a number of social scientists to conduct controlled studies to find more empirical support for their claims. Reviewing the social science literature available at the time, Diana Scully writes,

the proliferation of cultural products, like pornography, intensifies the quantity and quality of violence in men’s fantasies. Further, particularly when women are depicted as receiving pleasure from the violence directed at them, pornography trivializes rape and, thus, may encourage more men to act on their fantasies. Armed with the myths celebrated in violent pornography, such as women secretly want to be raped, men who rape can and do believe that their behavior is within the normative boundaries of the culture. (Scully 1990: 155)

Scully’s own research compares the consumption of pornographic materials by convicted rapists with a control group of felons. Although she notes some problems with her research design, she concludes that her

data do establish that the majority of convicted rapists were familiar with pornography and that their use of such material was somewhat greater than that of other felons. (Scully 1990: 154)

In their review of pornography research, Neil Malamuth, Tamara Addison, and Mary Koss report that

The current findings do suggest that for the majority of American men, pornography exposure (even at the highest levels assessed here) is not associated with high levels of sexual aggression…But among those at the highest “predisposing” risk level for sexual aggression (a little above 7% of the entire sample), those who are very frequent pornography users (about 12% of this high risk group) have sexual aggression levels approximately four times higher than their counterparts who do not very frequently consume pornography. (Malamuth, Addison, and Koss 2000: 85)

In a more recent review of the social science literature, Christopher Ferguson and Richard Hartley report that

Evidence for a causal relationship between exposure to pornography and sexual aggression is slim and may, at certain times, have been exaggerated by politicians, pressure groups and some social scientists. Some of the debate has focused on violent pornography, but evidence of any negative effects is inconsistent, and violent pornography is comparatively rare in the real world. Victimization rates for rape in the United States demonstrate an inverse relationship between pornography consumption and rape rates. Data from other nations have suggested similar relationships. (Ferguson and Hartley 2009)

Although Ferguson and Hartley do not discuss studies that consider only inegalitarian pornography, as Eaton’s work suggests, they discuss a 2004 study that “found that pornography protects against negative attitudes toward women”, and a 2007 study that “found no relationship between pornography consumption and negative attitudes toward women”. However, the 2004 study indicates, “pornography consumers may be more prone to benevolent sexism, which involves beliefs that women should be protected from harm” (2009: 326). Contrary to Longino and MacKinnon, pornography does not seem to “nourish sexism” in its malevolent forms.

Deborah Cameron and Elizabeth Frazer question whether any accounts of the causal properties of pornography are helpful or illuminating. They argue that such accounts assume a deterministic model of human behavior, in which men lose control over their behavior and respond somewhat mindlessly to pornographic stimuli (Cameron & Frazer 2000: 248–251). The idea that men simply imitate what they see in pornography, or are conditioned to behave in certain ways through exposure to pornography, implies that men are not able to creatively and critically interpret pornographic materials. Although some men may unthinkingly copy what they see, or may even become “addicted” to sexual violence through pornography, these men are the exception, not the rule (Cameron & Frazer 2000: 243). By treating sexual violence as a product of exposure to pornography, feminists promote a view that relieves sexual predators of responsibility for their actions, and blames their actions instead on expressive materials or the pathological conditions they allegedly cause. Although causal theories invoking the loss of individual control through “imitation” and “addiction” may be useful to defendants in sexual assault and murder cases, Cameron and Frazer point out that these theories undermine the feminist goal of showing that sexual violence is a function of cultural norms and structural inequalities, rather than mental debilitation or disease (Cameron & Frazer 2000: 248). Ironically, causal models may engender social sympathy for the perpetrators of sexual violence and make it difficult to punish them (Cameron and Frazer 2000: 247). Cameron and Frazer conclude that feminists can be critical of “the discourses which inform sexual practice” and imagine alternative discourses, without promoting problematic models of human behavior (Cameron & Frazer 2000: 253).

Not all feminist philosophers concur with the feminist critique of pornography. While agreeing that the content of pornography condones the objectionable treatment of women, Ann Garry was one of the first to question whether pornography should be held responsible for pervasive gender-based violence and discrimination. Garry writes,

Much of the research on the effects of pornography indicates that any effect it has—positive or negative—is short lived. (Garry 1979: 132)

Garry also questions whether treating a woman as a sex object is always bad, and suggests that pornography succeeds in harming women, in part, because viewers assume that sex is generally harmful to women (Garry 1979: 136–37; see also Garry 2001). Garry encourages feminists to support the production of non-sexist pornography rather than try to suppress pornographic materials.

1.2 Do Pornographic Works Silence and Subordinate Women?

MacKinnon and Dworkin’s model ordinance captured the prevailing feminist view that pornography is a form of hate speech against women, which not only triggers sexual aggression in men but also desensitizes others to the suffering of the victims. MacKinnon writes, “Women who charge men with sexual abuse are not believed. The pornographic view of them is: they want it; they all want it” (MacKinnon 1987: 191). When they communicate their unwillingness to participate in a sexual activity, their interlocutors will infer that they are misreporting their desires. In this way, pornography silences women, because it reinforces the prejudice that women are dishonest or coy when they express little or no sexual interest in men who pursue sexual contact with them. Similarly, when a juror listens to the testimony of a sexual assault victim, his perception of her sincerity will be skewed by his exposure to pornography (Langton 2009: 297). On this view, pornography is a mechanism that can be wielded to deny women their equal right to free speech, social respect, and personal security, and thus subordinates and silences them.

Rae Langton deploys the tools of speech act theory to elaborate further how pornography silences and subordinates women (Langton 1995: 215). Langton points out that pornographic words and images, like utterances in general, are a form of social action. The literal content (locutionary force) of a pornographic work includes the representation of a particular sex acts, which have the effect (perlocutionary force) of arousing some viewers and shaping their attitudes toward women. The illocutionary force of a pornographic work pertains to the social actions performed in depicting sex and women, such as informing, commanding, entertaining, approving, and so forth. For example, a posted sign with the words “Whites Only” performs the social act of commanding and enforcing racial segregation in a context with certain kinds of formal or informal social rules involving racial status. Similarly, a pornographic work may perform the function of recommending or approving certain sexually predatory behaviors in a context with certain kinds of social rules about the status and entitlements of the character types shown. The illocutionary force of a particular speech act, sign, or expressive work depends on a variety of factors, including the intentions of the author and the linguistic and social conventions that link words with particular meanings and social practices. A “Whites Only” sign placed on a laundry basket performs a different illocutionary act than one placed on a drinking fountain or bus seat. A successful speech act, where an audience gets what a speaker intends to communicate or do, depends on various historical, legal, and other features of the context of use (Saul 2006b; Bianchi 2008; Mikkola 2008). Langton argues that there are good, though not conclusive, reasons to think that the background factors that enable pornographic texts to endorse, recommend, or command hostile acts against women are in place. However, she also suggests that the illocutionary force of pornography may be blocked effectively by the speech acts of its critics, rather than by censorship (Langton 1995: 216).

Jennifer Hornsby also deploys speech act theory to explain how pornography silences women. Hornsby maintains that pornographic materials reinforce ideas about women that deprive their utterances of their ordinary illocutionary meaning (Hornsby 1995: 227). For example, pornographic works may convey the idea that the women whom men find sexy are eager to satisfy their sexual appetites, so that when these women say “no”, their utterance constitutes not an act of refusal but an act of teasing. In this way, pornography reinforces social codes that allow men to systematically misread and discount women’s speech. Women may be silenced, then, not by having their speech suppressed but by changes to the background conditions necessary for successful speech acts, such as refusal. If pornography interferes with the ability of women to communicate, then women cannot contest the harm of pornography with more speech, but only by suppressing pornographic materials.

One implication of the claim that pornography causes men to misread women’s communicative acts is that it potentially offers a defense to sexual predators who claim they sincerely believed their victims intended to convey something opposite to the ordinary meaning of their utterances. Mari Mikkola argues that this worry does not undermine Langton’s and Hornsby’s analysis of pornography. Instead, this consequence of their account should force us to rethink how much a conviction in a rape case should depend upon the accused having malicious motives or intentions (Mikkola 2011). Mary Kate McGowan et al. argue that

even if consuming pornography causes some men to believe that women are consenting (when they are not), this is insufficient to show that these beliefs are reasonable. Mere belief in consent does nothing to undermine a rapist’s responsibility (in most jurisdictions anyway) unless that belief is also reasonable. (McGowan et al. 2011: 145)

Yet, if pornography can disable or frustrate ordinary communication, how should reasonable and moral people ensure that their sexual acts are consensual? Campaigns against sexual assault that propose simple rules, such as “no means no” and “yes means yes”, essentially instruct us to equate the illocutionary force of an utterance with its literal meaning during a sexual encounter. If pornography has the power to rob speech of its ordinary meanings, then a cautious and reasonable way to secure consent for a sexual act might require defaulting to literal interpretation, with the implication that those who do not will be subject to criminal charges and punishment.

Susan Brison explores the subordination thesis and contends that pornography is a form of group libel that may undermine the autonomy of the target group. By spreading falsehoods about women, pornography narrows the range of social options and opportunities that women have available to them. Members of groups that are socially vilified by hate literature have a more difficult journey pursuing their aims or attempting to perform particular social roles (Brison 1998). Langton argues that, even if pornography is about fantasy and is to be understood as fictional, it can misinform. According to Langton, pornography projects the beliefs and fantasies of those who are socially powerful, and because those with less social power may conform their behavior to those beliefs, the beliefs become self-fulfilling. In this way, pornographic speech harms women by changing the world it appears to describe (Langton 2009: 301–9). McGowan similarly argues that pornography functions as “an erroneous but authoritative judgment about women’s natures”, in the way an umpire’s call establishes the facts about the events of a game (McGowan 2005: 43). Abigail Levin claims that “pornography and hate speech are the voice of majority hegemonic power” and thereby operate to privilege and vindicate the interests of the powerful majorities and dominant groups (Levin 2009: 371–2).

Nadine Strossen challenges the notion that pornographic works have singular authoritative meanings that are inherently sexist or misogynist. She writes,

Procensorship feminists may well view a woman’s apparent welcoming of sex with a man as degrading, but this is because of their negative attitudes toward women’s ability to make sexual choices. Other viewers are likely to see such a scene as positive and healthy. (Strossen 1995: 162)

Furthermore, according to Strossen,

Ambiguous and positive interpretations apply to the full range of sexual speech, including violent imagery and imagery that might well be labeled “subordinating” or “degrading,” such as rape scenes and scenes dramatizing the so-called rape myth—namely that women want to be raped. (Strossen 1995: 146)

To illustrate that pornographic texts can produce divergent responses, Strossen examines opposing reactions to a variety of popular media, including films that depict rape, controversial images of women in mainstream advertisements, and Andrea Dworkin’s own sexually graphic novels. Strossen claims that the effect on some viewers, including women, may be positive:

Pornography, including pornographic rape scenes, may serve another, intensely political end for women who read or see them: they go against the grain, thus allowing viewers to express rebellion and individuality. In this sense, too, words or images that literally depict a woman’s powerlessness may well have an empowering impact on female viewers. (Strossen 1995: 174)

The existence of divergent interpretations and responses to pornographic works challenges the idea that pornography has any single, harmful impact on the background conditions of communication. In short, pornographic works can invite or provoke viewers to challenge oppressive social norms, rather than merely conform to them. At the very least, such materials make troubling aspects of human sexuality available for public debate and critique (Strossen 1995: 176).

Georgia Warnke turns the tables on the silencing hypothesis by suggesting that

antipornography feminism silences women’s differing sexual self-expressions by condemning those with which it disagrees as false consciousness … [and] by promoting legislation that would suppress materials through which women can discover different views of an authentic sexuality and, indeed, different ways of being sexual. (Warnke 1999: 124)

Consuelo Concepcion argues that antiporn feminism

shows little respect for women’s differing sexual practices, be they heterosexual intercourse or lesbian sadomasochism. This form of universalization denies women sexual agency because it assumes that our ideas about sexuality have no legitimacy and would be co-opted by the patriarchy. … [and it] delegitimates women’s dissenting sexual voices; consequently, it can depict our sexualities as a form of moral deviance. (Concepcion 1999: 98)

In sum, not all women are traumatized or silenced by pornography. Some women enjoy pornography as consumers in ways that transgress or defy, rather than reinforce, social norms or erroneous beliefs about women’s nature. Antiporn feminists overlook and marginalize unconventional and diverse forms of sexual expression that some women enjoy.

Amy Allen critiques feminist debates about pornography for reducing the idea of power to the capacity to subordinate someone or resist subordination. Anti-pornography feminists understand pornography’s influence only in terms the subordination of women by men, and in this way treat all women as victims and overlook the forms of social power some women have by virtue of their race, nationality, or class. Pro-sex feminists view pornography as a tool for subverting sexual norms, and empowering women by enabling them to resist sexual repression and sexist constructions of feminine respectability. Following Foucault, Allen argues that the power to oppress or resist are interconnected, in that both are shaped by common understandings of human needs and desires that can be controlled by others or liberated. Allen writes

pornography does not have the power to construct our social reality that MacKinnon and Dworkin claim it has, nor do we as individuals have the power to decide to construe pornography as necessarily subversive. Such a transformation of the impact of pornography can be brought about, if at all, only by a collective social movement. (Allen 2001: 528)

On this view of pornography’s influence, its capacity to uphold or subvert dominant social norms is conditioned by a third form of power, which is the capacity to act in solidarity with others.

1.3 Does Pornography Sexually Objectify Women?

Alison Assiter employs Hegel’s dyadic understanding of domination and resistance to critique pornography. She writes,

the Master-Slave dialectic seems to capture the relation between people in pornographic eroticism. In much pornography, people, usually women, become objects for another … In the case of pornography, what happens is that the one person becomes a body desired by the other, but this is not reciprocated. (Assiter 1988: 65)

To treat someone as merely a body for another’s use, without recognizing that she too is a subject with desires, is to treat someone as a slave, as a subhuman creature or object, and therefore violates her dignity as a human being. Assiter explains that, for Hegel,

“the Master-Slave dialectic” is a phase in the development of world history—in the progression towards freedom of the “Spirit” that controls historical change. In fact, the relation is disadvantageous both for the slave and for the master, (Assiter 1988: 65)

for neither gains the forms of recognition necessary for self-conscious awareness and emotional fulfillment.

Harry Brod argues that pornography harms men individually even while it augments men’s collective power (Brod 1992: 158). Brod applies Kantian, Hegelian, and Marxist moral concepts and writes,

The female is primarily there as a sex object, not sexual subject. Or, if she is not completely objectified, since men do want to be desired themselves, hers is at least a subjugated subjectivity. But one needs another independent subject, not an object or a captured subjectivity, if one either wants one’s own prowess validated, or if one simply desires human interaction. Men functioning in the pornographic mode of male sexuality, in which men dominate women, are denied satisfaction of these human desires. (Brod 1992: 154)

On Brod’s account, pornography enhances men’s political power over women, while diminishing the quality of men’s intersubjective relationships with women, and thereby contributes to the loss of positive human interaction and self-realization. Brod also argues that pornography contributes to the commodification of sexuality, which enhances men’s powers as consumers, although not necessarily their genuine autonomy and freedom.

Catharine MacKinnon also utilizes Kant’s moral philosophy to articulate the problem with pornography:

A person, in one Kantian view, is a free and rational agent whose existence is an end in itself, as opposed to instrumental. In pornography women exist to the end of male pleasure. (MacKinnon 1987: 158)

For MacKinnon, pornography involves men treating women as mere instruments in order to satisfy their sexual desires. Such treatment, at best, fails to recognize women as free and equal persons and, at worst, dehumanizes women and encourages their victimization. In response to MacKinnon, Martha Nussbaum questions whether sexual objectification always involves treating someone as a mere means to another’s ends, or whether it only does so in certain contexts (Nussbaum 1999: 214).

Nussbaum identifies seven distinct kinds of actions that may or may not be part of objectification in any given instance: instrumentality, denial of autonomy, inertness, fungibility, violability, ownership, and denial of subjectivity (Nussbaum 1999: 218). Some of these actions are always morally problematic, but some of them are acceptable when they are part of a larger relationship involving mutual respect. Nussbaum writes,

Denial of autonomy and denial of subjectivity are objectionable if they persist throughout an adult relationship, but as phases in a relationship characterized by mutual regard they can be all right, or even quite wonderful … In a closely related way, it may at times be splendid to treat the other person as passive, or even inert. Emotional penetration of boundaries seems potentially a very valuable part of sexual life, and some forms of physical boundary penetration also, though it is less clear which ones these are. Treating as fungible is suspect when the person so treated is from a group that has frequently been commodified and used as a tool, or a prize; between social equals these problems disappear …. (Nussbaum 1999: 238–39)

In other words, some actions in which we enjoy another’s body sexually are consistent with recognizing the person so used as an end in herself, and do not involve treating her as a mere object in the Kantian sense. But Nussbaum concludes that most conventional pornography, such as Playboy, fails to meet the Kantian moral standard, and

depicts a thoroughgoing fungibility and commodification of sex partners and, in the process, severs sex from any deep connection with self-expression or emotion. (Nussbaum 1999: 234)

Nussbaum therefore concurs with MacKinnon that mainstream pornography treats women as mere objects or trophies—things that enhance men’s status or are exchangeable on demand for the next attractive body.

Although Nussbaum is sympathetic to MacKinnon and Dworkin’s analysis of pornography, she offers four reservations in regard to ordinances aimed at making pornographers legally liable for the alleged harms caused by their materials. First, the justification for the ordinance fails to distinguish between moral wrongs that are legally actionable and those that are not. Second, violence against women has a variety of causes and it is difficult to isolate the distinct contribution of pornography. Third, making authors responsible for the criminal actions that their work may inspire is likely to have a chilling effect on valuable expression. And fourth, officials and courts are likely to misapply such ordinances to controversial but not harmful speech (Nussbaum 1999: 248–249). Nussbaum’s critique avoids invoking an unlimited or overly broad right to free speech, as she notes that not all speech is protected by the First Amendment (Nussbaum 1999: 247). She also notes that makers of other vice-type products, such as tobacco, can be held liable for the damaging effects of their products, and that other Western democratic countries permit restrictions on hate speech. Nevertheless, Nussbaum suggests that the harms of pornography can be addressed through moral dialogue and cultural analysis. Similarly, Langton, who is highly sympathetic to MacKinnon’s analysis of pornography, sees it as primarily a moral issue and a philosophical problem regarding what it means to live a good life (Langton 2009: 24).

Linda LeMoncheck challenges the view that pornography involves unacceptable forms of sexual objectification by arguing that the sexual fantasies depicted in pornography imply that women’s subjectivities are recognized by the consumers of this material (LeMoncheck 1997: 133). The fantasy of overcoming a woman’s will assumes that she has a will to overcome (LeMoncheck 1997: 131), and the fantasy that women enjoy being sexually exploited assumes that they have desires that men’s sexual use fulfills (LeMoncheck 1997: 133). LeMoncheck writes,

sex work is not merely about treating a woman as an object nor merely about dehumanizing her. Sex work is a complex dialectic between subject and object in which a woman’s dehumanization is successful precisely because she is perceived as a person whose will, seductiveness, and power is properly subordinate to men. (LeMoncheck 1997: 134)

On this view, pornographic materials and porn consumers recognize women’s agency while imagining subduing it. Women are thus recognized as subjects with ends of their own and are not depicted as mere subhuman objects. Susan Bordo similarly recognizes that women are constructed as subjects in pornography, but she argues that they are subjects whose agency expresses itself only as a desire to please the projected male viewer. She writes,

an essential ingredient in porn … is the depiction of a subjectivity (or personality) that willingly contracts its possibilities and pleasure to one—the acceptance and gratification of the male … The woman in porn abdicates her will, her sexual discrimination, her independence, but not to become a mute body for the man. (Bordo 1994: 276)

For Bordo, there is a mind inside the pornographic female body, but it communicates only a limited range of nonthreatening desires, and therefore it exists as a truncated self.

Shrage contests the Kantian notion that sex is morally problematic because it inevitably involves using another as a mere instrument. The agency of sexual actors does not have a greater potential to immorally objectify others than the agency of employers, consumers, and numerous agents who exploit human capacities to achieve their own ends. Shrage argues that the use of others involved in pornography is not immorally objectifying as long as consumers and producers respect the ends of the actors and models employed. These ends include the desire to economically benefit from their sexual attractiveness within the conventional boundaries set by various genres of sexual representation and entertainment. The relationship between porn stars and consumers of their work are market relationships and should be held to the norms of those relationships, not the norms of friendships and romance (Shrage 2005). Similarly, Patricia Marino argues that respect for another’s autonomy and consent are what is crucial for avoiding immoral sexual objectification, and not whether the sexual use is mutual or whether it takes place within an ongoing adult relationship. A person avoids treating another as a mere object or instrument if he is attentive to whether his partner is giving, tacitly or overtly, ongoing consent to the type of use and the particular instance of it. Moreover, the background conditions must be such that the person who is used as a means to another’s ends can be judged to be voluntarily and genuinely consenting. When these criteria are met in a one-sided commercial or casual exchange, then the instrumental use is not immoral (Marino 2008).

Jennifer Saul explores the possible connection between objectification—treating people as things—and personification—treating things as people. Saul critiques earlier feminist claims that men’s use of pornographic images involves treating pieces of paper like women, and therefore involves conflating women with inanimate instruments (Saul 2006a, 49–50). Melinda Vadas, for example, argues that the production of objects that can be used, like women, to satisfy sexual appetites places women and their pornographic substitutes in a single ontological category—e.g., the category of entities that can arouse and satisfy sexual desire. This reinforces the sexist idea that all that female and alluring things, whether persons or not, are sexually consumable without consent, or that is, rapeable (Vadas 2005). Saul argues that personification and objectification are only linked in troubling ways if some conditions for morally problematic objectification are already met. Saul draws on Rachel Maines’s historical work on the development of a device now known as the personal vibrator and contends that women’s use of vibrators to achieve sexual pleasure and orgasm represents a form of personification. For some women, vibrators eventually replaced a service that had been provided by doctors (and midwives and spas). Yet this is not a troubling form of personification—one linked to troubling forms of objectification—because doctors are not likely to be confused with sex toys as a result of women’s masturbatory use of vibrating technology. Doctors have other acknowledged medical uses, as well as ends of their own. Therefore, the transformation of their historical role in treating sexually frustrated (or “hysteric”) women, by both new understandings of women’s reproductive and sexual health and advancements in vibrator technology, does not contribute to the oppression of doctors. Saul’s discussion of the possible equation of people and things, and the background circumstances that may permit this, is useful for considering some new technological developments in pornography. New digital imaging and personal computer technologies enable users to interact and “have sex” with playmate animations on one’s computer screen. Computer-mediated interactions with digitally-simulated but fictional people can sometimes be difficult to distinguish from computer-mediated online interactions with real people. Yet such pornographic possibilities do not necessarily involve morally troubling objectification or personification, as long as the social background conditions require us to differentiate flesh and blood, non-virtual humans from passive objects and treat the former as subjects, or as active and autonomous agents.

Nancy Bauer appeals to Beauvoir’s ideas regarding the social construction of femininity, and suggests that women are to some degree responsible for self-objectification, and are not mere passive agents acted upon by men. Bauer critiques contemporary feminist philosophers, such as Langton, for failing to illuminate contemporary sexual cultures and practices in ways that might lead to genuine self-criticism and self-awareness. Philosophical speech, like pornographic speech, is a form of social action, and Bauer’s book urges feminist philosophers to consider what kinds of social action they engage in when they offer technical linguistic analyses of pornography’s influence (Bauer 2015). Do their communicative acts serve as action-guiding social commentary, or as theoretical exegeses within the insular world of academic philosophy? Can an analysis of pornography’s causal properties tell us what to do with it, or about it?

1.4 Does Some Pornography Serve Feminist Ends?

Some feminist theorists argue that pornography is about voyeurism, and that some women (and some men) take pleasure in looking at depictions of sex. To explore women’s use of pornography, feminist scholars have studied soft-core pornographic genres that are marketed to women, such as pulp romance fiction (Radway 1991). Some have studied lesbian pornography to challenge the idea that pornography always involves men subordinating women (Ross 2000). In 1986, a group of feminists published Caught Looking: Feminism, Pornography, and Censorship, which argues that feminists have targeted pornography out of frustration with their lack of progress in reducing violence against women. The book showcases a variety of pornographic imagery in order to illustrate the types of materials that may be restricted under feminist-supported legal regulations (Duggan, Hunter, & Vance 1986). In the introduction, Kate Ellis, Barbara O’Dair and Abby Tallmer argue that

the feminist movement must not be drawn, in the name of protecting women, into the practice of censoring “deviant” sexual representation or expression … Women had to learn, with the support of other women, to articulate experiences that lay outside the proper sphere of the “nice girl,” to acknowledge our fantasies, and to be proud of our sexual choices … We must speak out when we are victims, but also acknowledge what excites us, and support women who make their living providing that excitement to men and to ourselves. (Ellis et al. 1986: 6)

Ann Snitow advocates recentering feminist sexuality discussions on “the right to demand a sexuality more centered on female pleasure”, instead of focusing on controlling male sexuality (Snitow 1986: 11).

In Caught Looking, Lisa Duggan, Nan Hunter, and Carole Vance question the political strategies of anti-pornography feminists. They ask “how can feminists be entrusting the patriarchal state with the task of legally distinguishing between permissible and impermissible sexual images?” (73). Any non-normative form of sexual expression, such as consensual BDSM or lesbian erotica, could be targeted by MacKinnon/Dworkin style ordinances. Gayle Rubin elaborates,

The scapegoating of pornography will create new problems, new forms of legal and social abuse, and new modes of persecution. A responsible and progressive political movement has no business pursuing strategies that will result in witch-hunts. (Rubin 1993: 38)

Duggan, Hunter, and Vance provide three further reasons for opposing anti-pornography laws:

first, the sexual images in question do not cause more harm than other aspects of misogynist culture; second, sexually explicit speech, even in male-dominated society, serves positive social functions for women; and third, the passage and enforcement of antipornography laws such as those supported in Minneapolis and Indiana are more likely to impede, rather than advance, feminist goals. (Duggan Hunter, & Vance 1986: 80–81)

Drucilla Cornell criticizes MacKinnon and Dworkin’s model ordinance for its tendency to enshrine an old stereotype of woman in the law—woman as vulnerable and in need of protection. She alleges that the ordinance approach relies on the law to enforce social norms and thus fails to struggle “beyond those symbolic forms that have been deeply inscribed in and by the structures of gender”, as new forms of erotica sometimes do (Cornell 2000a: 554).

Judith Butler examines the role of fantasy in feminist politics and argues for maintaining conditions that permit diverse representations of women. Butler writes, “feminist theory relies on the capacity to postulate through fantasy a future that is not yet” (Butler 2000: 487). According to Butler, antipornography feminists uncritically assume a representational realist ontology in which “depictions” imitate and can causally disrupt some preexisting reality. Butler argues for a more complex understanding of the relation between representations and their referents, focusing on how representations can call into question the ontological status of entities and on how “the real” is produced through social action. Curtailing representations will produce new forms of social action rather than protect some undisturbed, preferred version of reality. In Butler’s words,

certain kinds of efforts to restrict practices of representation in the hopes of reigning in the imaginary, controlling the phantasmatic, end up reproducing and proliferating the phantasmatic in inadvertent ways, indeed, in ways that contradict the intended purposes of the restrictions itself. (Butler 2000: 490)

Butler points out that efforts to censor homoerotic images have led to their greater production and exposure. She concludes that,

Feminist theory and politics cannot regulate the representation of “women” without producing that very “representation”: and if that is in some sense a discursive inevitability of representational politics, then the task must be to safeguard the open productivity of those categories, whatever the risk. (Butler 2000: 503)

Butler concurs with feminists who hold that noxious speech can, in most instances, be addressed through action that involves critical and thoughtful speech. For instance, disturbing depictions of “real sex” can be contested by insightful commentary and by new kinds of erotic imagery. Cornell develops this approach by arguing that “Political action, not legal action, should be the main mode of intervention in the production of pornography” (Cornell 2000a: 551). By political action, Cornell means that feminists should form alliances with feminists in the pornography industry to create representations of sexuality that will benefit women. Like Snitow, Cornell argues that feminist activism should focus “on unleashing the feminine imaginary, rather than on constraining men” (Cornell 2000a: 553). Cornell examines the film and performance work of Candida Royalle, Ona Zee, and Annie Sprinkle to show how “femme” and feminist pornography challenges the ways that conventional pornography captures women and sex. Like Butler, Cornell emphasizes the importance of fantasy for realizing transformative feminist projects. She writes “Without new images and new words in which to express our sexuality, we will be unable to create a new world for women” (Cornell 2000a: 564).

2. Prostitution

2.1 Should Some Sex Markets Be Prohibited?

Markets that subvert or erode fundamental moral and political values should be suppressed, according to Debra Satz. These markets tend to exploit the social vulnerabilities of others, lack informational transparency, pose unacceptably high risks for some participants, or contribute to the social marginalization of some groups. For example, markets in sexual services that (i) seek providers from stigmatized or disempowered social classes, (ii) fail to create conditions for informed consent, (iii) damage the health of participants, or (iv) reinforce pernicious stereotypes about women or other groups, are of questionable value. Although these features of markets are usually contingent, when they persist, states are justified in restricting or regulating such markets, especially if they can do so without producing more harm than good (Satz 2010). Anne Phillips contends that markets in sexual services arise only under conditions of social inequality. She writes, “the inequality that attends such markets is not just contingent; it is an intrinsic feature” (Phillips 2011: 738). People offer sexual intimacy, or bodily organs or substances, primarily as acts of compassion, and do not in ordinary circumstances commoditize such bodily capacities. Phillips points out that few customers in such markets would be willing to enter as sellers. Those who do market their sexual, reproductive, or other basic bodily capacities do so only when background circumstance compel them to do so.

Carole Pateman argues that the work of a female prostitute is different from other jobs, as it expresses the inferior social and political status of women. Moreover, because people’s bodies and sexual capacities are an integral part of their identity as men and women, the woman who works as a prostitute sells her womanhood and therefore herself (Pateman 1988: 207). Christine Overall similarly argues that prostitution is a transaction in which one person must be defined as a social subordinate who caters to the desires of another. She claims that the prostitute’s work differs from that of other low-status workers in that it is a form of labor that cannot be reciprocated (Overall 1992: 718). Elizabeth Anderson develops this idea and argues that the good of sex is

realized only when each partner reciprocates the other’s gift in kind, offering her own sexuality in the same spirit in which she received the other’s—as a genuine offering of the self. The commodification of sexual “services” destroys the kind of reciprocity required to realize human sexuality as a shared good,

and may corrupt non-market sexual relationships by promoting the valuation of women in terms of their market worth (Anderson 1993: 154–55; see also Radin 1996: 133).

Although Phillips, Pateman, Overall, and Anderson regard marketing one’s sexual capacities as inherently degrading and oppressive, other feminist theorists contend that these features of the work are contingent. Shrage argues that sex markets, like other markets, often exploit sexist ideas that relegate women to subservient roles, and their existence in this form can perpetuate pernicious social myths that stigmatize women. Yet, the background conditions of such markets can change, especially as the norms of gender and sexuality evolve in ways that are less sexist (Shrage 1989: 357). Debra Satz writes that

If prostitution is wrong it is because of its effects on how men perceive women and on how women perceive themselves. In our society, prostitution represents women as the sexual servants of men. (Satz 1995: 78)

Satz suggests that the negative image of women promoted by prostitution “shapes and influences the way women as a whole are seen” (Satz 1995: 79). However, if the industry were restructured to be less sexist, then its impact on society would be different.

Martha Nussbaum questions whether the sale of sexual services genuinely damages the persons who provide them or women as a whole. Nussbaum points out that, two centuries ago, the use of one’s artistic talents for pay, such as singing or acting, was regarded as a form of prostitution (Nussbaum 1999: 277). Nussbaum acknowledges that sex workers are currently stigmatized for their profession, but questions whether the stigma that attaches to their work is justified. By tracing this stigma both to aristocratic prejudice toward waged laborers and to moralistic attitudes and anxieties regarding female sexual expression, Nussbaum challenges the rational basis of this social stigma (Nussbaum 1999: 278–79, 286–88). She concludes that feminists should oppose the stigmatization of sex work, rather than oppose sex work for its contribution to the stigmatization of women. Nussbaum also questions seven common claims against prostitution: that it involves excessive risks, the prostitute has little autonomy, it violates the prostitute’s bodily integrity, prostitution has a destructive effect on non-commercial intimate relationships, prostitution violates a person’s inalienable right to her sexuality, it contributes to a male-dominated social order, and it relies on the economic coercion of workers. Nussbaum argues that the problems associated with prostitution are components of many other kinds of work and social practices, and that these problems are not inherent to the work but are often a function of the prostitute’s working conditions and treatment by others (Nussbaum 1999: 288–97, see also Moen 2012).

Scott Anderson resists the move to treat prostitution like other forms of work. He argues that normalizing prostitution undermines a person’s right to sexual autonomy, which is an important value defended by radical feminists. Prostitutes waive their right to sexual autonomy because their jobs place them under contractual obligations to have sex, and thus diminish their control over when and with whom they have sex. Anderson acknowledges that all jobs, to some degree, diminish various forms of autonomy. He contends that sexual autonomy should be valued differently from other forms, such as a person’s control over when and to whom they serve food, provide a massage or dance, offer expert advice, or talk philosophy. He writes,

a person’s sexuality almost always figures prominently as an aspect of his or her self-conception, status in society, and economic and social prospects…It is because sex plays such a pivotal role in the lives of most adults…that it creates its own special…realm within which one can be more or less autonomous. (Anderson 2006: 386)

Anderson here echoes Pateman’s contention that our sexual capacities and practices are an integral part of who we are as men and women. For this reason, a person’s sexual autonomy should be non-alienable, because to alienate it is to destroy a person’s wholeness or integrity.

In response to Anderson, Hallie Liberto distinguishes three ways of alienating a right or good. First, one can waive a right to x (in a weak sense) by granting someone access to x with the understanding that, at any moment, permission to use x can be revoked. Second, one can waive a right to x (in a strong sense) by granting someone access to x for a duration of time, with the understanding that permission to use x cannot be revoked during this period (presumably if other terms of the lease are met). Third, one can relinquish a right to x by transferring that right, as through a sale or gift. In this case, permission to use x is granted permanently and cannot be revoked if other terms of the transfer are met. Liberto points out that those who consider the marketing of sexual services a legitimate form of work assume that the sex worker, like other workers, will only be alienating her right of control over her body and sexual labor in a weak sense (Liberto 2009: 141–43; see also Schwarzenbach 1991: 112). In a society in which any form of forced labor is prohibited (e.g., slavery, indentured servitude), workers are generally permitted to back out of labor contracts, although in doing so they typically relinquish all expected benefits (Shrage 2016).

Sex worker activists and advocates have long argued that they are not permanently alienating (selling) their sexual capacities, but rather are exchanging sexual labor for benefits (Schwarzenbach 1991: 112–14). A sex worker’s right to sexual autonomy is not undermined in contexts where she retains the right to withdraw from her labor contracts at any time (Tuana and Shrage 2003: 33; Shrage 2016). Carol Leigh and Norma Jean Almodovar suggest that anti-prostitution laws undermine sexual autonomy by not allowing adults to enter mutually advantageous sexual agreements (Leigh 2004; Almodovar 2002). Peter de Marneffe argues for limiting sex worker contracts in ways similar to other forms of dangerous and potentially harmful work. Restricting and regulating prostitution would balance respect for the autonomy of service providers (and consumers of sexual services) with society’s interest in protecting its members from harm (de Marneffe 2010).

2.2 Can We Distinguish Human Trafficking from Consensual Sex Work?

Some markets in sexual services exploit providers who manifest weak agency (Satz 2010), such as people who are young, homeless, drug addicts, poor, oppressed minorities, migrants, undocumented, and so on. Gerda Lerna argues that to understand how prostitution evolved historically, we need to understand “its relationship to the sexual regulation of all women in archaic states and its relationship to the enslavement of females” (Lerner 1986: 124). Lerner writes,

It is likely that commercial prostitution derived directly from the enslavement of women and the consolidation and formation of classes. Military conquest led, in the third millennium B.C., to the enslavement and sexual abuse of captive women. As slavery became an established institution, slave-owners rented out their female slaves as prostitutes, and some masters set up commercial brothels staffed by slaves. (Lerner 1986: 133)

Lerner speculates that prostitutes and concubines were used by rulers as symbols of wealth and power, and this practice was then emulated by other men of wealth and status (Lerner 1986: 133). Paupers were often forced to sell children, adding to the supply of labor for this purpose. Furthermore, as women’s social respectability and marriageability became tied to their chastity, “commercial prostitution came to be seen as a social necessity for meeting the sexual needs of men”, (Lerner 1986: 134). In short, women who became prostitutes in ancient societies were typically enslaved, captive, or poor.

Gayle Rubin traces the origins of modern prostitution to the rise of patriarchal kinship systems in which women are exchanged as gifts among families to cement social bonds (Rubin 1975: 175). Rubin writes,

If women are the gifts, then it is men who are the exchange partners. And it is the partners, not the presents, upon whom reciprocal exchange confers its quasi-mystical power of social linkage. The relations of such a system are such that women are in no position to realize the benefits of their own circulation. As long as the relations specify that men exchange women, it is men who are the beneficiaries of the product of such exchanges—social organization. (Rubin 1975: 174)

In other words, in the very creation of society, women were allegedly subordinated through ritual exchange in order to create bonds of kinship among men as the foundation of the social order. Rubin writes

The “exchange of women” is a seductive and powerful concept. It is attractive in that it places the oppression of women within social systems, rather than biology. Moreover, it suggests that we look for the ultimate locus of women’s oppression within the traffic in women, rather than within the traffic in merchandise. (Rubin 1975: 175)

Trafficking in women to create social bonds among men, on Rubin’s account, explains women’s social subordination as wives and ultimately, and as nonfamilial sexual servants.

Both Lerner’s and Rubin’s accounts link the rise of prostitution to the subordination of women, and overlook the enslavement and prostitution of men, both in ancient and modern societies. Lerner’s account fails to explain why female slaves were sexually exploited more than male slaves. Rubin does not explain why women, rather than men or opposite-sex pairs, were exchanged or “trafficked” in early kinship systems, and thus her account begs the question in regard to the rise of patriarchal kinship and political systems (Shrage 1994: 105, 131–32). While consumers of commercial sexual services have been predominantly male throughout history, factors other than gender subordination have influenced whose sexual labor was bartered or sold, such as colonialism and racial subordination (Kempadoo 1999). By trying to explain contemporary sex commerce in terms of the subordination of women, these accounts overlook important historical and cultural discontinuities. For example, commercial sex providers have not always been regarded as ineligible for marriage and have, in some places, been integrated into their communities to a high degree (Shrage 1994: 109, 115; White 1990: 19; Rossiaud 1988: 70).

Carol Pateman deploys the concepts of liberal political theory to explain the existence of prostitution in modern societies. She argues that the social contract, which establishes the rights and freedoms of men in a liberal political order, also establishes the terms of women’s subjection. In particular, the patriarchal social order includes an implicit agreement among men that grants them sexual access to women (Pateman 1988: 2). Men acquire sexual rights to particular women through marriage and prostitution. In other words, men have a class privilege—a right to sexual relief from women—which they can exercise by asserting their rights as husbands or johns. Like Lerner and Rubin, Pateman challenges the notion that prostitution results from men’s biologically driven behavior, and instead explains prostitution as the incorporation of a particular conception of masculinity into modern political and social structures (Pateman 1988: 198–99). In this way, modern prostitution represents the survival of some aspects of older illiberal social orders within the modern liberal state. Both traditional marriage and prostitution, for Pateman, Lerner, and Rubin, give men access to and control over the sexual capacities of women.

Kamala Kempadoo argues that “the global sex trade cannot be simply reduced to one monolithic explanation of violence to women” (Kempadoo 2001: 28). Kempadoo claims that older feminist models, which see prostitution as reflection of male power backed up by a monopoly on the use of physical force, are “inadequate to capture the various histories, oppression, and experiences of women of color” (Kempadoo 2001: 35, 37). Kempadoo examines how histories of racism, colonialism, militarism, and globalization structure the choices of first and third-world women of color. Although Kempadoo urges feminists to understand prostitution in terms of a broader range of social forces, she maintains that feminist theorizing about prostitution should avoid overlooking the agency of women of color by treating them as mere passive victims of oppression (Kempadoo 2001: 43). Kempadoo writes:

The agency of Brown and Black women in prostitution has been avoided or overlooked and the perspectives arising from these experiences marginalized in dominant theoretical discourse on the global sex trade and prostitution. Our insights, knowledges, and understanding of sex work have been largely obscured or dominated by white radical feminist, neo-Marxist or Western socialist feminist inspired analyses that have been either incapable or unwilling to address the complexities of the lives of women of color. (Kempadoo 2001: 40)

Rather than conceptualize prostitution in terms of the sexual exploitation and degradation of women, Kempadoo advocates understanding prostitution as a kind of labor that is often performed by marginalized people (Kempadoo 2001: 45; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998: 4–5; see also Leigh 1997). In this way, prostitution is similar to labor performed in other industries, such as agriculture, manufacturing, or transportation. By analyzing prostitution as a form of labor, rather than a form of social decay or evil, feminists can avoid unrealistic abolitionist approaches (Kempadoo and Doezema 1998; White 1990; Shrage 1996).

A number of feminist theorists analyze prostitution and trafficking in terms of neoliberal and neocolonial economic relationships, in which women from poor countries in the global south are conscripted to provide “comfort and recreation” for military personnel and other men from rich nations in the global north. Sometimes social elites in poor nations tolerate and promote their own “sex tourism” enterprises, in which local women provide sexual labor to attract foreign capital (Enloe 1989: 36, 86; O’Connell Davidson 1998: 75; Bishop and Robinson 1998). Laura Agustín cautions feminists not to conflate voluntary (though illegal) migrants who are seeking more lucrative forms of sex work with trafficked women (Agustín 2007). Although poor, third-world (and second-world) women are often exploited by traffickers, some may be choosing to migrate and work in sex businesses over other occupations available to them (factory or domestic work) both in their home and target countries. Harsh laws against trafficking often exacerbate the plight of voluntary migrant sex workers who may be undocumented and working illegally (Kotiswaran 2011; Rajan 2003; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998). Anti-trafficking and anti-prostitution efforts should focus on eliminating forced work and migration, child labor, exploitative working conditions, and hostile legal environments for migrants and sex workers (Kotiswaran 2011: 47–8).

Because sex workers often come from marginalized social groups, their basic rights as workers and citizens are frequently violated. Feminist theorists who recognize sex work as a legitimate choice that some people make, among a constricted set of opportunities in order to earn a living, also recognize that sex markets can take many forms. In some cases those who supply the labor are relatively free and empowered agents, and in other cases they are not. The challenge is to devise policies that prevent the recruitment of children and socially vulnerable people as providers, and that also protect the rights of those who enter such markets even with informed consent.

2.3 Can Markets in Sexual Services Be Effectively Regulated?

Trafficking in persons (human slavery) for any purpose, including sex commerce, is universally condemned and rightly so. Feminists disagree about whether all sex markets involve forced labor and sex. Those who regard commerce in sex categorically as a form of involuntary servitude and violence against women generally support laws that punish people who exchange money for sex in all circumstances (Jeffreys 1998; Barry 1996; Stark and Whisnant 2004). Feminists who hold that some sex work is performed by people who exert autonomy and moral agency generally support policies that permit exchanges of sex for money among consenting adults (Shrage 1996; Nussbaum 1999; Ditmore 2005; Leigh 2004). Having such policies is consistent with vigorous efforts to stop human trafficking.

Peter de Marneffe distinguishes four approaches to laws governing prostitution. (1) Prohibition involves criminalizing both the sale and purchase of sexual services, along with related activities, such as soliciting or operating a brothel. (2) Abolition involves criminalizing only the purchase of sexual services, along with related activities such as curb (“kerb”) crawling or procuring. (3) Regulation (legalization) involves governmental licensing and regulating of sex work businesses. (4) Decriminalization involves removing criminal prohibitions for acts of purchasing or selling sex among consenting adults (de Marneffe 2010: 28–30; see also Kotiswaran 2011: 16). According to de Marneffe, one can defend decriminalization by appealing to the moral right to self-sovereignty, without supporting legalization, especially of large scale enterprises (de Marneffe 2013).

Most feminists who oppose all sex commerce support abolition rather than prohibition, because the abolition approach treats the provider of sexual services as a victim rather than a criminal. To prosecute women for selling sex, some argue, just compounds their victimization and oppression. Sweden was the first country to adopt this approach. Other feminists support regulation, because abolition can endanger sex workers by forcing their work underground in order to protect customers. The Netherlands and Germany have adopted some form of regulation, which basically aims to reduce the harms of prostitution rather than eliminate it. Some feminists support decriminalization (the approach now taken in New Zealand) because most regulatory approaches (e.g., mandatory registration and health checks for providers, restricting work sites through zoning and brothels, etc.) aim to protect customers and third parties, not sex workers, and contribute to the stigmatization of prostitutes as diseased and sinful (Nagle 1997; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998; Almodovar 2002; Leigh 2004). By contrast, regulationists worry that a laissez-faire approach leaves sex workers vulnerable to extreme exploitation, and some explore how employment law and policy can protect sex workers, as well as clients and third parties (Davis 2015; Shrage 1994 and 1996).

In the U.S., many sexual service providers work for escort agencies, and thereby manage to get around anti-prostitution laws. Because the client pays the agency for the escort’s time and the provider does not take money directly from the client but only from the agency, sex between a professional escort and her client is often ignored by law enforcers. When agencies become aggressive and brazen in their advertising or business practices, they are sometimes prosecuted as fronts for prostitution. Yet, the full force of anti-prostitution laws tends to be felt by women who are destitute, drug-addicted, or just amateurs, who solicit customers directly or in public places. Under regimes of prohibition, anti-prostitution laws are often used against people who engage in survival sex, such as homeless women or minors who are not able to work in safer venues. Rarely are they used against middle class women who serially date men in pursuit of expensive gifts, college tuition, or living expenses (Shrage 2015, Other Internet Resources). Anti-prostitution laws are also used to prosecute men who sexually and commercially exploit women (e.g., customers and pimps), but they are sometimes used to prosecute the boyfriends and co-workers of prostitutes with whom they have consensual and supportive relationships (Almodovar 1993). Police practices in the U.S., historically, have focused on arresting and prosecuting prostitutes, especially street workers, who may receive enhanced penalties if they know they are HIV positive. Women make up the majority of prostitutes and the majority of those arrested, and minority women are overrepresented among those arrested (Marganski 2012).

Over the past few decades, a few countries have moved toward toleration and regulation of the work activities of prostitutes, yet the larger trend has been toward criminalization, often with increased penalties for customers and pimps (see 100 countries… in Other Internet Resources). Feminist campaigns against prostitution and trafficking have mobilized to win approval for abolitionist policies. Essentially, the feminist anti-pornography movement of the 1970s and 1980s has evolved into the feminist anti-trafficking movement of the 21st century. Both movements treat markets in sexually explicit materials and services as a form of violence against women, and claim that tolerating them perpetuates the social subordination of women. Like the anti-pornography movement in the 1980s, the anti-trafficking movement is finding common ground with social conservatives who have religious objections to non-marital sex, and, more recently, with political conservatives who want to keep economic migrants out of their countries.

In response to these and earlier efforts to block sex markets, an international sex workers’ rights movement has formed to advocate for decriminalizing consensual adult sex work. Sex worker activists, many of whom are also feminists, have challenged scholarly research about their lives and work, and argue that criminalization renders them less able to protect their health and exercise their rights (Almodovar 1993; Pendleton 1997; Highleyman 1997; Queen 1997; Sprinkle 1998; Quan 2001; Bernstein 2000; Leigh 2004). Sex worker organizations are forming alliances with queer activists, labor unions, and human rights advocates to advance their political goals. In 2015, an influential human rights organization, Amnesty International, approved a resolution calling upon countries to decriminalize adult consensual sex work, which represents a huge victory for the sex workers rights movement.

Adrienne Davis argues that the abolitionist movement has had more political victories because this side is more united in their aims. By contrast, feminists supporting sex worker rights are deeply divided over whether to support regulation or decriminalization. Davis shows that advocates for regulation exaggerate the similarities of sex work with other types of work, while advocates for decriminalization exaggerate the differences. Davis proposes a “sexual geographies” approach to sex work, which recognizes that the potential harms depend on where and how the work is performed. Virtual sex work, where providers are relatively anonymous and meet with customers only online, is relatively safe. Outcall work, where sex workers meet with customers in private spaces, such as hotel rooms, and have physical contact with their customers is significantly more risky. Exotic dancers, who perform in public venues, such as bars and clubs, and have limited physical contact with customers, face an intermediate level of risk. Health and safety regulations need to encompass different kinds of work sites and risks, and include appropriate measures for each.

Davis notes where current employment law in the U.S. is insufficient to address some of the risks that sex workers face, such as assault by customers and co-workers and invidious discrimination (Davis 2015). Employment regulations typically offer greater protection for injuries acquired in the course of doing one’s job than for incidental violence and attacks. Davis also points out that sexual harassment will be more difficult to define in sex work contexts. Furthermore, because preferences for race, like gender, may be built into customers’ sexual tastes and fantasies, employers and courts might view generally irrelevant personal characteristics as bona fide occupational qualifications. Nevertheless, Davis favors decriminalization with regulation, and challenges feminists to improve employment regulation so that there are better safeguards for sex work, and other work performed in non-traditional and diverse work sites.

In her theoretically nuanced and fair-minded overview of both radical feminist opposition to prostitution and liberal feminist advocacy of sex worker rights, Prabha Kotiswaran carves out a “middle ground” feminist position. Middle ground feminism pays attention to the empirical realities of various sex trades and the efforts of sex worker organizations to protect the civil and economic rights of their members. Middle ground feminists are aware of how the sex industry is gendered and, at times, critically and respectfully engage with the proposals of sex worker advocates. For example, middle ground feminists may be skeptical of the alleged needs of men that the sex industry aims to serve, while recognizing that sex workers are not passive dupes but agents who exploit less than ideal background conditions. Middle ground feminists do not treat sex commerce as monolithic, but pay attention to the different ways that labor and capital are organized in different trades. They recognize that much of sex work, like other low status service work, is menial and sometimes unpleasant, but it is not work that is inherently degrading or violent to those who voluntarily perform it. Middle ground feminists recognize that sex work is continuous with much of the caregiving work women perform, as wives, mothers, nurses, teachers, nannies, and domestics, and do not single out the sex industry for assigning to women a disproportionate share of caregiving work in society. In this way, middle ground feminists do not treat sex work as exceptional in terms of its risks, difficulty, and larger societal effects. And finally, middle ground feminists are less likely to make common cause with anti-feminist sexual moralists and anti-immigrant conservatives, and are more likely to find common cause with unions of sex workers that are grappling with challenging working conditions and economic realities (Kotiswaran 2011).


Works Cited

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Other Important Works

  • Adler, A., 2001, “The Perverse Law of Child Pornography”, Columbia Law Review, 101: 209–273.
  • Barry, K., 1979, Female Sexual Slavery, New York: Avon Books.
  • Bell, L., 1987, Good Girls/Bad Girls: Feminists and Sex Trade Workers Face to Face, Toronto: Seal Press.
  • Bell, S., 1994, Reading, Writing, and Rewriting the Prostitute Body, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Burstyn, V. (ed.), 1985, Women Against Censorship, Vancouver: Douglas and McIntyre.
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  • Carse, A., 1995, “Pornography: An Uncivil Liberty?” Hypatia, 10: 155–82.
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  • Chapkis, W., 1997, Live Sex Acts: Women Performing Erotic Labor, New York: Routledge.
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  • Gauthier, J., 2011, “Prostitution, Sexual Autonomy, and Sex Discrimination”, Hypatia, 26: 166–86.
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  • Griffin, S., 1981, Pornography and Silence: Culture’s Revenge Against Nature, New York: Harper and Row.
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  • Itzin, C. (ed.), 1992, Pornography: Women, Violence, and Civil Liberties, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kappeler, S., 1986, The Pornography of Representation, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
  • Kipnis, L., 1996, Bound and Gagged: Pornography and the Politics of Fantasy in America, New York: Grove Press.
  • Kulick, D., 1998, Travesti: Sex, Gender and Culture among Brazilian Transgendered Prostitutes, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
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  • Leidholdt, D. and J. Raymond (eds.), 1990, The Sexual Liberals and the Attack on Feminism, New York: Pergamon Press.
  • Levine, J., 2002, Harmful to Minors: The Perils of Protecting Children from Sex, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
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Other Internet Resources


The author thanks the Edmond J. Safra Center for Ethics at Harvard University for providing support while this entry was being updated and revised.

Copyright © 2016 by
Laurie Shrage <lshrage@fiu.edu>

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