Feminist Perspectives on Sex Markets
Feminist debates over sex commerce extend to a number of social practices, including pornography, prostitution, trafficking in persons, erotic dance and performance, and the use of sexual images of women to promote products and entertainment. Feminist theorists are divided on the question of whether markets in sexually explicit materials and sexual services are generally harmful to women. Accordingly, some feminist philosophers have explored and developed arguments for restricting sex markets, while others have investigated political movements that aim to advance the rights of sex workers.
- 1. Pornography
- 2. Prostitution
- 3. New Directions
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
In her thorough and well researched history of the second-wave feminist anti-pornography movement in the U.S., Carolyn Bronstein traces its origins to several developments. First, feminist activists were increasingly disenchanted with the alleged achievements of the 1960s sexual revolution, which simply added to the existing social pressures on women to serve male sexual needs. Second, feminist consciousness-raising groups in the 1970s had uncovered the prevalence of rape, incest, domestic violence, and sexual harassment across all social sectors, and were beginning to publicize the somewhat shocking levels of male sexual violence against women. Third, radical and lesbian feminists began to analyze heterosexuality as a culturally and historically shaped institution that oppressed women, in part by defining female erotic experience in terms of men’s fantasies and needs. Fourth, “cultural feminists” began to articulate an account of women as different and, in some ways, superior to men, in terms of being more nurturing and cooperative, and therefore vulnerable to characteristic masculine behaviors of aggression and domination. Fifth, various U.S. Supreme Court obscenity rulings in the 1950s and 1960s led to an explosion of increasingly explicit pornographic materials, as well as the mainstreaming and intrusion of these materials into previously sexually sanitized spaces of public life. Sixth, the growth of media studies, in response to the growing influence of popular media on society (tv and radio, mass advertising, mainstream film, popular music, and magazines), offered tools for exploring the effects of the high levels of consumption of mediated representations of women and sex (Bronstein 2011).
Appalled both by the evidence of men’s sexual coercion and abuse of women (and girls) and by the mass media’s positive images of male sexual aggression, some feminists began to wonder about the relationship between these phenomena (51). Bronstein investigates the evolution of the anti-porn faction of the feminist movement from groups that initially campaigned against all popular media images glamorizing sexual violence against women to groups that targeted only violent pornography, and then eventually all hardcore pornography. Bronstein shows that the shift from condemning violent (including mainstream) media images to condemning pornography (even nonviolent porn) involved several factors. First radical feminists began to perceive the proliferation of hardcore pornography as part of a wider societal backlash to advances in women’s equality. The saturation of society with Playboy, Hustler, Deep Throat, adult bookstores, and eventually cable and video pornography was interpreted by some activists at that time as an orchestrated campaign to keep women in their assigned social sphere by disseminating uniquely seductive and powerful misogynist propaganda. Pornography advocated misogyny by falsely and maliciously depicting women as desiring and deserving of coercive and degrading sexual use. Second, by targeting pornography as the culprit, rather than sexism in the media, the feminist anti-pornography movement took advantage of the conservative climate of the 1980s, enlisting the help of conservative moralists in the battle against conservative male chauvinists. The convergence of aims among feminists and some conservatives enabled the former to garner financial support from non-feminist, and even anti-feminist organizations (Bronstein 2011, 322). Social conservatives opposed the sexually libertine culture that they attributed to changes in the country’s sexual mores in 1960s, and they saw the growth of the pornography industry as evidence of these changes.
Bronstein’s research in various feminist archives shows that, while many feminist activists resisted the narrowing of campaigns about sexist and violent media to campaigns about sexually explicit materials, the anti-pornography feminists managed to overtake the larger movement’s momentum by drawing the most nationally prominent feminists to their cause. This brought the anti-pornography movement both national media attention and sufficient resources to expand its activities. Their efforts culminated in the development of a model anti-pornography ordinance, written by Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin, which was adopted by the city of Indianapolis, with the help of evangelical Christian organizations. The ordinance defined pornography as the “sexually explicit subordination of women, graphically depicted, through pictures and/or words” (Bronstein 2011, 324). Rather than permit state censorship of a range of pornographic materials, the ordinance would allow individuals to bring civil lawsuits seeking damage awards against the producers and distributors of a pornographic product by persons who believed they were harmed by the product. In response, many free speech feminists organized to defeat MacKinnnon/Dworkin-type ordinances in cities around the country and to support court challenges to such ordinances. In 1986, the Supreme Court found the Indianapolis ordinance to be unconstitutional and, not long after, the feminist anti-pornography movement fell into disarray.
While the “second-wave” feminist anti-pornography movement has given way to the “third-wave” sex-positive feminist movement, a number of feminist academics, including feminist philosophers, are trying to breathe life back into it (Langton 2009, Hornsby 1995, Brison 1998). The focus of concern for some theorists has shifted, however, to prostitution and trafficking (Stark and Whisnant 2004, Jeffreys 1998 and 2009; Raymond 2004; Other Internet Resources #2). Campaigns against sex-trafficking are once again aligning feminist and conservative agendas, although this time with conservatives in the U.S. and Europe who fear that the sex industry is abetting illegal immigration. While anti-pornography feminists generally fail to distinguish non-violent and violent pornography (and, some argue, representations of sexual violence from actual sexual violence), anti-trafficking feminists typically fail to distinguish trafficking and voluntary sex work, and treat all prostitution as a form of sexual coercion and forced labor. The philosophical underpinnings of the anti-pornography movement have been transposed onto debates regarding prostitution, which unlike pornography is illegal in most jurisdictions. As with pornography, feminist scholars are divided over the appropriate legal mechanisms for addressing prostitution.
Helen Longino was one of the first feminist philosophers to articulate the theory of how pornography harms women. She argued that pornography shows men and women taking pleasure in activities that objectify women and treat women as less than human. By depicting female subjects as dehumanized objects, pornography promotes the idea that women can be treated without moral regard (i.e., raped and subjugated). Longino writes, “What’s wrong with pornography, then, is its degrading and dehumanizing portrayal of women (and not its sexual content). Pornography, by its very nature, requires that women be subordinate to men and mere instruments for the fulfillment of male fantasies” (Longino 1980, 45). Following the philosopher Immanuel Kant, Longino assumes that sex is morally dangerous in that it typically involves treating another as a “mere instrument” rather than a person or subject. Because sexual desire is irrational and leads us to focus on the sexual body parts of others, it is often objectifying, dehumanizing, and degrading. Longino adds a feminist element to Kant by arguing that, since men have greater social power than women, (heterosexual) men are able to use women as instruments to satisfy their sexual ends. Pornographic depictions of heterosexual sex, then, glorify and promote such immoral and subordinating treatment by men of all women.
Catharine MacKinnon and Andrea Dworkin’s well known analysis of pornography similarly incorporates a Kantian model of sexual morality with a feminist spin (Shrage 2005). Heterosexual acts are inherently violent to women in that they involve men treating women as interchangeable objects whose integrity and boundaries are not respected. Standard heterosexual acts, for Dworkin, involve men invading and occupying women’s bodies (Dworkin 1987). Pornography, then, is equated with visual evidence and recordings of the abuse of particular women, and those who view it collaborate in their violation. According to MacKinnon, in patriarchal societies, women are often not free to refuse sex with men, and therefore their participation in sex with men may not be fully consensual. Consequently, sex with persons incapable of giving genuine consent, combined with the public spectacle of such exploitative and violent sex via pornography, violates and damages the victims psychologically and socially. For this reason, MacKinnon and Dworkin see adult pornography as abusive of women, and not merely a representation of abuse. Just as child pornography records and amplifies the abuse of molested children, by allowing other potential abusers to vicariously participate and exploit another’s ordeal for their own pleasure, adult pornography essentially does the same with women, according to MacKinnon and Dworkin. Moreover, pornography is a tool that can be used to terrorize women viewers, or to obtain their cooperation with their abusers. MacKinnon writes that pornography is used by men “to train women to sexual submission” (MacKinnon 1987, 188).
MacKinnon claims that “Specific pornography does directly cause some assaults. Some rapes are performed by men with paperback books in their pockets” (MacKinnon 1987, 184). And because “pornography conditions male orgasm to female subordination,” (MacKinnon 1987,190) it indirectly and subconsciously elicits aggressive male sexual behaviors. Pornography shapes both female and male sexual desire into victim/abuser roles, and represents predatory sexual behaviors as natural forms of sexual and gender expression. Pornography is therefore harmful to men who consume it, as well as to women who have sexual contact with men, on and off screen. In MacKinnon’s words, pornography represents “sex forced on real women so that it can be sold at a profit to be forced on other real women; women’s bodies trussed and maimed and raped and made into things to be hurt and obtained and accessed, and this presented as the nature of women; the coercion that is visible and the coercion that has become invisible — this and more bothers feminists about pornography … pornography causes attitudes and behaviors of violence and discrimination that define the treatment and status of half of the population” (MacKinnon 1987, 147). For these reasons, anti-pornography feminists conclude that pornography is not simply a sexist nuisance that can be contained by mild regulation and public criticism, but that it “nourishes sexism” (Longino 1980, 54) and disrespect for women in ways that eventuate in violations of women’s basic moral and civil rights.
As Bronstein’s work shows, there were numerous intellectual moves and political factors that transformed a movement concerned with violence against women, and irresponsible media images that appeared to trivial such violence, into a movement that aimed to eliminate hardcore pornography. Feminists who accepted MacKinnon and Dworkin’s analysis of pornography would not be satisfied with calls for consumer boycotts and corporate responsibility. Just as the latter efforts would not be a sufficient response to the concerns and threats raised by the existence of child pornography, many feminists believe that boycotts and letter-writing campaigns are an inadequate response to the existence of much adult pornography.
Longino argues that pornography should not be given the same legal protection as other expressive materials. Along with MacKinnon, she proposes that pornography should be restricted, not as a form of obscene expression, but as a product that can cause serious injuries to women, individually and as a group. Longino argues that liberal toleration of pornography constitutes acceptance of civil and sexual harms against women (Longino 1980, 48). MacKinnon and Dworkin emphasize that, because women possess vastly unequal social power compared to men, women’s participation in the production of pornography (and sex in general with men) should not be considered fully consensual (MacKinnon 1987, 128, 148–49; Dworkin 1979, 201). Pornography, on their view, often documents criminal rape and therefore its dissemination further compounds the injuries of such criminal acts. Toleration for pornography disempowers all women, for it perpetuates a climate in which women constantly fear rape, making it impossible for them to exercise whatever formal rights they have won. The MacKinnon/Dworkin model ordinance sought to make “pornography actionable as a civil rights violation” so that women would have legal recourse when pornographic materials prevent the exercise of their rights or cause personal harms (MacKinnon 1993, 22, 121, n. 32). By protecting the speech of pornographers and shielding them from liability, according to MacKinnon, the state fails to protect women’s equality and civil rights.
While MacKinnon and Dworkin primarily offer anecdotal empirical support for their claims about the harmfulness of pornography, some researchers have conducted scientific studies that offer some support for these claims. Reviewing the social science literature on the connection between pornography and rape, Diana Scully writes, “the proliferation of cultural products, like pornography, intensifies the quantity and quality of violence in men’s fantasies. Further, particularly when women are depicted as receiving pleasure from the violence directed at them, pornography trivializes rape and, thus, may encourage more men to act on their fantasies. Armed with the myths celebrated in violent pornography, such as women secretly want to be raped, men who rape can and do believe that their behavior is within the normative boundaries of the culture” (Scully 1990, 155). Unlike earlier research, which involved somewhat artificial laboratory experiments to detect the effects of exposure to pornography (56–57), Scully’s research compares the consumption of pornographic materials by convicted rapists with a control group of felons. Although she notes some problems with her research design, she concludes that her “data do establish that the majority of convicted rapists were familiar with pornography and that their use of such material was somewhat greater than that of other felons” (Scully 1990, 154).
In their review of pornography research, Neil Malamuth, Tamara Addison, and Mary Koss report that “The current findings do suggest that for the majority of American men, pornography exposure (even at the highest levels assessed here) is not associated with high levels of sexual aggression...But among those at the highest ’predisposing’ risk level for sexual aggression (a little above 7% of the entire sample), those who are very frequent pornography users (about 12% of this high risk group) have sexual aggression levels approximately four times higher than their counterparts who do not very frequently consume pornography” (Malamuth, Addison, and Koss 2000, 85). The implications of these findings for social policy are somewhat unclear. While theorists and policymakers need to consider the impact of policies on all those affected, policies designed with the most atypical citizens in mind are likely to be too restrictive for the majority of citizens. The very frequent users of those at the highest risk for sexual aggression (12% of 7% of the initial sample, which is less than 1%) present some threat to women, but a threat that can most likely be contained without censorship or creating a hostile legal climate for allegedly dangerous expressive materials. Other strategies for containment include improved enforcement of laws against sexual assault, stalking and harassment, and better prevention programs, including the rape and domestic violence awareness campaigns that are now standardly included in school curriculums.
Deborah Cameron and Elizabeth Frazer question whether accounts of the causal properties of pornography are helpful or illuminating. They argue that such accounts assume a deterministic model of human behavior, in which men lose control over their behavior and respond somewhat mindlessly to pornographic stimuli (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 248–251). The idea that men simply imitate what they see in pornography, or are conditioned to behave in certain ways through exposure to pornography, implies that men are not able to creatively and critically interpret pornographic materials. Although some men may unthinkingly copy what they see, or may even become “addicted” to sexual violence through pornography, these men are the exception, not the rule (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 243). By treating sexual violence as a product of exposure to pornography, feminists promote a view that relieves sexual predators of responsibility for their actions, and blames their actions instead on expressive materials or the pathological conditions they allegedly cause. Although causal theories invoking the loss of individual control through “imitation” and “addiction” may be useful to defendants in sexual assault and murder cases, Cameron and Frazer point out that these theories undermine the feminist goal of showing that sexual violence is a function of cultural norms and structural inequalities, rather than mental debilitation or disease (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 248). Ironically, causal models may engender social sympathy for the perpetrators of sexual violence and make it difficult to punish them (Cameron and Frazer 2000, 247). Cameron and Frazer conclude that feminists can be critical of “the discourses which inform sexual practice” and imagine alternative discourses, without promoting problematic models of human behavior (Cameron & Frazer 2000, 253).
Not all feminist philosophers concur with the feminist critique of pornography. While agreeing that the content of pornography condones the objectionable treatment of women, Ann Garry was one of the first to question whether pornography should be held responsible for pervasive gender-based violence and discrimination. Garry writes, “Much of the research on the effects of pornography indicates that any effect it has — positive or negative —is short lived” (Garry 1979, 132). Garry also questions whether treating a woman as a sex object is always bad, and suggests that pornography succeeds in harming women, in part, because viewers assume that sex is generally harmful to women (Garry 1979, 136–37). Garry encourages feminists to support the production of non-sexist pornography rather than try to suppress pornographic materials.
MacKinnon and Dworkin’s model ordinance captured the dominant feminist view that pornography is a form of defamatory and hostile speech about women, which not only triggers sexual aggression in men but also desensitizes others to the suffering of the victims. MacKinnon writes, “Women who charge men with sexual abuse are not believed. The pornographic view of them is: they want it; they all want it” (MacKinnon 1987, 191). So if they say they do not want it, they must be engaging in playful teasing or deception. In this way, pornography silences women, because it stigmatizes and reinforces prejudices against women as unreliable when reporting their sexual desires and activities. Men are allegedly so misinformed by pornography that they will systematically misinterpret women’s attempts to refuse sex, and juries and the public at large are likely to dismiss or trivialize the testimony of sexual assault victims (Langton 2009, 297).
Ultilizing the tools of speech act theory to explain how pornography subordinates and silences women, Rae Langton argues that pornographic speech subordinates by virtue of its illocutionary force (Langton 1995, 215). Langton points out that pornographic words and images, like utterances in general, are a form of social action. The literal content (locutionary force) of a pornographic work may be the depiction of a particular sexual act, and this may have the effect (perlocutionary force) of arousing particular viewers and shaping their attitudes toward women. The illocutionary force of a pornographic work pertains to the actions performed in depicting sex and women. For example, a sign that says “Whites Only” contributes to the social subordination of non-whites by performing the act of commanding racial segregation. Similarly, a pornographic work may, by virtue of its depiction of sexually aggressive behaviors, perform the function of giving viewers permission to engage in sexually predatory behaviors. The illocutionary force of a particular speech act depends on a variety of factors, including the intentions of the speaker and the background conventions that link the conventional meanings of words with social practices. A “Whites Only” sign hanging on a theatre set has a different illocutionary force than one hanging on the door of an actual social establishment. Moreover, historical, cultural, and legal background conditions will determine whether a speech act is successful. Langton argues that there are good, though not conclusive, reasons to think that the background factors that enable pornographic texts to endorse, recommend, or command hostile acts against women are in place. However, she also suggests that the illocutionary force of pornography may be blocked effectively by the speech acts of its critics, rather than by censorship (Langton 1995, 216).
Jennifer Hornsby also deploys speech act theory to explain how pornography silences women. According to Hornsby, pornographic materials reinforce ideas about women that deprive their utterances of their ordinary illocutionary meaning (Hornsby 1995, 227). For example, pornographic works may convey the idea that the women which men find sexy are eager to satisfy their sexual appetites, so that when these women say “no,” their utterance constitutes not an act of refusal but an act of teasing. In this way, pornography reinforces social codes that allow men to systematically misread and discount women’s speech. Women may be silenced, then, not by having their speech suppressed but by changes to the background conditions necessary for successful speech acts, such as refusal. If pornography interferes with the ability of women to communicate, then women cannot contest the harm of pornography with more speech, but only by suppressing pornographic materials.
Susan Brison argues that pornography is a form of group libel that may undermine the autonomy of the target group. By spreading falsehoods about women, pornography narrows the range of social options and opportunities that women see as available to them. Members of groups that are socially vilified have a more difficult journey pursuing their aims or attempting to perform particular social roles (Brison 1998). Langton argues that, even if pornography is about fantasy and is to be understood as fictional, it can misinform. According to Langton, pornography projects the beliefs and fantasies of those who are socially powerful, and because those with less social power may conform their behavior to those beliefs, the beliefs become self-fulfilling. In this way, pornographic speech harms women by changing the world it appears to describe (Langton 2009, 301-9).
Nadine Strossen has challenged the claim that pornography subordinates and silences women. Strossen argues that pornographic works do not have singular meanings, nor do they command only sexist understandings. She writes, “Procensorship feminists may well view a woman’s apparent welcoming of sex with a man as degrading, but this is because of their negative attitudes toward women’s ability to make sexual choices. Other viewers are likely to see such a scene as positive and healthy” (Strossen 1995, 162). Furthermore, according to Strossen, “Ambiguous and positive interpretations apply to the full range of sexual speech, including violent imagery and imagery that might well be labeled ‘subordinating’ or ‘degrading,’ such as rape scenes and scenes dramatizing the so-called rape myth — namely that women want to be raped” (Strossen 1995, 146). To illustrate that pornographic texts can produce divergent responses, Strossen examines opposing reactions to films that depict rape, to controversial images of women in popular advertisements or print media, and even to Andrea Dworkin’s own sexually graphic novels. Strossen claims that the effect on some viewers, including women, may be positive: “Pornography, including pornographic rape scenes, may serve another, intensely political end for women who read or see them: they go against the grain, thus allowing viewers to express rebellion and individuality. In this sense, too, words or images that literally depict a woman’s powerlessness may well have an empowering impact on female viewers” (Strossen 1995, 174). The existence of divergent interpretations and responses to pornographic works challenges the idea that pornography has any single, harmful impact on the background conditions of communication. And without any single, persistent impact on background understandings, it is doubtful that pornographic works would have the power to silence or subordinate women, in any or all contexts. In some contexts, Strossen suggests, pornographic works can even invite viewers to rebel against conventional notions of female vulnerability and respectability, or to explore the origins of disturbing sexual fantasies. At the very least, such materials make aspects of human sexuality available for public debate and critique (Strossen 1995, 176). Ironically, as Georgia Warnke notes, anti-censorship feminists can reasonably claim that “antipornography feminism silences women’s differing sexual self-expressions by condemning those with which it disagrees as false consciousness … [and] by promoting legislation that would suppress materials through which women can discover different views of an authentic sexuality and, indeed, different ways of being sexual” (Warnke 1999, 124).
Some feminist philosophers argue that pornography violates the moral imperative to treat people as autonomous, rational subjects. Alison Assiter invokes Hegel’s analysis of the political dynamic between a master and slave to critique pornography. She writes, “the Master-Slave dialectic seems to capture the relation between people in pornographic eroticism. In much pornography, people, usually women, become objects for another … In the case of pornography, what happens is that the one person becomes a body desired by the other, but this is not reciprocated” (Assiter 1988, 65). To treat someone as merely a body for another’s use, without recognizing that she too is a subject with desires, is to treat someone as a slave, as a subhuman creature or object, and therefore violates her dignity as a human being. Assiter explains that, for Hegel, “‘the Master-Slave dialectic’ is a phase in the development of world history — in the progression towards freedom of the ‘Spirit’ that controls historical change. In fact, the relation is disadvantageous both for the slave and for the master” (Assiter 1988, 65), for neither gains the forms of recognition necessary for self-conscious awareness and emotional fulfillment. Assiter also argues that “the role of the wife in marriage is very like that of the Slave” for the wife’s social identity is subsumed by her husband, who holds social power, and thus she is not a social subject in her own right (Assiter 1988, 65).
Harry Brod argues that pornography harms men individually even while it augments men’s collective power (Brod 1992, 158). Brod applies Kantian, Hegelian, and Marxist moral concepts and writes, “The female is primarily there as a sex object, not sexual subject. Or, if she is not completely objectified, since men do want to be desired themselves, hers is at least a subjugated subjectivity. But one needs another independent subject, not an object or a captured subjectivity, if one either wants one’s own prowess validated, or if one simply desires human interaction. Men functioning in the pornographic mode of male sexuality, in which men dominate women, are denied satisfaction of these human desires” (Brod 1992, 154). For Brod then, pornography enhances men’s political power over women, while diminishing the quality of men’s intersubjective relationships with women, and thereby contributes to the loss of positive human interaction and self-realization. Brod also argues that pornography contributes to the commodification of sexuality, which enhances men’s powers as consumers, although not necessarily their genuine autonomy and freedom.
Catharine MacKinnon appeals to Kant’s idea of persons as ends to explain the moral problem of pornography: “A person, in one Kantian view, is a free and rational agent whose existence is an end in itself, as opposed to instrumental. In pornography women exist to the end of male pleasure” (MacKinnon 1987, 158). For MacKinnon, pornography involves men treating women as mere instruments in order to satisfy their sexual desires. Such treatment, at best, fails to recognize women as free and equal persons and, at worst, dehumanizes women and encourages their victimization. In response to MacKinnon’s claims about the role of sexual objectification in women’s lives, Martha Nussbaum has asked whether sexual objectification is always morally objectionable or whether it is only so in certain contexts (Nussbaum 1999, 214). Nussbaum identifies seven distinct kinds of actions that may or may not be part of objectification in any given instance: instrumentality, denial of autonomy, inertness, fungibility, violability, ownership, and denial of subjectivity (Nussbaum 1999, 218). Some of these actions are always morally problematic, but some of them are acceptable when they are part of a larger relationship involving mutual respect. Nussbaum writes, “Denial of autonomy and denial of subjectivity are objectionable if they persist throughout an adult relationship, but as phases in a relationship characterized by mutual regard they can be all right, or even quite wonderful … In a closely related way, it may at times be splendid to treat the other person as passive, or even inert. Emotional penetration of boundaries seems potentially a very valuable part of sexual life, and some forms of physical boundary penetration also, though it is less clear which ones these are. Treating as fungible is suspect when the person so treated is from a group that has frequently been commodified and used as a tool, or a prize; between social equals these problems disappear …” (Nussbaum 1999, 238–39). In other words, some actions in which we use another’s body sexually are consistent with recognizing the person so used as an end and do not involve treating her as a mere object, in the Kantian sense. But Nussbaum concludes that most conventional pornography, such as Playboy, fails to meet the Kantian moral standard, and “depicts a thoroughgoing fungibility and commodification of sex partners and, in the process, severs sex from any deep connection with self-expression or emotion” (Nussbaum 1999, 234). Nussbaum therefore concurs with MacKinnon that Playboy treats women as mere objects or trophies that can both enhance men’s status and be exchanged for the next sex object at will.
Linda LeMoncheck argues that the sexual fantasies depicted in pornography imply that women’s subjectivities are recognized by the consumers of this material (LeMoncheck 1997, 133). The fantasy of overcoming a woman’s will assumes that she has a will to overcome (LeMoncheck 1997, 131), and the fantasy that women enjoy being sexually exploited assumes that they have desires that men’s sexual use fulfills (LeMoncheck 1997, 133). LeMoncheck writes, “sex work is not merely about treating a woman as an object nor merely about dehumanizing her. Sex work is a complex dialectic between subject and object in which a woman’s dehumanization is successful precisely because she is perceived as a person whose will, seductiveness, and power is properly subordinate to men” (LeMoncheck 1997, 134). On this view, pornographic materials and porn consumers recognize women’s agency while imagining subduing it. Women are thus recognized as subjects with ends of their own and are not depicted as mere subhuman objects. Susan Bordo similarly recognizes that women are constructed as subjects in pornography, but she argues that they are subjects whose agency expresses itself only as a desire to please the projected male viewer. She writes, “an essential ingredient in porn … is the depiction of a subjectivity (or personality) that willingly contracts its possibilities and pleasure to one — the acceptance and gratification of the male … The woman in porn abdicates her will, her sexual discrimination, her independence, but not to become a mute body for the man” (Bordo 1994, 276). For Bordo, there is a mind inside the pornographic female body, but it communicates only a limited range of nonthreatening desires, and therefore it exists as a truncated self.
Shrage contests the Kantian notion that sex is morally problematic because it involves using another as a mere instrument (except in a few special contexts). The agency of sexual actors does not have a greater potential to immorally objectify others than the agency of employers, consumers, and numerous agents who exploit the capacities of people to achieve their own ends. Shrage argues that the use of others involved in pornography is not immorally objectifying, as long as consumers and producers respect the ends of the actors and models employed. These ends include the desire to exploit for economic gain others’ sexual interest in them and their bodies within the conventional boundaries set by various genres of sexual representation and entertainment. The relationship between porn stars and consumers of their images are market relationships and should be held to the norms of those relationships, not the norms of friendships and romance (Shrage 2005). Similarly, Patricia Marino argues that respect for another’s autonomy and consent are what is crucial for avoiding immoral sexual objectification, and not whether the sexual use is mutual or whether it takes place within an ongoing adult relationship. A person avoids treating another as a mere object or instrument if he is attentive to whether his parter is giving, tacitly or overtly, ongoing consent to the type of use and the particular instance of it. Moreover, the background conditions must be such that the person who is used as a means to another’s ends can be judged to be voluntarily and genuinely consenting. When these criteria are met in a one-sided commercial or casual exchange, then the instrumental use is not immoral (Marino 2008).
Jennifer Saul explores the possible connection between objectification—treating people as things—and personification—treating things as people. Saul critiques earlier feminist claims that men’s use of pornographic images involves treating pieces of paper like women, and therefore involves conflating women with inanimate instruments (Saul 2006, 49–50). The inclusion of real women and pornography in a single category—e.g., the category of entities that can arouse and satisfy sexual desire—can undermine respect for women and promote oppressive practices. Saul argues that personification and objectification are only linked in troubling ways if some conditions for morally problematic objectification are already met. Saul draws on Rachel Maines’s historical work on the development of a device now known as the personal vibrator and contends that women’s use of vibrators to achieve sexual pleasure and orgasm represents a form of personification. For some women, vibrators eventually replaced a service that had been provided by doctors (and midwives and spas). Yet this is not a troubling form of personification—one linked to troubling forms of objectification—because doctors are not likely to be confused with sex toys as a result of women’s masturbatory use of vibrating technology. Doctors have other acknowledged medical uses, as well as ends of their own. Therefore, the transformation of their historical role in treating sexually frustrated (or “hysteric”) women, by both new understandings of women’s reproductive and sexual health and advancements in vibrator technology, does not contribute to the oppression of doctors. Saul’s discussion of the possible equation of people and things, and the background circumstances that may permit this, is useful for considering some new technological developments in pornography. New digital imaging and personal computer technologies enable users to interact and “have sex” with playmate animations on one’s computer screen. Computer-mediated interactions with digitally-simulated but fictional people can sometimes be difficult to distinguish from computer-mediated online interactions with real people. Yet such pornographic possibilities do not necessarily involve morally troubling objectification, as long as background conditions enable the recognition of women as subjects, and the recognition more generally of flesh and blood humans as autonomous agents.
MacKinnon and Dworkin’s model ordinance has met with mixed support from feminist philosophers who see pornography as promoting unacceptable forms of objectification. Nussbaum, who is sympathetic to MacKinnon and Dworkin’s analysis of pornography, offers four reservations in regard to ordinances aimed at making pornographers legally liable for the alleged harms caused by their materials. First, the justification for the ordinance fails to distinguish between moral wrongs that are legally actionable and those that are not. Second, violence against women has a variety of causes and it is difficult to isolate the distinct contribution of pornography. Third, making authors responsible for the criminal actions that their work may inspire is likely to have a chilling effect on valuable expression. And fourth, officials and courts are likely to misapply such ordinances to controversial but not harmful speech (Nussbaum 1999, 248–249). However, Nussbaum rejects simple appeals to the First Amendment to protect pornographic speech, as she notes that not all speech is protected by the First Amendment (Nussbaum 1999, 247). She also notes that makers of other vice-type products, such as tobacco, can be held liable for the damaging effects of their products, and that other Western democratic countries permit restrictions on hate speech. Nevertheless, Nussbaum suggests that the harms of pornography can be addressed through moral dialogue and cultural critique. Similarly, Langton, who is highly sympathetic to MacKinnon’s analysis of pornography, sees it as primarily a moral issue and a philosophical problem regarding what it means to live a good life (Langton 2009, 24).
A number of feminist theorists have claimed that women are consumers of pornography, and are not merely the objects on view. Some argue that pornography is about voyeurism and that women, like men, take pleasure in looking at depictions of sex. To explore women’s use of pornography, feminist scholars have studied soft-core pornographic genres that are marketed to women, such as pulp romance fiction (Radway 1991). Some have studied lesbian pornography to challenge the idea that pornography always involves men subordinating women (Ross 2000). In 1986, a group of feminists published Caught Looking: Feminism, Pornography, and Censorship, which argues that feminists have targeted pornography out of frustration with their lack of progress in reducing violence against women. The book showcases a variety of pornographic imagery in order to illustrate the types of materials that may be restricted under feminist-supported legal regulations (Duggan, Hunter, & Vance 1986) In the introduction, Kate Ellis, Barbara O’Dair and Abby Tallmer argue that “the feminist movement must not be drawn, in the name of protecting women, into the practice of censoring ‘deviant’ sexual representation or expression … Women had to learn, with the support of other women, to articulate experiences that lay outside the proper sphere of the ‘nice girl,’ to acknowledge our fantasies, and to be proud of our sexual choices … We must speak out when we are victims, but also acknowledge what excites us, and support women who make their living providing that excitement to men and to ourselves” (Ellis et al. 1986, 6). Ann Snitow advocates recentering feminist sexuality discussions on “the right to demand a sexuality more centered on female pleasure,” instead of focusing on controlling male sexuality (Snitow 1986, 11).
In Caught Looking, Lisa Duggan, Nan Hunter, and Carole Vance ask “How can feminists be entrusting the patriarchal state with the task of legally distinguishing between permissible and impermissible sexual images?” (73). They argue that the task of evaluating the material targeted by MacKinnon/Dworkin ordinances, in terms of the definitions articulated, is quite complicated and subjective. Moreover, such ordinances would surely be applied materials depicting consensual SM, and thus allow the state to persecute sexual minorities. These authors give three further reasons for opposing these laws: “first, the sexual images in question do not cause more harm than other aspects of misogynist culture; second, sexually explicit speech, even in male-dominated society, serves positive social functions for women; and third, the passage and enforcement of antipornography laws such as those supported in Minneapolis and Indiana [MacKinnon/Dworkin ordinances] are more likely to impede, rather than advance, feminist goals” (Duggan Hunter, & Vance 1986, 80–81). Moreover, Gayle Rubin argues that “The scapegoating of pornography will create new problems, new forms of legal and social abuse, and new modes of persecution. A responsible and progressive political movement has no business pursuing strategies that will result in witch-hunts” (Rubin 1993, 38).
Judith Butler examines the role of fantasy in feminist politics and argues for maintaining conditions that permit diverse representations of women. Butler writes, “feminist theory relies on the capacity to postulate through fantasy a future that is not yet” (Butler 2000, 487). According to Butler, antipornography feminists uncritically assume a representational realist ontology in which “depictions” imitate and can causally affect some preexisting reality. Butler argues for a more complex understanding of the relation between representations and their referents, focusing both on the ways that representations can call into question the ontological status of entities and on how ‘the real’ is produced through social action. Curtailing representations will produce new forms of social action rather than protect some undisturbed, preferred version of reality. In Butler’s words, “certain kinds of efforts to restrict practices of representation in the hopes of reigning in the imaginary, controlling the phantasmatic, end up reproducing and proliferating the phantasmatic in inadvertent ways, indeed, in ways that contradict the intended purposes of the restrictions itself” (Butler 2000, 490). Butler points out that efforts to censor homoerotic images have led to their greater production and exposure. She concludes that, “Feminist theory and politics cannot regulate the representation of ‘women’ without producing that very ‘representation’: and if that is in some sense a discursive inevitability of representational politics, then the task must be to safeguard the open productivity of those categories, whatever the risk” (Butler 2000, 503).
Butler’s view fits in well with feminists who call for more speech as the answer to noxious speech. On this view, disturbing representations of “real sex” should be contested by different representations of sexuality. Drucilla Cornell develops this approach by arguing that “Political action, not legal action, should be the main mode of intervention in the production of pornography” (Cornell 2000, 551). By political action, Cornell means that feminists should form alliances with feminists in the pornography industry to create representations of sexuality that will benefit women. Like Snitow, Cornell argues that feminist activism should focus “on unleashing the feminine imaginary, rather than on constraining men” (Cornell 2000, 553). Moreover, Cornell examines the film and performance work of Candida Royalle, Ona Zee, and Annie Sprinkle to show how “femme” and feminist pornography challenges the ways that conventional pornography captures women and sex. Like Butler, Cornell emphasizes the importance of fantasy for realizing transformative feminist projects. She writes “Without new images and new words in which to express our sexuality, we will be unable to create a new world for women” (Cornell 2000, 564). Furthermore, Cornell criticizes MacKinnon and Dworkin’s model ordinance for its tendency to enshrine an old stereotype of woman in the law — woman as vulnerable and in need of protection. She alleges that the ordinance approach relies on the law to enforce social norms and thus fails to struggle “beyond those symbolic forms that have been deeply inscribed in and by the structures of gender” (Cornell 2000, 554).
Whereas the rise of the pornography industry coincided with the emergence of communication technologies (1993), it is often said that prostitution is the “world’s oldest profession.” The historian Gerda Lerner elaborates this idea by explaining that “the most widespread and accepted explanation of the origin of prostitution” is that it began with temple prostitution in places such as ancient Mesopotamia (Lerner 1986, 125). Lerner analyzes “cultic sexual service” in ancient Babylon, in which temple workers and patrons offered sexual services to the gods, often as part of fertility rituals. According to Lerner, “What seems to have happened was that sexual activity for and in behalf of the god or goddesses was considered beneficial to the people and sacred. The practices varied with the gods, the different places and different periods. There was also, especially in the later period, commercial prostitution, which flourished near or within the temple” (Lerner 1986, 125). Lerner argues that scholars have conflated cultic and commercial prostitution, ignoring their distinct social purposes and organizational structures. Moreover, she argues that to understand how prostitution evolved historically, we need to understand “its relationship to the sexual regulation of all women in archaic states and its relationship to the enslavement of females” (Lerner 1986, 124). Lerner writes, “It is likely that commercial prostitution derived directly from the enslavement of women and the consolidation and formation of classes. Military conquest led, in the third millennium B.C., to the enslavement and sexual abuse of captive women. As slavery became an established institution, slave-owners rented out their female slaves as prostitutes, and some masters set up commercial brothels staffed by slaves” (Lerner 1986, 133). Lerner suggests that prostitutes and concubines were used by rulers as symbols of wealth and power, and this practice was then emulated by other men of wealth and status (Lerner 1986, 133). Paupers were often forced to sell children, adding to the supply of labor for this purpose. Furthermore, “As the sexual regulation of women of the propertied class became more firmly entrenched, the virginity of respectable daughters became a financial asset for the family. Thus, commercial prostitution came to be seen as a social necessity for meeting the sexual needs of men” (Lerner 1986, 134). These practices created social hierarchies among women, in which women were distinguished on the basis of their sexual availability. At the high end were married women and their marriage-eligible virgin daughters, in the middle were concubines, and at the low end were unmarried temple prostitutes and slave women (Lerner 1986, 137). Although female slavery, concubinage, and temple prostitution are less common today, commercial prostitution and the custom of measuring a woman’s social status in terms of her virginity and monogamy carry over to modern societies.
Lerner’s account connects modern forms of prostitution to oppressive social practices: the enslavement of women and the treatment of non-slave females as sexual property to be exchanged both in and out of marriage. By contrast, rather than attribute the rise of commercial prostitution to slavery and capitalist class formation, Gayle Rubin traces the origins of prostitution to kinship systems in which women are exchanged as gifts among families to cement social bonds (Rubin 1975, 175). Rubin writes, “If women are the gifts, then it is men who are the exchange partners. And it is the partners, not the presents, upon whom reciprocal exchange confers its quasi-mystical power of social linkage. The relations of such a system are such that women are in no position to realize the benefits of their own circulation. As long as the relations specify that men exchange women, it is men who are the beneficiaries of the product of such exchanges — social organization” (Rubin 1975, 174). In other words, in the very creation of society, women were allegedly subordinated through ritual exchange in order to create bonds of kinship among men as the foundation of the social order. Whereas Lerner’s account is influenced by Friedrich Engels’s writings about the institution of private property and its impact on sexual practices, Rubin’s account is influenced by Claude Lévi-Strauss’s writings on kinship and marriage systems. Rubin writes “The ‘exchange of women’ is a seductive and powerful concept. It is attractive in that it places the oppression of women within social systems, rather than biology. Moreover, it suggests that we look for the ultimate locus of women’s oppression within the traffic in women, rather than within the traffic in merchandise” (Rubin 1975, 175). In other words, Rubin locates the origins of female prostitution in the heterosexual family, and in systems of reproduction rather than production.
Assuming that the social subordination of women is a cultural and historical accident, rather than biological necessity, feminist historians and anthropologists have attempted to locate its cultural and historical antecedents. Both Lerner’s and Rubin’s accounts link the rise of prostitution to the subordination of women, and overlook the enslavement and prostitution of men, both in ancient and modern societies. Lerner’s account fails to explain why female slaves were sexually exploited more than male slaves. Rubin’s does not explain why women, rather than men or opposite-sex pairs, were exchanged or “trafficked” in early kinship systems (a possibility that Lévi-Strauss acknowledges), and thus it does not explain the rise of patriarchal kinship and political systems (Shrage 1994, 105, 131–32). While consumers of commercial sexual services have been predominantly male throughout history, in some contexts class, race, ethnicity, and nationality influenced whose sexual labor was bartered or sold (Kempadoo 1999). By trying to explain contemporary sex commerce in terms of the subordination of women, these accounts overlook important historical and cultural discontinuities. For example, commercial sex providers have not always been regarded as ineligible for marriage and have, in some places, been integrated into their communities to a high degree (Shrage 1994, 109, 115; White 1990, 19; Rossiaud 1988, 70).
Carol Pateman deploys the concepts of liberal political theory to explain the existence of prostitution in modern societies. She argues that the social contract, which establishes the rights and freedoms of men in a liberal political order, also establishes the terms of women’s subjection. In the patriarchal social order, there is an implicit agreement among men granting them sexual access to women (Pateman 1988, 2). Men acquire rights to particular women through formal marital and informal prostitution contracts. In other words, men have a class privilege — a right to sexual relief from women — which they can exercise by asserting their rights as husbands or johns. Like Lerner and Rubin, Pateman challenges the notion that prostitution results from men’s biologically driven behavior, and instead explains prostitution as the incorporation of a particular conception of masculinity into modern political and social structures (Pateman 1988, 198–99). In this way, modern prostitution represents the survival of some aspects of older illiberal social orders within the modern liberal state. Both traditional marriage and prostitution, for Pateman, Lerner, and Rubin, give men access to and control over the sexual capacities of women.
Regardless of its social origins, many feminists claim that contemporary sex work is harmful to women (in ways that marriage is not or has ceased to be). Some allege that the harm results from inherent features of sex work, while others allege that the harm results from contingent features of the social environment in which it is performed. Carole Pateman argues that the work of a female prostitute is different from other jobs, as it expresses the inferior social and political status of women. Moreover, because people’s bodies and sexual capacities are an integral part of their identity as men and women, the woman who works as a prostitute sells her womanhood and therefore herself (Pateman 1988, 207). Christine Overall similarly argues that prostitution is a transaction in which one person must be defined as a social subordinate who caters to the desires of another. She claims that the prostitute’s work differs from that of other low-status workers in that it is a form of labor that cannot be reciprocated (Overall 1992, 718). Elizabeth Anderson develops this idea and argues that the good of sex is “realized only when each partner reciprocates the other’s gift in kind, offering her own sexuality in the same spirit in which she received the other’s — as a genuine offering of the self. The commodification of sexual ‘services’ destroys the kind of reciprocity required to realize human sexuality as a shared good,” and may corrupt non-market sexual relationships by promoting the valuation of women in terms of their market worth (Anderson 1993, 154-55; see also Radin 1996, 133).
While Pateman, Overall, and Anderson see sexual labor as inherently degrading and oppressive, other feminist theorists argue that the harmful consequences are a result of contingent features of the work. Rather than make universal claims about the purpose of sex or our sexual capacities, Shrage argues that sex markets, like other markets, often exploit sexist ideas that relegate women to subservient roles. By tolerating their existence in this form, they perpetuate social myths about sexuality that stigmatize women (Shrage 1989, 357). Debra Satz writes that “If prostitution is wrong it is because of its effects on how men perceive women and on how women perceive themselves. In our society, prostitution represents women as the sexual servants of men” (Satz 1995, 78). Satz suggests that the negative image of women promoted by prostitution “shapes and influences the way women as a whole are seen” (Satz 1995, 79).
Martha Nussbaum questions whether the sale of sexual services genuinely damages the persons who provide them or women as a whole. Nussbaum points out that, two centuries ago, the use of one’s artistic talents for pay, such as singing or acting, was regarded as a form of prostitution (Nussbaum 1999, 277). Nussbaum acknowledges that sex workers are currently stigmatized for their profession, but questions whether the stigma that attaches to their work is justified. By tracing this stigma both to aristocratic prejudice toward waged laborers and to moralistic attitudes and anxieties regarding female sexual expression, Nussbaum challenges the rational basis of the stigma (Nussbaum 1999, 278–79, 286–88). She concludes that feminists should oppose the stigmatization of sex work, rather than oppose sex work for its contribution to the stigmatization of women. Nussbaum also questions seven common claims against prostitution: it involves excessive risks, the prostitute has little autonomy, it violates the prostitute’s bodily integrity, prostitution has a destructive effect on non-commercial intimate relationships, prostitution violates a person’s inalienable right to her sexuality, it contributes to a male-dominated social order, and it relies on the economic coercion of workers. Nussbaum argues that the problems associated with prostitution are components of many other kinds of work and social practices, and that these problems are not inherent to the work but are often a function of the prostitute’s working conditions and treatment by others (Nussbaum 1999, 288–97).
Scott Anderson resists the move to treat prostitution like other forms of work. He argues that normalizing prostitution undermines a person’s right to sexual autonomy, which is an important value defended by radical feminists. Prostitutes waive their right to sexual autonomy because their jobs place them under contractual obligations to have sex, and thus diminish their control over when and with whom they have sex. Anderson acknowledges that all jobs, to some degree, diminish various forms of autonomy. He contends that sexual autonomy should be valued differently from other forms, such as a person’s control over when and to whom they serve food, provide a massage or dance, offer expert advice, or talk philosophy. He writes, “a person’s sexuality almost always figures prominently as an aspect of his or her self-conception, status in society, and economic and social prospects...It is because sex plays such a pivotal role in the lives of most adults...that it creates its own special...realm within which one can be more or less autonomous” (Anderson 2006, 386). Anderson here echoes Pateman’s contention that our sexual capacities and practices are an integral part of who we are as men and women. For this reason, a person’s sexual autonomy should be non-alienable, because to alienate it is to destroy a person’s wholeness or integrity.
In response to Anderson, Hallie Liberto distinguishes three ways of alienating a right or good. First, one can waive a right to x (in a weak sense) by granting someone access to x with the understanding that, at any moment, permission to use x can be revoked. Second, one can waive a right to x (in a strong sense) by granting someone access to x for a duration of time, with the understanding that permission to use x cannot be revoked during this period (presumably if other terms of the lease are met). Third, one can reliquish a right to x by transfering that right, as through a sale or gift. In this case, permission to use x is granted permanently and cannot be revoked if other terms of the transfer are met. Liberto points out that those who consider the marketing of sexual services a legitimate form of work assume that the sex worker, like other workers, will only be alienating her right of control over her body and sexual labor in a weak sense (Liberto 2009, 141–43; see also Schwarzenbach 1991, p. 112). In a society in which any form of forced labor is prohibited (e.g., slavery, indentured servitude), workers are generally permitted to back out of labor contracts, although in doing so they typically relinquish all expected benefits.
Sex worker activists and advocates have long argued that they are not permanently alienating (selling) their sexual capacities, but rather are exchanging sexual labor for benefits (Schwarzenbach 1991, pp. 112–14). A sex worker’s right to sexual autonomy is not undermined if she retains the right to withdraw from her labor contracts at any time (Tuana and Shrage 2003, 33). Indeed, some argue that anti-prostitution laws undermine sexual autonomy by not allowing adults to enter mutually advantageous sexual agreements (Leigh 2004; Almodovar 2002). Peter de Marneffe argues for limiting sex worker contracts in ways similar to other forms of dangerous and potentially harmful work. Restricting and regulating prostitution would balance respect for the autonomy of service providers (and consumers of sexual services) with society’s interest in protecting its members from harm (De Marneffe 2010).
Is the exchange of sexual labor for material benefits inherently damaging to those who do this? Sex work does involve violating normal social boundaries regarding physical and emotional intimacy, but other types of work similarly involve lowering ordinary bodily and psychological barriers. A nurse taking care of a patient, a childcare worker taking care of an infant, and a ballet dancer and her partner, all engage in intimate bodily and emotional labor (Shrage 1999, 260; Nussbaum 1999). Is the intimate work of the sex worker genuinely more damaging, or only more damaging because of background beliefs regarding women and casual sex? Moreover, is receiving payment for sex the problem, or the casual and promiscuous sexual practices that are part of sex work, but also part of some non-commercial sexual practices (e.g., “hook ups,” swinging, etc.)? The latter practices also violate normal social boundaries, and expose participants to potential health, emotional, and reputational harms, but few theorists, other than religous conservatives, propose legally limiting adult sexual liberty in non-commercial contexts.
Kamala Kempadoo argues that “the global sex trade cannot be simply reduced to one monolithic explanation of violence to women” (Kempadoo 2001, 28). Kempadoo claims that older feminist models, which see prostitution as reflection of patriarchy or violence to women, are “inadequate to capture the various histories, oppression, and experiences of women of color” (Kempadoo 2001, 35, 37). Kempadoo examines how histories of racism, colonialism, militarism, and globalization structure the choices of first and third-world women of color. Although Kempadoo urges feminists to understand prostitution in terms of a broader range of social forces, she maintains that feminist theorizing about prostitution should avoid overlooking the agency of women of color by treating them as mere passive victims of oppression (Kempadoo 2001, 43). Kempadoo writes: “The agency of Brown and Black women in prostitution has been avoided or overlooked and the perspectives arising from these experiences marginalized in dominant theoretical discourse on the global sex trade and prostitution. Our insights, knowledges, and understanding of sex work have been largely obscured or dominated by white radical feminist, neo-Marxist or Western socialist feminist inspired analyses that have been either incapable or unwilling to address the complexities of the lives of women of color” (Kempadoo 2001, 40). Rather than conceptualize prostitution in terms of the sexual objectification and degradation of women, Kempadoo advocates understanding prostitution as a kind of labor that is often performed by marginalized people (Kempadoo 2001, 45; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998, 4–5; see also Leigh 1997). By conceptualizing prostitution as a form of labor and avoiding moralistic discourses about sexuality, feminists can avoid unrealistic abolitionist approaches (Kempadoo and Doezema 1998; White 1990; Shrage 1996).
Trafficking in persons, for any purpose including sex commerce, is universally condemned and rightly so. Feminists disagree about whether all forms of sex work involve forced sex and labor. Those who regard commerce in sex categorically as a form of involuntary servitude and coerced sex support laws that aim to eliminate such commerce (Jeffreys 1998; Barry 1996; Stark and Whisnant 2004). Feminists who hold that some sex work is performed voluntarily, and that the women who perform it are not victims, generally support removing most restrictions where sex commerce involves consenting adults (Shrage 1996; Nussbaum 1999; Ditmore 2005; Leigh 2004).
Peter de Marneffe distinguishes four approaches to laws governing prostitution. (1) Prohibition involves criminalizing both the sale and purchase of sexual services, along with related activities, such as soliciting and operating a brothel. (2) Abolition involves criminalizing only the purchase of sexual services, along with related activities such as curb (“kerb”) crawling and operating a brothel. (3) Regulation (legalization) involves imposing restrictions on the sale and purchase of sexual services that do not apply to other businesses, such as age and zoning restrictions, and health protections. (4) Decriminalization involves applying to the sale and purchase of sexual services the same laws and restrictions that apply to the sale and purchase of other goods and services (De Marneffe 2010, 28–30; see also Kotiswaran 2011, 16). De Marneffe defends both weak forms of abolition (in which only activities related to purchasing are criminalized but not the act of purchasing) and strong forms of regulation (which involve zoning and age restrictions, and health protections) (158–59).
Feminists who oppose all sex commerce generally support abolition, because this approach treats the provider of sexual services as a victim rather than a criminal. To prosecute women for selling sex, some argue, just compounds their victimization and oppression. Sweden is the first country to adopt this approach. Other feminists support regulation because abolition can endanger sex workers by forcing their work underground in order to protect their customers. The Netherlands and Germany have adopted this approach, which basically aims to reduce the harms of prostitution rather than eliminate it. Some feminists support decriminalization because, they argue, restricting prostitution through abolition and most forms of regulation undermines the autonomy of women who choose this work. Zoning restrictions, registration, and health laws primarily aim to protect customers and third parties, not sex workers, and contribute to the stigmatization of prostitutes as diseased and sinful (Nagle 1997; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998; Almodovar 2002; Leigh 2004). Some feminists propose regulations aimed at protecting sex workers, as well as clients and third parties, such as age restrictions, mandatory condom use rather than mandatory health exams, and licensing providers rather than brothels in order to empower workers (Shrage 1994 and 1996).
Some feminists point out that, under various legal regimes, male customers and providers typically receive lighter penalities than female providers (there are some but relatively few female customers) (Jaggar 1993, 124). In the U.S., many sexual service providers work for escort agencies, and thereby manage to get around anti-prostitution laws. Because the client pays the agency for the escort’s time, and because the provider does not take money directly from the client but is paid by the agency, sex negotiated between a professional escort and her client is not technically prostitution (any more than, say, sex between a real estate agent and her client). The brunt of prostitution laws, therefore, tends to fall on women who are often too destitute or drug-addicted to find work at an escort agency, and who often work on the streets. In this way, prostitution laws are often used to prosecute drug addicts who need medical attention, homeless women, or young women who are not savvy or old enough to work legally. Anti-prostitution laws are also used to prosecute men (e.g., pimps) who sexually and economically exploit marginal and disempowered women, but they are sometimes used to prosecute the boyfriends and co-workers of prostitutes with whom they have consensual and supportive relationships (Almodovar 1993).
Some feminist theorists view prostitution and trafficking in women as components of global, neocolonialist systems in which women from poor countries are conscripted to provide “comfort and recreation” for men, often military personnel, from rich and powerful nations. Moreover, social elites in poor countries often tolerate local sex trades in order to promote tourism and attract foreign capital (Enloe 1989, 36, 86; O’Connell Davidson 1998, 75; Bishop and Robinson 1998). The organization of labor in many industries manifests deep social inequalities and injustices, and it is far from certain that criminalizing prostitution, rather than alleviating poverty, will address the lack of economic and social opportunities many women face (Leigh 2004). Some feminists view sex workers both as likely victims of injustice and violence and as agents who negotiate and make choices among difficult and limited options. These theorists tend to support regulations aimed both at reducing violence against women and at empowering them (Kotiswaran 2011, 31; Rajan 2003; Kempadoo and Doezema 1998; Shrage 1994).
Laura Agustín cautions feminists not to conflate voluntary (though illegal) migrants who are seeking more lucrative forms of sex work with trafficked women (Agustín 2007). Though poor, third-world women are often exploited by traffickers, some may be choosing to migrate and work in sex businesses over other occupations available to them (factory or domestic work) both in their home and target countries. Harsh laws against trafficking often exacerbate the plight of voluntary migrant sex workers who may be undocumented and working illegally. Anti-trafficking and anti-prostitution efforts should focus on eliminating forced work and migration, child labor, exploitative working conditions, and hostile legal environments for migrants and sex workers (Kotiswaran 2011, 47-8).
Recently, a judge in Ontario, Canada ruled that the country’s anti-prostitution laws unconstitutionally violate the security rights of prostitutes by increasing their vulnerability to violent crimes (Other Internet Resources #7). Criminalization of sex commerce can create dangerously hostile work environments that allow sexual predators to victimize prostitutes with relative impunity. Over the past few decades, a few countries have moved toward toleration, accompanied by regulation, of the work activities of prostitutes, while the larger trend has been toward criminalization, often with increased penalties imposed on the clients of prostitutes (Other Internet Resources #8). Feminist analyses of prostitution have been deployed to justify abolitionist legal regimes. In response to the efforts of feminists and conservatives to stamp out their livelihoods, an international sex workers’ rights movement has mobilized to advocate for decriminalizating consensual adult sex work and the public business practices such work encompasses. The recent ruling in Canada reflects the extensive and sophisticated political strategizing of prostitutes’ civil rights groups (Other Internet Resources #1). Sex worker activists, many of whom identify as feminists, have challenged scholarly research about their lives and work, and have offered alternative accounts (Almodovar 1993; Pendleton 1997; Highleyman 1997; Queen 1997; Sprinkle 1998; Quan 2001; Bernstein 2000; Leigh 2004). Sex worker organizations are forming alliances with feminist and queer activists, and labor unions to advance their political goals.
The feminist anti-pornography movement of the 1970s and 1980s has evolved into the feminist anti-trafficking movement of the 1990s and twenty-first century. Both movements treat sex commerce as a monolithic practice that involves violence against women. Toleration for sex trades, according to feminists in these movements, perpetuates the social subordination and oppression of women. Like the anti-pornography movement in the 1980s, the anti-trafficking movement is finding common political ground with conservatives who object, on religious grounds, to non-marital sex, and, more recently, with anti-immigration political conservatives.
In her theoretically nuanced and fair-minded overview of both radical feminist opposition to prostitution and liberal feminist advocacy of sex worker rights, Prabha Kotiswaran carves out a “middle ground” feminist position. Middle ground feminism pays attention to the empirical realities of various sex trades and the efforts and proposals of sex worker organizations to protect the civil and economic rights of their members. Middle ground feminists are aware of how the sex industry is gendered and, at times, critically and respectfully engage with the proposals of sex worker advocates. For example, middle ground feminists may be skeptical of the alleged needs of men that the sex industry aims to serve, while recognizing that sex workers are not passive dupes but agents who exploit less than ideal background conditions. Middle ground feminists do not treat sex commerce as monolithic, but pay attention to the different ways that labor and capital are organized in different trades. They recognize that much of sex work, like other low status service work, is menial and sometimes unpleasant, but it is not work that is inherently degrading or violent to those who perform it. Middle ground feminists recognize that sex work is continuous with much of the caregiving work women perform, as wives, mothers, nurses, teachers, nannies, and domestics, and do not single out the sex industry for assigning to women a disproportionate share of caregiving work in society. In this way, middle ground feminist do not treat sex work as exceptional in terms of its risks, difficulty, and larger societal effects. Middle ground feminists are less likely to make common cause with anti-feminist sexual moralists and anti-immigrant conservatives, and more likely to find common cause with unions of sex workers that are grappling with the practical trade-offs among different policies (e.g., brothel work provides more personal security, but less control over working conditions and compensation than independent contract work) (Kotiswaran 2011).
Over the past several decades, sexual and gender dissidents have achieved greater recognition and rights (e.g., lesbians, gay men, and transgendered persons), and women’s claims for economic and political justice are being heard. Yet, sex workers, many of whom are persons who have been socially marginalized because of their class, nationality, race, sex, sexual orientation, or gender expression, have not achieved significant recognition for their issues and place in society. Feminists should reconsider their role in advancing or obstructing the agendas of sex worker unions, and how their work on behalf of the many victims of sexual violence can be continued without perpetuating the marginalization of sex performers and providers.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Indiana Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Papers on Sex Work and Prostitution, at PhilPapers.org
- Prostitutes’ Education Network
- Global Network of Sex Work Projects
- Coalition Against Trafficking in Women
- The Men’s Bibliography
- The New Prostitution Wars, website by Robert K. Fullinwider
- Prostitution, webpage for the Philosophy Talk episode on prostitution.
- Historical Timeline
- 100 Countries and Their Prostitution Policies
- Sex Workers Outreach Project
- The House Would Legalise Prostitution, The International Debate Education Association.
The author thanks the Center for Human Values at Princeton University for providing support while this entry was being updated and revised.