Supplement to Modal Fictionalism

Modal Fictionalism and Possible Worlds Semantics

John Divers in (Divers 1995) argues that “Modal fictionalism cannot deliver possible worlds semantics” for modal logics. Since Kripke, it has become standard to do the formal semantics for languages with modal operators (like necessity and possibility operators) by providing models of worlds and of objects in those worlds, and counting modal statements as true according to the relevant models if the worlds in those models meet certain conditions (e.g. where p is an atomic claim, “necessarily p” is true at a world w in the model just in case all of the possible worlds “accessible” from w are worlds at which p holds). On one construal of what benefits this sort of semantics offers, modal fictionalism arguably cannot do as well as its realist rivals.

The first thing that must be done is to be clear on what is meant by “possible worlds semantics”. There is a common useage of that expression in which providing such a “semantics” for e.g. a language containing modal operators is a matter of providing certain sorts of semantic models for it. Formal specifications of these models can provide the basis for exploring the formal features of the system (such as whether it is decidable, or whether the consequence relation for the system is compact). Another benefit is that by specifying models with respect to which the axioms and rules of the system are demonstrably complete, we provide a mechanism for producing counter-examples (counter-models), as well as another method, besides e.g. an axiomatic proof procedure, for seeing what conclusions we might be able to draw from a given premise set. The capacity for constructing counter-examples is very important, since we are often as interested in which arguments turn out to be invalid as in which arguments are valid. Historically, providing “world” models for modal logic was also useful for bringing out dimensions of variation among modal logics: by putting various constraints on the accessibility relation, the behaviour of the necessity and possibility operators could be varied in ways it was hard to imagine before possessing the device of models.

However, none of these benefits require possible worlds per se, even for so-called “possible worlds semantics” in this sense (see Lewis 1986, pp. 17-20). The formal semantics officially consists of constructing models using sets of various kinds and functions from those sets to propositions or sentences (or other objects representing propositions or sentences: other sets do nicely). Certain objects in these models are often called “worlds”, but this is just a convenient label: the blander word “indices” is sometimes recommended by logicians wanting to avoid the appearance of trucking with metaphysics. Interpreting a formal language with modal operators as having its truth conditions given by which indices stand in which relations need not bring possible worlds in the full-blown sense into the picture at all, any more than the models of modal logics that define truth in terms of geometrical features of cylinders commits users of these logics to the belief that there are special modal cylinders out there, about which we constantly talk when we talk of what has to be or what might have been.

Divers intends much more by a “possible worlds semantics” than merely providing a class of models for a set of axioms and rules of inference in the way mentioned above: he agrees that one can “interpret a modal language extensionally by invoking a model-theoretic approach in which the indices (‘worlds’) have (intuitively) no modal reference” (Divers 1995, p. 81), and so would agree that he has more in mind than this limited formal task. However, the sense in which providing a “possible worlds semantics” comes to no more than providing traditional Kripke-syle models using indices which are adequate for the job described above does seem to be what most logicians mean by the expression, and I suspect it is what many philosophers of modality mean as well. If so, then Divers's charge is misleadingly stated, since he expects much more from a possible worlds semantics. With this important caveat in mind, let us look at what Divers thinks modal fictionalism cannot deliver and modal realism can.

For Divers, “A possible worlds semantics is a semantic theory which has two components: (i) an interpretation which translates some range of ordinary modal sentences into a medium involving quantification over worlds, and (ii) a theory of validity (typically model-theoretic) that determines formally whether or not arguments formulated in the interpreting medium are valid.” (Divers 1995 p. 80) He thinks this “translation” is literally translation, and not just an interpretation for model-theoretic purposes: for the connection between modal sentences and sentences quantifying over possible worlds is meant to be an analytic one (p. 80). The other important feature Divers thinks that “possible worlds semantics” has is that the claims about possible worlds are extensional claims, which allows the validity of inferences involving them to be determined by the usual methods of “the fully extensional predicate calculus” (p. 81).

Divers is of course allowed to stipulate how he will use his terms as he likes, but insofar as this is intended as an explication of what a possible worlds semantics (in some sense richer than the minimal logican's sense) should be, a point of controversy may be noted. Realists who think that quantification over possible worlds gives insight into the nature of modal truth need not think that such quantificational claims are analytically connected with modal claims. They may instead think that possible worlds provide the best theoretical explanation of the truth of modal claims, or are what make those claims true in a way that is to be discovered by synthetic methods. Indeed, in light of the fact that some prima facie competent deployers of modal vocabulary (including thoughtful philosophers) do not accept the truth of the possible-worlds “translations” of modal claims that they do accept, we should be reluctant to think that the former are obvious analytic consequences of, let alone synonymous with, the modal claims. Divers cites Graeme Forbes's arguments in Forbes 1985 that we should assume that modal claims and the associated possible worlds claims are synonymous if we are to explain the behaviour of our modal claims by appeal to the possible worlds claims: this is however one side of a controversy between groups that both take themselves to be employing “possible worlds semantics”, and employing worlds in these semantics, rather than merely employing indicies in formal models of modal languages.

As for the second part of Divers's definition, it is not entirely unambiguous what it is for a claim to be “extensional”: there are many ways of drawing the extensional/intensional divide. Divers does not say exactly what he means, but he seems to be using the word in the common sense in which a sentence is extensional if co-referring (or more generally, co-designating) expressions can be substituted salva veritate. Sentences consisting of an “According to PW …” operator followed by a sub-sentence are thus not extensional, since substituting another sub-sentence (materially) equivalent in truth-value does not always preserve truth. In Divers's example, “There is a world in which there are red dragons” and “1 = 0” will be judged by the fictionalist to have the same truth value, but the expressions “According to PW, there is a world in which there are red dragons” and “According to PW, 1 = 0” will not have the same truth-values (Divers 1985, p. 85). There is another sense in which a claim might be said to be extensional: it is extensional if it does not depend for its truth-value at a world on the truth-value of claims in any other possible world. In this sense, of course, the fictionalist's “According to PW …” sentences are still not extensional, but neither are the realist's possible worlds “translations” of everyday modal locutions, and possible-worlds “translations” of modal locutions should not in general be thought to be extensional. (One might be tempted more by this view if, for example, one thought that extensionality or intensionality were preserved under meaning equivalence, and accepted that the relevant equivalences were equivalences of meaning, as Divers takes the realist to). There is nothing wrong with Divers's useage, but the ambiguity is possibly confusing. This will become relevant when the question of what advantage extensionality would bring is discussed below.

But let us agree that a “possible worlds semantics” for current purposes has the features Divers ascribes to it. At this point many, realists and fictionalists alike, will already reject the project of attaining a “possible worlds semantics” in Divers's sense (though many would be concerned if they could not have a possible worlds semantics for their favourite formal modal systems, in the more minimal sense). However, let us also grant for the sake of discussion that a possible worlds semantics is desirable, and it would count against a theory if it did not furnish us with one. The next thing that is worth noting is that some possible modal fictionalist theories will straightforwardly provide us with such a semantics. Broad modal fictionalists (see main text) take both the talk committed to possible worlds and many modal claims (claims of necessity, and claims about the possible truth of actual falsehoods, etc.) to be true only according to a certain fiction. It is open to such modal fictionalists to accept straightforwardly that the modal sentences were analytically equivalent to their paraphrases in terms of possible worlds. The predicate calculus could then be used to determine validity for modal inferences, and they could have a “possible worlds semantics” for modal claims in as rich a sense as Divers could wish. Divers does not consider this option for modal fictionalists, though his paper is presented as a discussion of Rosen 1990, and Rosen does not mention broad modal fictionalists. Rather, Rosen only considers modal fictionalists who take the modal claims to be equivalent in truth-value to claims about possible worlds prefixed with “according to PW …” operators. The broad modal fictionalists I have been considering take the equivalence to be between modal claims and unprefixed claims about possible worlds, and so arguably fall outside the scope of Divers's discussion. They are worth mentioning even so, since Divers quickly moves from talking about Rosen's particular presentation to a discussion of “modal fictionalism” in general.

Let us then concentrate on the remaining views which come under Divers's attack: those views which take modal statements to be equivalent in truth-value to prefixed claims about possible worlds i.e., claims of the form “According to PW …”. Do these views have to eschew “possible worlds semantics”, in Divers's sense? Divers claims that they do, since the analysis in terms of talk about possible worlds provided for modal statements is an analysis in terms of an intensional context, the “according to PW …” operator, into which propositions with the same truth-value cannot be substituted salva veritate. For those modal fictionalists who do offer this as an analysis, Divers is right that their analysis is not an extensional one. What is not clear is that such fictionalists cannot nevertheless have the advantages associated with extensional semantic treatments of modal language.

Divers says “the distinctive attraction of possible worlds semantic theories is that they combine the virtues of analyticity and extensionality in the treatment of modal languages”. Analyticity is presumably held to be a virtue because it is analyticity that provides possible worlds semantic theories “their claim to be the right and genuinely explanatory theories of the semantic features of modal languages”, and this is backed in part by an appeal to the arguments of Forbes 1985. Extensionality, the stumbling block for fictionalists according to Divers, is apparently advantageous because (or mainly because) it allows us to determine the validity of “ordinary modal arguments” by “assessing their validity by application of the methods of the fully extensional predicate calculus” (p. 85). Divers also indicates that this advantage is a matter of it being correct according to the theory that “the validity of intuitively valid modal arguments can be demonstrated by first-order methods” (p. 86); he points out, rightly, that merely having this true according to the fiction would not be the same as being able to literally claim it. Divers stresses that it is the combination of these two advantages that is the distinctive benefit fictionalists must forgo (p. 85).

While the modal fictionalists we are now considering do not take ordinary language modal claims to have extensional translations in the language of possible worlds, they may still have a claim to the combined virtue with which Divers is concerned in another, albeit slightly more indirect, way. If they do, then Divers has failed to make his case, since he maintains not only that there is a feature that realist theories have (or perhaps better, can have) that modal fictionalist positions do not (or cannot), but also that the relevant feature is, prima facie at least, an advantage. So how may modal fictionalists who take the equivalence in meaning to be one between modal claims and “According to PW …” claims also take advantage of first-order methods to determine validity for arguments couched in the form of admittedly intensional statements beginning “According to PW …”?

The most obvious way for a modal fictionalist to attempt to secure this advantage is to insist both that the relevant fictionalist biconditionals are analytic, and that PW is closed under first-order consequence: so that when s follows from r, if “According to PW, r” is true then “According to PW, s” is true, and for any propositions p1, p2pn, when “According to PW, p1”, “According to PW, p2” … “According to PW, pn” are all true, then “According to PW, p1, p2, p3, … , and pn” will be true too. Then when one has a collection of premises all suitably prefixed, one will be able to determine whether a conclusion prefixed with “According to PW …” follows from the premises plus general truths about the modal fiction (such as its closure under first-order consequence) by first-order methods, by seeing whether the proposition embedded in the conclusion follows from the propositions embedded in the premises. This might not quite capture all of the conclusions derivable (conclusions which follow simply from general claims about the fiction will follow in such cases regardless of the specific prefixed premises, for example), but in the ordinary cases when a realist would appeal to the putative analytic equivalences to test the modal arguments for validity, the fictionalist will be able to have recourse to this procedure, which reduces the problem to that of checking statements to see if one is a first-order consequence of the others. The fictionalist's justification for this will ex hypothesi be an appeal to the analytic interderivability of claims about what is true according to the fiction and modal claims, and so this first-order procedure is available and justifiable in virtue of the analytic connection between the modal claims and the claims involving quantification over possible worlds (albeit that those claims quantify over possible worlds in the scope of “According to PW” operators). True, this advantage will not be because of any extensional features of the “According to PW …” claims, and so Divers is right in one sense to say that this method is not “extensional”. Since the fictionalist who combines analyticity of the relevant equivalences with the above method for securing the use of a first-order decision procedure for validity can have exactly the same advantage that Divers claims for the combination of “the virtues of analyticity and extensionality”, Divers's case that there is some advantage that realists can claim over fictionalists does not seem to have been made out.

In a later paper (Divers 1999b) Divers sets out to prove a “safety result” which would guarantee the use of extensional reasoning in the scope of an “according to PW” operator for a modal fictionalist. Divers 1999b can thus be seen as a response to Divers's own 1995 challenge, showing how the fictionalist can secure the advantage which Divers 1995 suggests is not available to the modal fictionalist. Not all modal fictionalists would be happy with the resources Divers employs to achieve his result. In particular, Divers employs a primitive necessity operator (p 334), and so his proof as it stands would not be available to an advocate of strong modal fictionalism. (Divers himself notes that the strategy is unavailable to those modal fictionalists who seek a reduction of the modal operators). Fictionalists not concerned to analyse modality, however, may find in Divers 1999b a sufficient answer to Divers 1995.

So to summarise: Divers's claim that “modal fictionalism cannot deliver possible worlds semantics” need not worry modal fictionalists. In the first place, the sense of “possible worlds semantics” Divers employs is not the sense in which many practitioners working with modal logic or the language of possible worlds are most concerned with. Secondly, even given Divers's richer concept of “possible worlds semantics”, a conception rich enough that many realists about possible worlds would also not wish to suppose that they should have such a semantics, some modal fictionalists can have such a semantics in exactly Divers's sense (the broad modal fictionalists). Finally, for the remaining modal fictionalists prepared to postulate the appropriate analytic connections, it is possible, at least for all Divers has said, that one might have a semantic treatment of modal claims which treated them as analytically equivalent to claims in the language of possible worlds (albeit prefixed ones) and has the virtue of being able to employ first-order methods to determine the validity of many arguments employing premises and conclusions prefixed with “According to PW …” operators, and so achieve the same advantage Divers claims for analytic, extensional translations. If this is so, then even if there is a sense in which these fictionalists do not have a “possible worlds semantics”, they have something just as good, as far as the advantages Divers is concerned with go. Divers 1995 does however provide a challenge for modal fictionalists: if they do want “possible worlds semantics” in Divers's rich sense, they need to provide the details of how it is that they are entitled to the corresponding advantages: perhaps through some analytic equivalence of the sort explored in this note, or perhaps through a system like that of Divers 1999b, or perhaps by some other strategy. (Note that strong modal fictionalists who take their theory to not be descriptive of current usage are unlikely to be tempted by the claim of analytic equivalence and will have to demur from Divers's timid fictionalist proposal, so they at least face an open question if they want the equivalent of a “possible worlds semantics” in Divers's rich sense).

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Copyright © 2011 by
Daniel Nolan <daniel.nolan@anu.edu.au>

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