Forgiveness has over the past forty or so years engendered the interest of scholars and practitioners in such disparate fields as psychology, law, politics, international affairs, sociology, and philosophy. This article is concerned with what philosophers have had to say about forgiveness within secular ethical frameworks and, to a lesser extent, the Christian religious tradition.
Generally regarded as a positive response to human wrongdoing, forgiveness is a conceptually, psychologically, and morally complex phenomenon. There is disagreement over the meaning of forgiveness, its relation to apparent cognates, the psychological, behavioral, conceptual, and normative dimensions of forgiveness, and when and under what conditions forgiveness is morally permissible, required, or wrong. Moreover, the many legal and political analogues to forgiveness raise questions about what human behaviors may be properly described as forgiveness. These and related issues are discussed in the following sections of this article.
- 1. The Standard Definition of Forgiveness
- 2. The Ends of Forgiveness
- 3. Common Cognates of Forgiveness
- 4. Forgiveness as a Process of Overcoming Anger
- 5. Other Types of Forgiveness
- 6. Forgiveness and Justice
- 7. Forgiveness and God
- 8. Concluding Remarks
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
From the ancient Greeks through the Hebrew and Christian Bibles to the present day, forgiveness has typically been regarded as a personal response to having been injured or wronged, or as a condition one seeks or hopes is bestowed upon one for having wronged someone else. The Oxford English Dictionary defines ‘forgivable,’ the first entry under the general term ‘forgive,’ as that which “may be forgiven, pardonable, excusable,” referring thereby to the quality of deserving to be forgiven. This sense is illustrated in Jesus' appeal “God forgive them, for they know not what they do” (Luke 23:34), which suggests that ignorance is sometimes a condition that negates or tempers culpability, rendering wrongdoers forgivable. Notwithstanding the association with excusing conditions, forgiving is not, strictly speaking, equivalent to excusing. For wrongdoing that is excused entirely there is nothing to forgive, since wrongs that are fully excused are not blameworthy or culpable. And although excuses that mitigate, rather than negate, culpability, may serve as a rationale for forgiveness, they are not the same as forgiveness. Moreover, the application of the concept of forgiveness to nonmoral behavior, as in the case of a forgivably poor musical performance by a pianist, shows that forgiveness is not always or necessarily a moral term.
The term ‘forgive’ derives from ‘give’ or to ‘grant’, as in ‘to give up,’ or ‘cease to harbor (resentment, wrath).’ More specifically, ‘forgive’ refers to the act of giving up a feeling, such as resentment, or a claim to requital or compensation. And the term ‘forgiveness’ is defined as the action of forgiving, pardoning of a fault, remission of a debt, and similar responses to injury, wrongdoing, or obligation. In this sense of the term, forgiveness is a dyadic relation involving a wrongdoer and a wronged party, and is thought to be a way in which victims of wrong alter their and a wrongdoer's status by, for instance, acknowledging yet moving past a transgression. Though a dyadic relation, this general conception is not an account of forgiveness between two persons only, since it allows for forgiveness between individuals and groups, such as the forgiving of an individual's debt by a financial institution, or the commutation of a prison sentence by an act of official pardon. And forgiveness may occur between groups of people, as evidenced by intra-national restorative justice efforts and government commissions established to effect truth and reconciliation between perpetrators and victims of historical wrongs.
The standard definition of forgiveness makes clear that its main purpose is the re-establishment or resumption of a relationship ruptured by wrongdoing. The notion that forgiveness is teleological is also a central element of forgiveness both in contemporary philosophical accounts, which frequently stress the moral and nonmoral purposes to be achieved by it, and within the Christian religious tradition, which links forgiveness to human redemption by God (Hobbes, 1969; Wolterstorff, 2009). In keeping with the standard definition, many contemporary philosophers argue that the resumption of relationships disrupted by wrongdoing often requires a moral reassessment of the wrongdoer by the victim, and that, following Butler (1846) such a reassessment involves relinquishing resentment or some other form of morally inflected anger (French, 1982; Murphy, 1988, 2001), or behavior such as seeking revenge (Griswold, 2007; Zaibert, 2011). This does not entail that forgiveness is a literal return to the state of affairs anterior to the transgression for which it is a response. Yet it also does not mean that forgiveness is merely a metaphorical return to a pre-transgression state of affairs between wrongdoer and victim. Rather, in granting forgiveness, a victim of wrong re-orients a relationship that has been disrupted or compromised by wrongdoing. This theme is an integral part of forgiveness common both to western philosophical and theological traditions, and is often envisioned as part of a more elaborate interaction in which people seek to atone for wrongs and secure forgiveness in the name of interpersonal reconciliation or in the pursuit of the ultimate human benefit, divine salvation (Moser, 2009).
Maintaining or perpetuating personal relationships is one of the clearest and most important ends of forgiveness, though not the only important one. Forgiving those who wrong us often helps us move beyond strong negative emotions which, if allowed to fester, could harm us psychologically and physically. Forgiveness benefits wrongdoers, as well, by releasing them from the blame and hard feelings often directed toward them by those they wrong, or helping them transcend the guilt or remorse they suffer from having done wrong, thereby allowing them to move forward in their lives. These ends of forgiveness may be regarded as in general enabling in the sense that they show how forgiveness sometimes helps people move beyond the wrongs they endure or cause and the sometimes debilitating effects those wrongs have on wrongdoers and victims alike. For some, forgiveness has these forward-looking benefits because of the way it transfigures the past. Emmanuel Levinas claims that “Forgiveness acts upon the past, somehow repeats the event, purifying it,” a notion similar to Hannah Arendt's view that forgiveness alters the ethical significance of a wrongdoer's past by keeping it from having a permanent or fixed character (Guenther, 2006).
However, forgiveness may also go awry, deliberately or inadvertently serving more dubious ends, as when a victim of domestic violence routinely but without good reason forgives her abuser, thereby fueling increasingly violent cycles of abuse. Moreover, perpetrators of such wrongs often feign apology and repentance, thereby fraudulently securing forgiveness from the victim. In these ways, forgiveness may become complicit in or collude with wrongdoing, converting what is generally regarded as a good or virtuous reaction to wrongdoing into its opposite. These considerations raise the general question of the relation between forgiveness and desert. It may be thought, for example, that for behavior typical of forgiveness to qualify, conceptually, as forgiveness, it must be grounded in morally legitimate considerations, including whether the wrongdoer deserves to be forgiven (Murphy, 2001). Deserving to be forgiven may hinge, in turn, on whether the wrongful deed was partly excusable (a complete excuse or justification would leave nothing to be forgiven) or whether the wrongdoer displays guilt or remorse (Murphy and Hampton, 1988). On the other hand, it might be argued that forgiveness cannot be justified by definitional fiat, and that experience seems to warrant the view that not all forgiveness is justified, and that one way in which forgiveness may be inappropriate is if it is tendered to the undeserving, if, that is, forgiveness is a matter of justice or desert at all.
A disposition to too readily forgive may also be symptomatic of a lack of self-respect, or indicative of servility, ordinarily viewed as moral infirmities or vices (Novitz, 1998). This recalls Aristotle's idea that the person deficient in appropriate anger is “unlikely to defend himself” and “endure being insulted” and is for this reason a “fool” (Nicomachean Ethics, 1126a5), Kant's notion that a person who fails to become angry at injustices done to him lacks dignity and self-respect (Kant, 2001), and Hume's assertion that since anger and hatred are “inherent in our very frame and constitution” the lack of such feelings is sometimes evidence of “weakness and imbecility” (Hume, 1958, p.605). That interpersonal forgiveness does not always serve morally laudable aims suggests that a general account of the criteria for justified and morally permissible or even obligatory forgiveness is needed to distinguish appropriate from inappropriate forgiving.
Neither the standard definition of forgiveness nor the many philosophical accounts of it attempt to carefully distinguish between forgiveness and the various cognates often associated with it, such as pardoning, excusing, and tolerating or otherwise endorsing wrongs. Forgiveness is sometimes thought to consist, in part, in some of these behaviors and is also sometimes thought to be synonymous with acquittal, absolution, mercy, forbearance, and reconciliation, among others. Forgetting, too, is sometimes associated with forgiveness, as the common suggestion to “forgive and forget” connotes, though the adage also suggests that these notions are distinct, that forgiveness may occur without forgetting and vice versa. Most philosophical conceptions insist that whatever else it involves merely forgetting wrongs is not equivalent to forgiveness (Murphy, 1988: Griswold, 2007).
Used loosely, then, forgiveness is roughly equivalent to the aforementioned behaviors and traits. Although it is generally agreed that forgiveness is at best similar in meaning to any of these, the precise lines of demarcation distinguishing forgiveness from these cognates are not always easy to determine, nor are they uncontested in the literature. For example, Seneca claims that tailoring punishment to the unique circumstances of individual cases of wrongdoing is not a matter of forgiveness but of mercy, in so doing equating forgiveness with pardon, and condemning both as inappropriate ways of straying from the strict demands of justice (Seneca, 1998). Others maintain that forgiveness and reconciliation are equivalent notions, each having the common goal of moving people's lives forward by restoring a past relationship compromised by wrongdoing (Dwyer, 1999). And official acts of legal pardon are strikingly similar to such straightforward acts of forgiving as remitting a debtor's financial obligation by simply waiving it. Moreover, though forgiveness may be a vehicle of mercy, and both are often viewed as in tension with justice, forgiveness is not the same as mercy, the latter of which may be exemplified in various ways including via pardon, generosity, or sympathy. A complete taxonomy and analysis of colloquial cognates of forgiveness and forms of tolerating wrongdoing that have affinities to forgiving but are morally dubious is beyond the scope of this article, though as examples of the intricacies involved in sorting through phenomena related to but different from forgiveness brief discussions of pardon and condonation may be instructive.
The phrase “pardon me” frequently functions as an apology, which might precede an act of forgiveness, or be a plea or request for forgiveness, or some similar act of forbearance. And to pardon a wrongdoer often seems indistinguishable from forgiveness, perhaps especially in cases of minor wrong. With regard to such wrongs, having been pardoned often takes the form of such performative utterances as “don't give it a second thought,” “don't worry about it,” or “I forgive you,” where the speech act itself does the normative work involved in forgiving or pardoning (Pettigrove, 2004). In this sense, pardon and forgiveness are synonymous. However, the concept of pardon also refers to a familiar and important legal and political power quite unlike forgiveness. Black's Law Dictionary defines this sense of pardon as “an act or an instance of officially nullifying punishment or other legal consequences of a crime,” ordinarily “granted by the chief executive of a government” (Garner, 1999, p.1137). In the United States, for example, the President has the authority to grant pardons for federal offenses, and state governors may pardon crimes against the state.
Although reasons for exercising the power of pardon often mimic those given for forgiving wrongdoers, as when President Ford pardoned Richard Nixon in 1974 on the ground that the country needed to move beyond an ugly and disruptive criminal transgression, one clear difference between pardon and forgiving is that the former is necessarily exercised by third-parties as opposed to the victims of wrong. As discussed below, standard philosophical views maintain that there are good reasons for thinking that, with one important exception, third-party forgiveness is impossible, inasmuch as forgiveness is the prerogative or right of the victim of wrong. Another difference is that a central idea in the legal and political concept of pardon is that of an offer that must be accepted in order to accomplish its partial or complete end, such as mitigation of a criminal punishment via commutation of a prison sentence (Bingham, 2009). Although on some views forgiveness is also an offer, especially where reconciliation between a victim and wrongdoer is attempted (Tombs, 2006), the main sense of forgiveness seems not to involve the idea of an offer at all, let alone an offer that must be accepted by the wrongdoer in order for forgiveness to occur and accomplish at least some of its ends, for example to discharge one's duty to forgive others as commanded by God, or to move beyond a potentially paralyzing negative emotion. Moreover, legal or political pardons by their nature reduce or even eliminate punishment, whereas forgiveness need not affect punishment in any way. Forgiveness also admits of an entirely self-referential variety (i.e. self-forgiveness), whereas official acts of self-pardoning are at best controversial, and possibly without legal or political justification. These considerations thus suggest that despite some similarities, pardon and forgiveness are significantly different notions.
Forgiveness is also closely related to yet importantly distinct from such morally questionable behavior as colluding in evil by condoning or otherwise tolerating it (Kolnai, 1973). Because condoning and other forms of tolerating wrongdoing may involve transcending negative emotions caused by having been wronged, making exceptions to moral rules, or re-accepting a wrongdoer in the wake of a relationship compromising wrong, condonation may to this extent resemble the standard conception of forgiveness. Moreover, in its definition of condonation the OED asserts that to condone is to “forgive or overlook (an offense) so as to treat it as nonexistent.” It is tempting to gloss this as a kind of forgiveness in which the wrong done is excused, for no good reason, by the person condoning it. But this would be to ignore the central idea that condoning wrongdoing is a form of accepting or endorsing it, which seems not to be an element of forgiveness. This is made clear in Webster's Third New International Dictionary (1986) definition of condonation as “pardon of an offense; voluntary overlooking or implied forgiveness of an offense by treating the offender as if it had not been committed.” The phrase “as if it had not been committed” suggests that a condoner willfully turns a blind eye to that which he knows or at least believes is wrong. To overlook a wrong as if it does not exist is a form of tolerating it, which is clearly not the same as recognizing that it is excused. Moreover, Leo Zaibert (2009A, 2012) has argued that forgiveness is the deliberate refusal to punish (for a contrary view see Warmke, 2011, 2013) and that it may be silent, not communicated in any way to the wrongdoer, and that (by implication) neither of these constitutes acquiescing in or condoning wrongdoing. Thus, condoning wrongdoing is not the same as forgiving it.
Since Bishop Butler's well known sermons on resentment and forgiveness (Butler, 1846), forgiveness has been regarded by many philosophers as a process of overcoming resentment, a uniquely personal form of anger occasioned by having been injured or wronged (French, 1982; McGary, 1989). What is uniquely personal about resentment is that it seems to be an exclusively self-regarding form of anger, aroused on behalf of or in defense of the self, whereas other forms of anger, such as indignation or scorn, may be aroused on behalf of oneself or for the sake of others (Hughes, 2001). In his taxonomy of anger, Butler distinguishes “hasty and sudden” anger, a kind of instinctive anger linked to self-preservation, from “settled and deliberate” anger, which is anger partly constituted by beliefs or other cognitions about how we are perceived and treated by others (Butler, 1846). Butler's notion of resentment is thus what Strawson (1974) referred to as a “reactive attitude,” or personal feelings that depend upon or involve our beliefs about the intentions, attitudes, and actions of others towards us. Resentment is a paradigmatic reactive attitude inasmuch as it involves taking offense, umbrage, or exception to the deeds and intentions of others, which in turn typically presuppose such moral judgments about other people as that they are moral agents who are responsible for their behavior. In his refinement of Butler's view, Jeffrie Murphy defines forgiveness as “the principled overcoming of feelings of resentment that are naturally (and perhaps properly) directed toward a person who has done one a moral injury” (Murphy, 2001). Note that this definition goes beyond Butler's in requiring that the resentment transcended in forgiveness be overcome for a moral reason, and that the behavior which occasions it be understood as the action of a moral agent who may be held accountable for what he does. Murphy's emphasis on the principled overcoming of resentment helps distinguish forgiveness proper from other modes of transcending resentment, such as its dissipating as a consequence of forgetting the wrong that caused it; or silencing it by an act of will in order to maintain a relationship with a wrongdoer. Murphy and others who agree with Butler's general conception have also suggested that forgiveness may involve overcoming other “retributive emotions” like indignation, contempt, or hatred (Murphy and Hampton, 1988). Some recent accounts of interpersonal forgiveness deny that Butler's view involves overcoming resentment simplicitur and that, instead, it requires forswearing a particular type of resentment (Garcia, 2011) or a form of vengeful anger linked to a desire for revenge (Konstan, 2010; Griswold, 2011). Other philosophers have argued that forgiveness includes overcoming all negative feelings caused by and directed towards a perceived wrongdoer, including feelings of disappointment and sadness (Richards, 1988; Narayan, 1997). Since it is empirically true that some people react to injury with reactive attitudes that are not forms of anger at all, it should be borne in mind that not all forgiveness, even as a process of overcoming negative reactive attitudes, involves angry reactive attitudes. However, because resentment, inasmuch as it involves the belief that we have been personally wronged by another, is a paradigmatic case of the sort of reactive attitudes occasioned by having been wronged, overcoming that reactive attitude for moral reasons seems to be a canonical instance of forgiveness.
The aforementioned general account of forgiveness is sometimes supplemented by the requirement that in overcoming negative feelings caused by having been wronged a forgiver must also renounce or modify her critical judgments of the wrongdoer. This raises questions about the nature of the cognitions typically involved in responses to having been wronged. The standard view of forgiveness as a process of overcoming moral anger or other unhappy reactive attitudes suggests that people who have been wronged characteristically form judgments about those who wrong them, such as that they deserve to be punished, can no longer be trusted, or have unjustifiably failed to uphold their end of a relationship. On some views, then, forgiveness as a process involves not only overcoming negative reactive attitudes caused by and directed at a wrongdoer, it also involves revising, modifying, or abandoning such critical moral judgments about a wrongdoer, sometimes in the light of such considerations as whether he or she deserves another chance, or whether mercy, compassion, or other considerations seem to warrant forgiveness.
But there is disagreement over this component of forgiveness. Some writers suggest that such cognitive alterations are a necessary prelude or accompaniment to successfully eliminating or at least diminishing the force of the reactive attitudes typical of having been wronged. This seems plausible if such attitudes are partly constituted by those cognitions or beliefs, in which case one might expect a change in them to yield a corresponding change of heart regarding the wrongdoer. The reality that changes in beliefs need not necessarily lead to changes in feelings qualifies this view. Ghandi's saying, “hate the sin, love the sinner,” contradicts it, directing such reactive attitudes as hatred toward the wrongful act, not toward the person who committed it. But this, too, seems compatible with retaining negative moral judgments of the agent, such as that he has committed a culpable wrong for which he ought to be punished, a belief one might hold while simultaneously loving the offender. The parable of the Prodigal Son whose father forgives him but does not give up his judgment of his son's prodigality is an example (Luke 15: 1–32). And Butler's view that forgiveness involves overcoming resentment (of some sort) or vengeful anger directed at a wrongdoer does not include revising one's critical judgments of wrongdoers. Thus, while some writers maintain that forgiveness requires a complete overcoming of negative emotions and judgments aimed at or about a wrongdoer, others claim that retaining negative moral judgments and feelings about a wrongdoer are compatible with forgiveness. Whether retaining such convictions but in a way that does not constitute “holding it against” the wrongdoer is enough for forgiveness, or whether forgiving yet punishing a wrongdoer are compatible actions, particularly if punishing a wrongdoer just is a way of holding the wrong against him, remain a matter of contention (Radzik, 2008; Zaibert,2009A). Whether forgiveness may be unconditional and unilateral, dependent in no way on whether wrongdoers acknowledge having caused wrong, are apologetic or punished for it, show remorse or regret, or attempt to atone for it, a view sometimes linked to the Christian idea that our own forgiveness by God depends only on our forgiving others their wrongs, is also a debated issue about the nature of forgiveness.
Other views diverge in more radical ways from Butler's and derivative conceptions of forgiveness as a process of overcoming disagreeable or unhappy reactive attitudes for moral reasons, inasmuch as they ground forgiveness in dispositions or character traits. In the Christian tradition forgiveness is often aligned to such virtues as love and compassion, which are regarded as virtues that implicate relatively abiding dispositions or characterological tendencies, and some recent philosophical analyses have treated forgiveness or “forgivingness” as a relatively stable and durable trait that is enacted over a period of time by particular acts of forgiveness (Roberts, 1995). It is interesting to note in this connection both the OED's aforementioned sense of ‘forgivable’ as a condition which merits forgiveness, as well as Butler's typology of anger which acknowledges a third type that includes such stable postures as irritability, sullenness, or churlishness, which link anger more to relatively fixed character traits than to instincts, cognitions, or actions. Both forgivingness and contrary characteristics suggest a distinction between dispositional and episodic forgiveness, and another between forgiveness as a trait and forgiveness as an act. As I have characterized them, Butler's and similar views articulate a conception of forgiveness as a process, which may involve dispositions or actions, the aim of which is to overcome episodic moral reactive attitudes occasioned by what others do to us, rather than a response to characterological shortcomings in others that may engender that wrongful behavior. The notion of forgiving others for what they are (Macalaster, 2008) or, perhaps, for what they were, if it is possible to forgive the dead, as opposed to what they do is not, it seems, part of this mainstream philosophical conception of forgiveness.
It bears noting, as well, that there may even be a kind of forgiving as forgetting, in the sense that people sometimes discover that the resentment they harbor towards a wrongdoer has disappeared, not because they have done anything to transcend it, but simply because it has dissipated over time. It is not unusual for such people to assert that they have come to realize that they have forgiven an offender, after all. This, too, is a process of overcoming resentment, though it is not one directed willfully and for moral reasons by wronged parties.
And so from Butler we get the core notion that forgiveness is a complex affective and cognitive reaction to having been wronged by others. This response typically involves a process of overcoming angry or otherwise unhappy moral reactive attitudes directed toward a perceived wrongdoer. Refinements to this view add that overcoming moral anger or other relevant reactive attitudes must be tendered for moral reasons, and that forgiveness perhaps includes rejecting or modifying associated judgments of the wrongdoer such that the victim no longer holds the wrong against the wrongdoer, as would be the case were the victim to bear a grudge.
In cases of serious injury or wrongdoing, forgiveness often involves a struggle on the part of the forgiver to overcome or renounce strong reactive emotions such as resentment or hatred of the wrongdoer. Such struggles may be time consuming, and admit of degrees of success. It thus makes sense to say that a victim of wrong may be trying to forgive an offender, is making progress towards doing so, has partially forgiven the wrongdoer, and so forth. On this approach, forgiveness involves volitions or efforts of will, as when a victim of wrong tries to overcome angry emotions caused by having been wronged, or refrains from chastising or punishing a wrongdoer, in so doing demonstrating a willingness to let bygones be bygones. Self-control and strength of will are involved, also, in our efforts to manage our tempers such that we do not hold grudges against those who wrong us. Forgiveness as a process of overcoming strong negative emotions may thus be seen as an accomplishment, one that requires moral and psychological resources to effect the relevant emotional or attitudinal transformation, which resources may be undermined by being devastatingly wronged (Tombs, 2008).
Even when responding to wrongs involves overcoming negative reactive attitudes, it is important to observe that since not all injuries or wrongs are serious, forgiveness does not always involve a struggle or much effort at all to overcome angry emotions or renounce negative moral judgments of others. Some forgiveness, in particular the forgiveness accomplished by such performative utterances as “don't mention it,” “forget about it,” or “I forgive you,” reflects the fact that injuries may be relatively trivial and engender no, or at most weak, negative reactive attitudes. The ease with which a victim of a trivial wrong typically forgives the wrongdoer is more aptly viewed as an act of forgiveness, rather than as a process that takes time or effort. Much like waiving a financial debt, such forgiving may be viewed as a simple and straightforward transaction or exchange. This distinction is reflected in the two main senses of the Hebrew and Greek words translated as “forgive” found in the Bible, one of which refers to the annulling of financial debts, and the other to re-establishing personal relationships that have been disrupted by wrongdoing (Metzger and Coogan, 1993).
Within Western monotheistic and philosophical traditions forgiveness has often been regarded as a “high” and “difficult” virtue (Scarre, 2004), and its opposite, unwillingness to forgive, as a vice. Yet this poses an immediate problem of interpretation, namely, whether forgiveness is a “high” and “difficult” virtue in the sense that while it is morally laudable it is beyond duty (i.e. supererogatory). Since supererogatory actions are permissible, not obligatory, it follows that a failure to forgive, at least in circumstances where forgiving would be supererogatory, would not, contrary to the aforementioned view, be a vice.
However, widespread and persistent disagreement within moral philosophy both about supererogation and the deontic nature of forgiveness have led to conflicting views on the relation between forgiveness and moral obligation. Some thinkers have argued that forgiveness is a duty (Rashdall, 1924) while others have maintained that, like a gift with no strings attached, forgiveness is utterly gratuitous (Heyd, 1982). It might also be thought that, similar to the duty of charity in Kant's moral system, forgiveness is properly regarded as an imperfect duty. Unlike perfect duties such as the obligation to justice or honesty, imperfect duties allow for agential discretion over when and with respect to whom to discharge the duty. In this way, forgiveness may be located in a system of moral duties that allows for no supererogatory deeds at all. One contemporary virtue-theorteic conception of forgiveness (Haber, 1991) rejects attempts to establish necessary and sufficient conditions of forgiveness, a strategy employed in many conventional accounts, in favor of analyzing the ordinary meanings of the term. This view attempts to establish that forgiveness is among the most important virtues.
In contrast to duty-based approaches to forgiveness, virtue-based perspectives suggest that the overcoming or forswearing of angry reactive attitudes characteristic of forgiveness must be grounded in or expressive of relatively stable and durable dispositions or character traits. On such views forgiveness is a virtue, or is at least closely aligned with one or more of the traditional virtues such as magnanimity or sympathy. Within ancient Greek thought the views of Plato and Aristotle on the relationship between anger and living virtuously are noteworthy, as is the Christian traditions' understanding of forgiveness as love or compassion.
5.1.1 Self-Control and Good Temper
Although forgiveness is not identified as a distinct virtue in Plato's work, the Platonic perspective on anger illuminates the general emotional landscape in which forgiveness has often been located and from which it derives much of its value. In his discussion on the nature of community and individual morality in Book IV of the Republic, Plato makes clear that demonstrations of anger are generally regarded as manifestations of intemperance, which is a vice, and since angry emotions are ever a threat to overwhelm reason and self-control they must be rationally controlled in the name of a harmonious ordering of the different parts of the soul, which is the essence of a morally good person (Republic, 439–442). By contrast, Aristotle, in his discussion of virtues and vices relative to anger in Book IV of the Nicomachean Ethics,explains that “good temper” is the mean between the extremes of irascibility, an excess of anger, and inirascibility, or what he alternatively calls a “nameless” deficiency of anger, and that the good-tempered person “is not revengeful, but rather tends to forgive” (Nicomachean Ethics 1126a1). Aristotle's general perspective on morally appropriate anger is that the person of virtue is “angry at the right things and with the right people, and, further, as he ought, when he ought, and as long as he ought” (Nicomachean Ethics 1125b32). In general, both Plato's and Aristotle's views suggest that anger controlled by or expressive of reason may be seen as manifesting virtue, whereas anger ungoverned by rationality is a vice.
5.1.2 Forgiveness as Love
The traditional Christian perspective on forgiveness contrasts with Butler's and associated views, and with the Greek views on the virtues of self-control and good temper. Konstan (2010) has argued convincingly that neither the common notion of interpersonal forgiveness that derives from Butler's view nor the traditional Christian view of it have roots in the classical Greek and Roman moral conceptual schemes. The Christian perspective on forgiveness, derived from the New Testament, emphasizes the moral necessity of responding to wrongdoing by accepting it, turning the other cheek, and re-embracing the offender in an act of love or compassion; a prominent theme in Jesus' ethic of love (Wolterstorff, 2009). There is disagreement among scholars about whether forgiveness as compassion is unilateral and unconditional, requiring that the victim of wrong forgive wrongdoers irrespective of whether the latter first show signs of repentance (Fiddes, 1989; Jones, 1995), or whether forgiveness is only justifiable if it is premised upon such signs (Swinburne, 1989). One recent interpretation combines forgiveness as love with a conception of forgiveness as absolution, arguing that each is a necessary “moment” of forgiveness in an overall process of reconciliation between wrongdoer and victim (Biggar, 2008). Another account envisions two “aspects” of forgiveness: the act of relinquishing both a claim against a wrongdoer and the negative reactive attitudes occasioned by having been wronged, and the other the act of loving the wrongdoer, viewed as a gift from the victim to the wrongdoer. These two dimensions are expressed in the Epistle to the Ephesians (4:31–32): “Let all bitterness and wrath and anger and clamor and slander be put away from you, with all malice, and be kind to one another, tenderhearted, forgiving one another, as God in Christ forgave you” (Pettigrove, 2007).
In general, forgiveness as love or compassion is part of a larger narrative that also emphasizes the roles of confession or acknowledgment of one's sins, purification via atonement for them, patience with wrongdoers (Exodus 34. 5–8), and the ultimate mysteriousness of forgiveness (McCord-Adams, 1991). The latter element is linked in this tradition to the idea that each of us is so radically ignorant of what is in another's heart that we can never have the proper moral standing or authority to judge them; a status only God can possess. This is reflected in Hobbes' claim that only God has the absolute authority to forgive or retain human sins since only God knows the heart of man and, thus, whether repentance is real or bogus (Hobbes, 1969). On this view, interpersonal forgiveness is a triadic relation between the wrongdoer, the forgiver, and God. Forgiveness on this view is owed to wrongdoers because God's forgiveness of our sins depends on our forgiving others theirs. The Lord's Prayer involves a petitioner asking God's forgiveness of his sins (Luke 11.4) or his debts (Matthew 6.12) because he has done what is required of him in forgiving others. This view is not straightforwardly egoistic, since forgiveness depends on our inter-connectedness in the sense that we cannot be forgiven our sins, which we inevitably commit, without forgiving others theirs, which they inevitably commit. In this way forgiveness as love directly furthers self-interest through serving the welfare of others.
As noted, this perspective is grounded in an epistemological skepticism that renders the nature and moral value of forgiveness mysterious, especially if the emphasis on our lack of knowledge of other people's hearts and minds is taken to preclude any understanding whatsoever of their behavior. This approach to forgiveness is flatly at odds with other views that assume that we sometimes know a good deal, or at least enough, about other people's motives, intentions, and what is in their heart to ground the propriety of forgiving them for wronging us. In this regard, it is noteworthy that Hobbes' assertion that only God has the “absolute authority” to forgive or retain human sins does not imply that we are completely ignorant of other people's hearts and minds. Instead, we may know enough without knowing everything about other people's psychology to be able reasonably to forgive them the wrongs they do to us, consistently with the idea that God remains the ultimate judge of the value of human forgiveness.
Several virtue-theoretic perspectives contrary both to early Greek notions that anger appropriately mediated by reason is a virtue, and from the Christian view that forgiveness as transcending anger in an act of love is a virtue, should be mentioned. First, Nietzsche's conception of ressentiment as sublimated anger/envy directed at the noble man suggests that both dispositional and episodic anger may be manifestations of weakness or vice, not strength, self-respect, or virtue (Nietzsche, 1967). This is reminiscent of Plutarch's view that anger is like a disease, and extreme or abiding anger such as rage or bitterness are unnatural dispositional states (Plutarch, 2000). We should add to these views the observation that the negative effects of being angrily obsessed by someone's wrongdoing is not by itself a justification for blaming or forgiving him. Put differently, though it might be a bad thing to be angrily obsessed with having been wronged, it does not follow from this that a victim of wrong must forgive the wrongdoer. There are, after all, other ways of transcending or purging recalcitrant anger which might be more appropriate than would be forgiving.
Nietzsche's view suggests the further idea that even episodic angry emotions may be a sign of moral infirmity, insofar as such emotions concede power to others by revealing one's vulnerability to injury. But the truly noble or strong are thought to have, in some sense, no such vulnerabilities. Second, some recent popular views suggest that the uninhibited expression of anger and rage is a good thing, insofar as such venting is cathartic. But on consequentialist grounds alone it seems clear that controlling intense anger rather than its unfettered expression is closer to what a good life requires, for though anger may sometimes be enabling in motivating constructive solutions to personal or political problems, its indiscriminate expression is more likely to be disabling, both for those expressing it and for those around them. This last remark relates to a third disparaging view of angry reactive attitudes, that of the Stoic Seneca, who maintains that all forms of anger are inconsistent with the moral life because they dispose us to cruelty and vengeance, which passions encourage us to see other people as less than fully human. On this view, the person of virtue is one who strives to extirpate anger in all its forms. These three perspectives seem to imply that since anger is never an appropriate emotion, forgiveness cannot be a virtue, at least in the sense of overcoming justified anger.
Although at least one contemporary author claims that the roots of interpersonal forgiveness are not to be found in Butler's view at all, but, in part at least, in Kantian ethics (Konstan, 2010), the mainstream philosophical understanding of forgiveness many thinkers claim to have derived from Butler's conception seems especially applicable to interpersonal forgiveness. Yet it is a commonplace that people claim to forgive themselves both for wrongs they commit against others, and for self-directed wrongs in the form of some sort of personal failure or shortcoming, such as violating a commitment to another person; or failing to adhere to a diet. Although there seems to be no logical reason to think self-forgiveness as overcoming various forms of self-directed moral reactive attitudes such as disappointment or disgust is fundamentally unlike interpersonal forgiveness as a process, there are significant differences between the two. First, and notwithstanding the fact that people may be angry with themselves, experience self-directed loathing, and struggle to overcome such negative emotional attitudes, it is not clear that the idea of resenting oneself is coherent and, thus, whether forgiveness as overcoming self-referential resentment is possible. This is because resentment in the sense at issue requires such cognitions as that the wrongdoer is a moral agent and the victim a moral subject whose rights are in some way violated by a wrongdoer. That one and the same person is involved simultaneously as agent and subject, wrongdoer and victim, in this drama is incompatible with the idea that resentment is necessarily directed at other people. Indeed, for this and other reasons some thinkers have denied that self-forgiveness is conceptually possible, insisting that forgiveness requires a wrongdoer and another person who is the victim (Arendt, 1958). The matter is further complicated by such questions as what sorts of reactive attitude may be self-directed, what is involved in transcending or disengaging from them and from associated thoughts of oneself as a wrongdoer, what it means to overcome self-directed reactive attitudes for moral reasons, and how self-forgiving is to be distinguished conceptually and morally from self-pardoning and self-condoning. If it is not possible to resent oneself then self-forgiving will not involve the same internal dynamics as does the paradigm case of interpersonal forgiving embraced by many contemporary philosophers. Instead, self-forgiveness may typically involve overcoming such feelings as embarrassment, disappointment, shame, or guilt.
In a different vein, Kathryn Norlock (2009) argues that traumatized people, such as victims of domestic violence or those who suffer from eating disorders, may be regarded as “fragmented” selves who are themselves the source of culpable self-inflicted evils which supports and enables s elf-forgiveness while simultaneously being an impediment to it.
Moreover, modeling self-forgiveness on the standard account of interpersonal forgiveness misleadingly suggests that self-forgiveness is typically a process of overcoming negative reactive attitudes directed towards the self. In this vein, Snow (1992) argues that self-forgiveness serves two important self-regarding purposes. First, it serves the purpose of restoring wrongdoers to full moral agency even in the absence of the victim's forgiveness. This is similar to Holmgren's claim (1998) that self-forgiving is a way of restoring or maintaining one's intrinsic self-worth, which she argues is an extension of her analysis of interpersonal forgiveness. Zenon Szablowinski (2011) concurs, arguing that a failure to self forgive may be detrimental to a wrongdoers moral and psychological well-being, and that such forgiveness is morally appropriate when a wrongdoer's guilt, shame, or self-loathing reach significantly high levels. Second, it constitutes a second-best alternative to full interpersonal forgiveness, in the sense that when full interpersonal forgiveness is not forthcoming (and there can be many reasons for this), self-forgiving is nevertheless an important and sometimes morally appropriate response to having done wrong.
This conception of self-forgiveness as self-rehabilitation assumes that wrongdoers care enough about the wrong they have committed to be in some way impaired by having done it. Though other-directed and self-directed wrongs may be deeply disturbing to the wrongdoer, and require a process of overcoming unhappy self-directed reactive attitudes, wronging others or oneself in a way that is psychologically debilitating to the wrongdoer may be the exception rather than the rule. This is because many of the wrongs we commit are not so grave as to cause us significant distress, even when they cause unhappiness to those who are victimized by those wrongs. Instead of thinking that the many minor inconveniences or offenses we cause others and the self-regarding disappointments we cause ourselves require a forgiveness that involves emotional or characterological transformation, it may be more plausible to suppose such deeds are forgiven by simpler acts such as the thought that I forgive myself. It should also be noted that just as self-forgiveness does not accomplish or require interpersonal forgiveness neither does inter-personal forgiveness accomplish or require self-forgiveness.
Moreover, whether or not anybody other than the victim of wrong can forgive a wrongdoer, it seems clear that nobody other than oneself can forgive self-directed wrongs. And people may wrong themselves in various ways, such as by failing to develop their talents or live up to their principles or commitments. In such cases they may overcome the wrong they have caused themselves and the associated feelings of guilt, remorse, or self-directed anger by forgiving themselves. But the sense in which one may forgive oneself for wronging others is limited to wrongs done to oneself via wronging others. That is, only the wrong done to oneself can be self-forgiven, and not the wrong done to anyone else through the wrongful behavior. For example, suppose X has a sexual encounter outside her marriage, thereby violating her promise of fidelity to her spouse Y. X feels guilty and disappointed in herself, recognizing that she has wronged both her spouse and herself by failing to adhere to her promise. X apologizes for her infidelity, and asks Y for forgiveness, which Y is unable or unwilling to offer because he is emotionally devastated by the betrayal. Faced with the prospect of ongoing guilt and self-directed disappointment there are various ways in which X may move beyond such feelings, including forgiving herself for failing to live up to her own principles. However it remains the case that X cannot forgive the wrong she did to Y on behalf of Y.
Many contemporary philosophers who have written on forgiveness claim that there can be no third-party forgiving, where that is understood to mean one person forgiving a wrongdoer for another. That this is impossible seems to follow from the essentially personal nature of the reactive attitudes, such as resentment, often engendered by being wronged, the overcoming of which is central to much forgiveness. Because it has seemed clear to many writers on the topic that such emotions can only be overcome by victims of wrong, only victims can forgive. Others may forgive a wrongdoer for a wrong that also victimizes them. For example, the parents of a murdered child are wronged by the murder of their child, and for this they may forgive the wrongdoer. But they cannot forgive for the primary victim or for other victims of the crime because they have no moral standing or authority to do so. Put differently, forgiveness is the victim's prerogative (Swinburne, 1989; Govier and Verwoerd, 2002). This clearly does not mean that third-parties cannot convey forgiveness on behalf of someone wronged, but that is acting in the role of a messenger of forgiveness, not in the role of a forgiver per se.
With regard to self-forgiveness, this is, as noted above, a conceptual truth, and some have argued that it is an empirical (psychological) truth with respect to interpersonal forgiveness. And within the traditional Christian religious ethic there is at least and, apparently, at most, one case of third-party forgiveness, namely, God forgiving us our trespasses against other people. Within this tradition, we are required to forgive others who wrong us in order to secure God's forgiveness of our own sins, without which we cannot gain salvation. This entails that for those who are saved, God forgives their sins against other people, which is the essence of third-party forgiveness.
It might be thought that any sin against another person is ipso facto a sin against God the creator and, thus, that God's forgiveness of human wrongdoing is really for wrongs done to Him, making God's forgiveness of human wrongs not a genuine case of third-party forgiveness. But as the example of the parents of the murdered child shows, there may be primary and secondary victims of wrong, and it is simply false to say that a wrong done to a particular person is actually a wrong done to someone else, or to God, and not to that person. Perhaps all injuries done by human beings to other human beings are in some sense also wrongs done to God, but that is consistent with the observation that wrongs endured by particular people are done to them.
It might also be supposed that political pardons are a type of third-party forgiving. Suppose, for example, that in the final days of her tenure a State Governor offers a pardon to the oldest, most feeble inmates in the state penitentiary who have already served most of a life sentence. Remitting the remainder of the prison sentences seems to be an instance of third-party forgiving, at least if forgiveness is understood as broadly synonymous with pardoning.
However, official or institutional acts of pardon are not interpersonal in the same sense as is forgiveness between two persons. In modern criminal justice systems like that of the United States, crimes are, strictly speaking, offenses against the state, and it is the state that takes up the prosecution and punishment of criminal offenders. As such, people victimized by crime do not personally respond to the wrongdoer. The recent development of victim's rights groups and the use of victim impact statements in court proceedings underscore the emotional distance victims often experience in having the cause of action against a wrongdoer taken away from them and put into the hands of impersonal agents of the state. These considerations suggest that an analogy between official acts of pardon and the often deeply personal interaction of forgiveness between victim and wrongdoer may be untenable.
Despite the widespread assumption that only the primary victim of wrong has the standing or authority to forgive wrongdoers, a number of philosophers have challenged it. Murphy (2009) acknowledges his departure from this assumption, and Pettigrove, in his “The Standing to Forgive” (2009), argues that four common arguments that purport to show that only the immediate or direct victim of harm has the standing to forgive are unpersuasive, and that second or even third parties, who are not properly regarded as “victims” of the wrong, can nevertheless forgive a wrongdoer. And Radzik (2010) claims that the idea that only the immediate victim of wrongdoing can forgive is false, since it is a commonplace that people who are neither direct nor indirect victims of a wrong may nevertheless experience moral anger over a wrong (e.g. an injustice) done to others. Forgiveness in such cases may be part of an effort to repair a relationship between a wrongdoer and those non-victims whose relations to the wrongdoer have been compromised by the wrong that was done.
The power of pardon enjoyed by duly established political authorities may be at best a loose cognate of forgiveness, but this is not to say that all legal or political analogues to forgiveness are implausible. It remains to discuss whether individual political actors and institutions, and collective efforts to respond to such moral atrocities as slavery, legally enforced racial segregation, ethnic cleansing, and other large-scale immoralities may be regarded as forms of forgiveness.
P.E. Digeser (2001) has argued in favor of a conception of political forgiveness that breaks sharply with the standard philosophical accounts of forgiveness as involving the overcoming of resentment or other negative emotional states by victims of wrong. Instead, Digeser seeks to divest political forgiveness of any personal feelings whatsoever in favor of a performative account in which such overt behaviors as pardoning a criminal or waiving a debt signify forgiveness. Digeser claims that separating the action of forgiving from its underlying motive and from the constellation of feelings often thought to accompany interpersonal forgiveness better suits a conception of justice as one in which people get their due. On this secular, performative concept, forgiveness consists in political actors or institutions opting not to get their due, for whatever reasons.
Digeser claims to have created a serviceable political notion of forgiveness shorn of its usual psychological and even theological baggage. And surely, as noted earlier, there is a sense of forgiveness in which an action such as waiving a debt or an utterance such as “I forgive you” is sometimes all that forgiveness is about. To this extent and in this sense debt forgiveness and political pardons may reasonably be regarded as political forms of forgiving.
MacLachlan (2012) notes that some philosophers have been skeptical about what they regard as the uncritical promotion of forgiveness in political contexts which they see as detracting from its moral value and side-stepping concerns about justice and accountability for wrongdoing. But, like Digeser, she thinks such worries may be a product of “conceptual conservatism” linked to the emotional model of interpersonal forgiveness (i.e. the view that forgiveness requires overcoming unhappy emotions such as resentment) and that a more performative model makes room for meaningful political forgiveness.
It might be thought that these notions of political forgiveness are but special cases of the interpersonal forgiveness noted above in which a speech act such as “I forgive you” or “Forget about it” is all that is needed to accomplish forgiveness. But this would be a mistake, for even in such cases of interpersonal performative forgiveness it is the victim of the wrong who proffers forgiveness to the wrongdoer. This is not the case with political forgiveness as conceived by Digeser or MacLachlan, however, since the person or institution proferring forgiveness is either an agent of the state (e.g. the President) or an agent or agents of a collective entity such as a bank to whom a debt is owed, and these people are not plausibly regarded as the victims of the wrongdoing they forgive. This observation reinforces the idea that political forgiveness is as noted above at best a loose cognate of interpersonal forms of forgiving. Indeed, political forgiveness in this sense may be an instance of third-party forgiving by those who do not have the proper standing to forgive, at least if the parameters of interpersonal forgiveness outlined above are correct. Perhaps, instead, such acts as waiving a debt, especially if it is a crushing debt, and pardoning a convicted felon, are in the final analysis more akin to acts of mercy than they are to acts of forgiveness.
It should be pointed out that the past thirty or so years or so have seen a rapid increase on the part of political leaders apologizing for and seeking reconciliation between perpetrators and victims of moral atrocities. The ostensible aim of such efforts has not only been to rectify past wrongs and give those who have been wronged their due, but to heal deep and sometimes longstanding wounds caused by such wrongs as well. The South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC) in the mid 1990s is probably the best known example of such attempts to achieve reconciliation between perpetrators and victims of intra-national collective wrongs. Other instances of political apology, aimed in part at effecting some form of forgiveness or reconciliation, include Australia's “sorry book,” which records citizens' remorse over a former government policy mandating the forced removal of aboriginal children from their natural parents in the name of cultural assimilation, President Clinton's apology to African Americans and subsequent proposals by scholars and policy-makers of reparations for slavery, and Northern Ireland's 1998 Good Friday Agreement and the peace process initiated thereby (Brooks, 2004; Biggar, 2008). Understanding forgiveness as roughly synonymous with reconciliation supports the notion that these collective endeavors are institutional forms of forgiveness (Etzioni, 1999; Radzik, 2009).
In general, such efforts are a combination of morally significant gestures some of which seem close to forgiveness while others do not. For example, they may serve one or more of the ends common to interpersonal and self-forgiveness, such as helping victims, bystanders, and perpetrators of moral atrocities come to terms with their pain and guilt, or by offering amnesty to wrongdoers in exchange for the truth about their roles in wrongdoing they may ensure that a dark period in a nation's history is remembered so that such behavior may be avoided in the future. Despite the fact that one of the main objectives of political reconciliation efforts is to unite perpetrators and victims of wrong after a period of hostile relations, interpersonal forgiveness does not necessarily share this goal. Moreover, dead people may be forgiven, and interpersonal forgiveness may occur even when the wrongdoer is ignorant of the fact that he has been forgiven, neither of which is possible with reconciliation, personal or political. Reconciliation of the political variety is by its nature public, and involves opposing parties at least knowing about the effort, if not participating in it together. Because such schemes are only superficially personal, they may leave intact the wounds and reactive attitudes of victims many of whom must continue to live alongside the neighbors who victimized them prior to the public truth and reconciliation exercise (Williams, 2008). Moreover, such efforts are usually predicated upon some form of public apology for or acknowledgment of wrongdoing as a preliminary to re-uniting victim and oppressor. Interpersonal forgiveness may be conditioned upon apology, but it need not be. It is also unclear what a successful collective effort to effect moral healing between or within large groups of people would mean in terms of individual wrongdoers and their specific victims. As noted, interpersonal forgiveness seems to be a deeply personal response to having been wronged, one that often involves overcoming resentment directed at a specific wrongdoer. A public apology and accounting of crimes committed by participants in collective wrongs may be too abstract and psychologically distant from particular victims to achieve what genuine interpersonal forgiveness seems to require.
It is often claimed that in the face of wrongdoing we are frequently torn by conflicting moral intuitions, on the one hand to demand justice from wrongdoers and, on the other, to proffer forgiveness. A correlative thought is that these are alternative responses to wrongdoing, which cannot be melded into one reaction. In his advocacy of truth and reconciliation efforts to address large-scale moral wrongs, Desmond Tutu (1999) makes the point that forgiveness and reconciliation are incompatible with retributive justice, and that the moral value of the former are to be assessed in terms of what he calls “restorative” justice, or the extent to which such public accountings effect healing between perpetrators and victims of wrong. This reflects a growing trend in academic and public policy circles to modify conceptions of justice to incorporate alternatives to retribution as the proper response to wrongdoing, especially wrongdoing in the form of heinous crimes against humanity (Exline, et al., 2003). Despite its appeal, the notion of restorative justice is not entirely clear, for if retributive justice refers merely to punishing wrongs, this sense of justice seems compatible both with forgiveness and reconciliation between wrongdoers and their victims. If instead the concept of retributive justice conveys the idea of getting even with wrongdoers, as in the Old Testament “eye for an eye, tooth for a tooth,” version of justice, then forgiveness and this sort of justice are indeed inconsistent, as is presupposed in the mainstream conception of forgiveness as requiring that a forgiver renounce retributive emotions directed at wrongdoers. Some writers on this topic suggest that forgiveness is not the same as restorative justice, but may be an important component in the larger project of achieving a justice that seeks the moral restoration of those injured in large-scale moral wrongs.
Still, forgiveness has long been regarded as in conflict with justice, if not incompatible with it. Seneca claimed that “Pardon is given to a man who ought to be punished; but a wise man does nothing that he ought not to do, omits to do nothing which he ought to do; therefore he does not remit a punishment which he ought to exact.” Mercy, by contrast, is aligned with justice in the sense that “it declares that those who are let off did not deserve any different treatment” (Seneca, 1998, p.445). Considering the specific circumstances of individual cases is a matter of mercy, “not of forgiveness.” Mercy, unlike pardon and forgiveness, is an exercise of equity, which is an application of justice in light of the unique circumstances of individual cases. By contrast, the prerogative of pardon associated with such political executives as Presidents, Prime Ministers, and other authorities may be viewed, according to Aristotle, as an exercise of equity in the sense that such duly established authorities are commonly thought to use that power as a way of mitigating the rigors of universal standards of justice in their application to particular cases the specifics of which appear to fall beyond the scope of the universal rule (Wolsterstorff, 2009; Bingham, 2009).
Forgiveness in modern ethical theory may also be thought to belong to that realm of morality concerned with goodness rather than with right (justice), as are, pace Kant, benevolence and sympathy, which are regarded as imperfect duties that allow for individual choice over when and with regard to whom to discharge them. From this perspective, forgiveness is not so much directly at odds with justice as it is an element of a different dimension of morality. The debate over the nature and appropriate relation between varieties of justice and forgiveness is ongoing, with much recent philosophical research devoted to these topics.
The topic of God's relation to human wrongdoing is an important one in mainstream Western theological and philosophical discussions of forgiveness, but it is by no means clear what the relationship is supposed to be between God and forgiveness, and the connection between that and the possibility of forgiveness between persons. The Christian theme that forgiveness originates with God and human beings are supposed to forgive wrongdoers because God forgives us our sins, remains mysterious. In part, this is because there is some question whether the differences between divine and human forgiveness are so significant that any comparison between them is inapt. As one author puts the point, “The difference between the human and the divine should not be underestimated, and it is possible that it would not just be over optimistic but actually dangerous to expect people to model their behavior on God” (Tombs, 2008, p.592). The concern expressed in this remark is that whereas God's forgiveness is supposedly unilateral, unilateral human forgiveness may be irresponsible, as when a victim of wrong forgives a wrongdoer irrespective of any signs of repentance on the part of the wrongdoer. Another writer argues that the gap between human and divine forgiveness is unbridgeable, for God's forgiveness is grounded in “eschatological divine justice” not, as in human forgiveness, in an awareness of “sinful solidarity with humanity” (Williams, 2008, pps.584–585).
Moreover, it is not clear how sins in the form of violations of God's commands, for example, not to lie, or to refrain from taking the name of the lord in vain, could be forgiven, since an omnipotent, perfectly good, being cannot, it seems, be wronged, either vicariously or directly. It seems the idea noted above that we may wrong God via wronging others cannot be literally true of an all perfect being. And the idea that we can wrong or injure God directly, for example, via blasphemy, seems absurd for the same reason. Rather, God's perfections render Him beyond forgiveness in the sense that it is logically impossible for Him to forgive or, for that matter, to be forgiven. Thus, the claim “To err is human; to forgive divine,” is false. Instead, to err and to forgive are human, since it is human fallibility that makes wrongdoing and forgiveness possible in the first place (Minas, 1975).
These skeptical observations suggest that the fact that many Christian texts portray human beings petitioning God for forgiveness need not imply either that God has been wronged by human beings, that divine forgiveness is in any way like the human variety, or even that God logically can forgive human beings their transgressions.
It might be argued, however, that these claims assume that all wrongdoing injures or harms the victim. But this assumption may be false, since some wrongs may cause no harm or injury at all. Arthur Ripstein (2006) gives as an example of harmless wrongdoing the unauthorized use of another's home that causes no damage to it or to anything inside. Although no harm is caused, trespassing against the home is wrong. Perhaps, then, God can be wronged harmlessly, for example by being disrespected, and may forgive wrongdoers such wrongs.
Still, the standard sense of having been wronged clearly means having been victimized in some way by an injustice, an evil, or, on a broader conception of harm such as that of Feinberg, a setback to one's interests. And it strains credulity to think that an omnipotent, all knowing, and perfectly good being may be victimized in any way or suffer a setback to its interests. Only beings that are vulnerable to such consequences of human behaviors and attitudes can be wronged or harmed. Hence, God cannot be disrespected, insulted, or ridiculed any more than He can be assaulted, black-mailed, or murdered. Of course, people may say or believe disrespectful things about God, in their own minds ridiculing or otherwise insulting Him. But if it is logically impossible for God to be a victim of any sort, then he cannot be the victim of any kind of wrongdoing, harmful or not.
The relation between God and forgiveness arises as well in philosophical discussions of the problem of evil. For example, it is sometimes argued that the existence of such morally good things as benevolence and charity depend, logically, on the reality of specific evils such as pain and suffering. As applied to forgiveness, this suggests that human wrongdoing is a logically necessary condition for the moral good of forgiveness. This line of thinking belongs to those theodicies that propose a necessary connection between good and evil, such as that human free will, itself a good thing, requires the ability to do wrong, which is the presupposition of forgiveness, another good thing (Mackie, 1995). But other philosophical considerations track in a different direction, as for example when God's relation to time is considered. If God is outside time as we know it, then it seems He cannot forgive human beings since forgiveness, a temporal term, logically presupposes temporally prior sins. And even if there is some sense in which a temporally eternal God forgives human wrongs, it seems that cannot be a true description of human forgiveness since we are temporally finite beings whose wrongdoings and forgiveness occur at specific moments within time. These considerations also cast doubt on the intelligibility of the idea that humans must forgive one another their trespasses in order to become more like Jesus' human incarnation of God and warrant divine forgiveness.
Other questions pertaining to forgiveness include whether and in what sense people can be held responsible for their reactive attitudes and how they respond to them, and the place of forgiveness in such broadly secular ethical perspectives as utilitarianism (Scarre, 2004), contemporary virtue theories, and feminist ethics of care which emphasize responsibility for others and the importance of maintaining relationships.
Noting that “we grow angry with enemies and friends, with children and parents, yes, even with the gods, with wild beasts and soulless implements,” Plutarch (Moralia, Volume 6, p.107) implicitly raised the questions what sorts of things may cause us to experience angry or unpleasant reactive attitudes and what, among these sort of things, are proper objects of forgiveness. It may be that some objects that cause us anger or unhappiness cannot be forgiven because they are not moral agents. Perhaps, too, we can forgive even non-culpable moral agents or subjects, for example, those whose disabilities create hardships for people charged with their care. And the relation between forgiveness and children raises questions about who may be forgiven and who may forgive those who wrong them, perhaps challenging the mainstream philosophical conception of forgiveness as being overly cognitivist. Perhaps, too, the reach of forgiveness extends beyond responsible human agency, both in the sense that only culpable wrongs may be forgiven, and only full-fledged moral agents may forgive. A relatively under-explored conception of forgiveness, endorsed by some Buddhists, that insists that forgiveness be understood as “merely letting go of anger” (Boleyn-Fitzgerald, 2002) eschews altogether the notion that forgiveness must be about the principled overcoming of anger occasioned by culpable wrongs, and warrants closer scrutiny.
As noted above, there is reason to wonder why we should accept the claim central to the traditional Christian view of forgiveness as love that we suffer such a radical epistemological blind spot with regard to the desires, intentions, and motives of other people that we can have no moral standing to forgive them. Perhaps, instead, we do or can have sufficient understanding of other people to trust their apologies and other acts of contrition and base our forgiveness on reasonable grounds. On the other hand, even secular perspectives on wrongdoing and forgiveness recognize the fact that we all too often do not know much at all about wrongdoers' intentions, motives, desires, and thoughts to confidently pass judgment on whether we can reasonably forgive them, and so the connection between understanding wrongdoers and forgiving them in the light of that understanding remains contentious.
Finally, there may be some actions (or persons) that are beyond forgiveness not in the sense that they cannot logically be forgiven, for example, by third parties, or in the sense that victims lack the psychological resources to forgive them, but in the normative sense that they or their actions are so evil as to be beyond the pale of forgiveness and should not be forgiven.
These and related queries will continue to draw the interest of philosophers to the topic of forgiveness, which remains a complex, elusive, and contested moral phenomenon.
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