Francis Bacon (1561–1626) was one of the leading figures in natural philosophy and in the field of scientific methodology in the period of transition from the Renaissance to the early modern era. As a lawyer, member of Parliament, and Queen's Counsel, Bacon wrote on questions of law, state and religion, as well as on contemporary politics; but he also published texts in which he speculated on possible conceptions of society, and he pondered questions of ethics (Essays) even in his works on natural philosophy (The Advancement of Learning).
After his studies at Trinity College, Cambridge and Gray's Inn, London, Bacon did not take up a post at a university, but instead tried to start a political career. Although his efforts were not crowned with success during the era of Queen Elizabeth, under James I he rose to the highest political office, Lord Chancellor. Bacon's international fame and influence spread during his last years, when he was able to focus his energies exclusively on his philosophical work, and even more so after his death, when English scientists of the Boyle circle (Invisible College) took up his idea of a cooperative research institution in their plans and preparations for establishing the Royal Society.
To the present day Bacon is well known for his treatises on empiricist natural philosophy (The Advancement of Learning, Novum Organum Scientiarum) and for his doctrine of the idols, which he put forward in his early writings, as well as for the idea of a modern research institute, which he described in Nova Atlantis.
- 1. Biography
- 2. Natural Philosophy: Struggle with Tradition
- 3. Natural Philosophy: Theory of the Idols and the System of Sciences
- 4. Scientific Method: The Project of the Instauratio Magna
- 5. Scientific Method: Novum Organum and the Theory of Induction
- 6. Science and Social Philosophy
- 7. The Ethical Dimension in Bacon's Thought
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Francis Bacon was born January, 22, 1561, the second child of Sir Nicholas Bacon (Lord Keeper of the Seal) and his second wife Lady Anne Cooke Bacon, daughter of Sir Anthony Cooke, tutor to Edward VI and one of the leading humanists of the age. Lady Anne was highly erudite: she not only had a perfect command of Greek and Latin, but was also competent in Italian and French. Together with his older brother Anthony, Francis grew up in a context determined by political power, humanist learning, and Calvinist zeal. His father had built a new house in Gorhambury in the 1560s, and Bacon was educated there for some seven years; later, along with Anthony, he went to Trinity College, Cambridge (1573–5), where he sharply criticized the scholastic methods of academic training. Their tutor was John Whitgift, in later life Archbishop of Canterbury. Whitgift provided the brothers with classical texts for their studies: Cicero, Demosthenes, Hermogenes, Livy, Sallust, and Xenophon (Peltonen 2007). Bacon began his studies at Gray's Inn in London in 1576; but from 1577 to 1578 he accompanied Sir Amias Paulet, the English ambassador, on his mission in Paris. According to Peltonen (2007):
During his stay in France, perhaps in autumn 1577, Bacon once visited England as the bearer of diplomatic post, delivering letters to Walsingham, Burghley, Leicester, and to the Queen herself.
When his father died in 1579, he returned to England. Bacon's small inheritance brought him into financial difficulties and since his maternal uncle, Lord Burghley, did not help him to get a lucrative post as a government official, he embarked on a political career in the House of Commons, after resuming his studies in Gray's Inn. In 1581 he entered the Commons as a member for Cornwall, and he remained a Member of Parliament for thirty-seven years. He was admitted to the bar in 1582 and in 1587 was elected as a reader at Gray's Inn. His involvement in high politics started in 1584, when he wrote his first political memorandum, A Letter of Advice to Queen Elizabeth. Right from the beginning of his adult life, Bacon aimed at a revision of natural philosophy and—following his father's example—also tried to secure high political office. Very early on he tried to formulate outlines for a new system of the sciences, emphasizing empirical methods and laying the foundation for an applied science (scientia operativa). This twofold task, however, proved to be too ambitious to be realized in practice. Bacon's ideas concerning a reform of the sciences did not meet with much sympathy from Queen Elizabeth or from Lord Burghley. Small expectations on this front led him to become a successful lawyer and Parliamentarian. From 1584 to 1617 (the year he entered the House of Lords) he was an active member in the Commons. Supported by Walsingham's patronage, Bacon played a role in the investigation of English Catholics and argued for stern action against Mary Queen of Scots. He served on many committees, including one in 1588 which examined recusants; later he was a member of a committee to revise the laws of England. He was involved in the political aspects of religious questions, especially concerning the conflict between the Church of England and nonconformists. In a tract of 1591, he tried to steer a middle course in religious politics; but one year later he was commissioned to write against the Jesuit Robert Parson (Jardine and Stewart 1999, p. 125), who had attacked English sovereignty.
From the late 1580s onwards, Bacon turned to the Earl of Essex as his patron. During this phase of his life, he particularly devoted himself to natural philosophy. He clearly expressed his position in a famous letter of 1592 to his uncle, Lord Burghley:
I confess that I have as vast contemplative ends, as I have moderate civil ends: for I have taken all knowledge to be my province; and if I could purge it of two sorts of rovers, whereof the one with frivolous disputations, confutations, and verbosities, the other with blind experiments and auricular traditions and impostures, hath committed so many spoils, I hope I should bring in industrious observations, grounded conclusions, and profitable inventions and discoveries; the best state of that province. This, whether it be curiosity, or vain glory, or nature, or (if one take it favourably) philanthropia, is so fixed in my mind as it cannot be removed. And I do easily see, that place of any reasonable countenance doth bring commandment of more wits than of a man's own; which is the thing I greatly affect. (Bacon 1857–74, VIII, 109)
In 1593 Bacon fell out favor with the queen on account of his refusal to comply with her request for funds from Parliament. Although he did not vote against granting three subsidies to the government, he demanded that these should be paid over a period six, rather than three, years. This led Sir Robert Cecil and Sir Walter Raleigh to argue against him in Parliament. Bacon's patron, the Earl of Essex, for whom he had already served as a close political advisor and informer, was not able to mollify the queen's anger over the subsidies; and all Essex's attempts to secure a high post for Bacon (attorney-general or solicitor-general) came to nothing. Nevertheless, the queen valued Bacon's competence as a man of law. He was involved in the treason trial of Roderigo Lopez and later on in the proceedings against the Earl of Essex. In his contribution to the Gesta Grayorum (the traditional Christmas revels held in Gray's Inn) of 1594–5, Bacon had emphasized the necessity of scientific improvement and progress. Since he failed to secure for himself a position in the government, he considered the possibility of giving up politics and concentrating on natural philosophy. It is no wonder, then, that Bacon engaged in many scholarly and literary pursuits in the 1590s. His letters of advice to the Earl of Rutland and to the Earl of Essex should be mentioned in this context. The advice given to Essex is of particular importance because Bacon recommended that he should behave in a careful and intelligent manner in public, above all abstaining from aspiring to military commands. Bacon also worked in this phase of his career for the reform of English law. In 1597 his first book was published, the seminal version of his Essays, which contained only ten pieces (Klein 2004b). His financial situation was still insecure; but his plan to marry the rich widow Lady Hatton failed because she was successfully courted by Sir Edward Coke. In 1598 Bacon was unable to sell his reversion of the Star Chamber clerkship, so that he was imprisoned for a short time on account of his debts. His parliamentary activities in 1597–98, mainly involving committee work, were impressive; but when the Earl of Essex in 1599 took command of the attempt to pacify the Irish rebels, Bacon's hopes sank. Essex did not solve the Irish question, returned to court and fell from grace, as Bacon had anticipated he would. He therefore lost a valuable patron and spokesman for his projects. Bacon tried to reconcile the queen and Essex; but when the earl rebelled against the crown in 1601, he could do nothing to help him. The queen ordered Bacon to participate in the treason trial against Essex. In 1601 Bacon sat in Elizabeth's last parliament, playing an extremely active role.
Bacon looked forward to the next reign and tried to get in contact with James VI of Scotland, Elizabeth's successor. During James' reign Bacon rose to power. He was knighted in 1603 and was created a learned counsel a year later. He took up the political issues of the union of England and Scotland, and he worked on a conception of religious toleration, endorsing a middle course in dealing with Catholics and nonconformists. Bacon married Alice Barnhem, the young daughter of a rich London alderman in 1606. One year later he was appointed Solicitor General. He was also dealing with theories of the state and developed the idea, in accordance with Machiavelli, of a politically active and armed citizenry. In 1608 Bacon became clerk of the Star Chamber; and at this time, he made a review of his life, jotting down his achievements and failures. Though he still was not free from money problems, his career progressed step by step. In the period from 1603 to 1613 Bacon was not only busy within English politics. He also created the foundations of his philosophical work by writing seminal treatises which prepared the path for the Novum Organum and for the Instauratio Magna. In 1613 he became Attorney General and began the rise to the peak of his political career: he became a member of the Privy Council in 1616, was appointed Lord Keeper of the Great Seal the following year—thus achieving the same position as his father—and was granted the title of Lord Chancellor and created Baron of Verulam in 1618. In 1621, however, Bacon, after being created Viscount of St Alban, was impeached by Parliament for corruption. He fell victim to an intrigue in Parliament because he had argued against the abuse of monopolies, indirectly attacking his friend, the Duke of Buckingham, who was the king's favorite. In order to protect Buckingham, the king sacrificed Bacon, whose enemies had accused him of taking bribes in connection with his position as a judge. Bacon saw no way out for himself and declared himself guilty. His fall was contrived by his adversaries in Parliament and by the court faction, for which he was a scapegoat to save the Duke of Buckingham not only from public anger but also from open aggression (Mathews 1996). He lost all his offices and his seat in Parliament, but retained his titles and his personal property. Bacon devoted the last five years of his life—the famous quinquennium—entirely to his philosophical work. He tried to go ahead with his huge project, the Instauratio Magna Scientiarum; but the task was too big for him to accomplish in only a few years. Though he was able to finish important parts of the Instauratio, the proverb, often quoted in his works, proved true for himself: Vita brevis, ars longa. He died in April 1626 of pneumonia after experiments with ice.
Bacon's struggle to overcome intellectual blockades and the dogmatic slumber of his age and of earlier periods had to be fought on many fronts. Very early on he criticized not only Plato, Aristotle and the Aristotelians, but also humanists and Renaissance scholars such as Paracelsus and Bernardino Telesio.
Although Aristotle provided specific axioms for every scientific discipline, what Bacon found lacking in the Greek philosopher's work was a master principle or general theory of science, which could be applied to all branches of natural history and philosophy (Klein 2003a). For Bacon, Aristotle's cosmology, as well as his theory of science, had become obsolete and consequently so too had many of the medieval thinkers who followed his lead. He does not repudiate Aristotle completely, but he opposes the humanistic interpretation of him, with its emphasis on syllogism and dialectics (scientia operativa versus textual hermeneutics) and the metaphysical treatment of natural philosophy in favor of natural forms (or nature's effects as structured modes of action, not artifacts), the stages of which correspond—in the shape of a pyramid of knowledge—to the structural order of nature itself.
If any ‘modern’ Aristotelians came near to Bacon, it was the Venetian or Paduan branch, represented by Jacopo Zabarella. On the other hand, Bacon criticized Telesio, who—in his view—had only halfway succeeded in overcoming Aristotle's deficiencies. Although we find the debate with Telesio in an unpublished text of his middle period (De Principiis atque Originibus, secundum fabulas Cupidinis et Coelum or On Principles and Origins According to the Fables of Cupid and Coelum, written in 1612; Bacon V , 461–500), Bacon began to struggle with tradition as early as 1603. In Valerius Terminus (1603?) he already repudiates any mixture of natural philosophy and divinity; he provides an outline of his new method and determines that the end of knowledge was “a discovery of all operations and possibilities of operations from immortality (if it were possible) to the meanest mechanical practice” (Bacon III , 222). He opposes Aristotelian anticipatio naturae, which favored the inquiry of causes to satisfy the mind instead of those “as will direct him and give him light to new experiences and inventions” (Bacon III , 232).
When Bacon introduces his new systematic structure of the disciplines in The Advancement of Learning (1605), he continues his struggle with tradition, primarily with classical antiquity, rejecting the book learning of the humanists, on the grounds that they “hunt more after words than matter” (Bacon III , 283). Accordingly, he criticizes the Cambridge University curriculum for placing too much emphasis on dialectical and sophistical training asked of “minds empty and unfraught with matter” (Bacon III , 326). He reformulates and functionally transforms Aristotle's conception of science as knowledge of necessary causes. He rejects Aristotle's logic, which is based on his metaphysical theory, whereby the false doctrine is implied that the experience which comes to us by means of our senses (things as they appear) automatically presents to our understanding things as they are. Simultaneously Aristotle favors the application of general and abstract conceptual distinctions, which do not conform to things as they exist. Bacon, however, introduces his new conception of philosophia prima as a meta-level for all scientific disciplines.
From 1606 to 1612 Bacon pursued his work on natural philosophy, still under the auspices of a struggle with tradition. This tendency is exemplified in the unpublished tracts Temporis partus masculus, 1603/1608 (Bacon III , 521–31), Cogitata et Visa, 1607 (Bacon III, 591–620), Redargutio Philosophiarum, 1608 (III, 557–85), and De Principiis atque Originibus…, 1612 (Bacon V , 461–500). Bacon rediscovers the Pre-Socratic philosophers for himself, especially the atomists and among them Democritus as the leading figure. He gives preference to Democritus' natural philosophy in contrast to the scholastic—and thus Aristotelian—focus on deductive logic and belief in authorities. Bacon does not expect any approach based on tradition to start with a direct investigation of nature and then to ascend to empirical and general knowledge. This criticism is extended to Renaissance alchemy, magic, and astrology (Temporis partus masculus), because the ‘methods’ of these ‘disciplines’ are based on occasional insights, but do not command strategies to reproduce the natural effects under investigation. His criticism also concerns contemporary technical literature, in so far as it lacks a new view of nature and an innovative methodological program. Bacon takes to task the ancients, the scholastics and also the moderns. He not only criticizes Plato, Aristotle, and Galen for these failings, but also Jean Fernel, Paracelsus, and Telesio, while praising the Greek atomists and Roger Bacon.
Bacon's manuscripts already mention the doctrine of the idols as a necessary condition for constituting scientia operativa. In Cogitata et Visa he compares deductive logic as used by the scholastics to a spider's web, which is drawn out of its own entrails, whereas the bee is introduced as an image of scientia operativa. Like a bee, the empiricist, by means of his inductive method, collects the natural matter or products and then works them up into knowledge in order to produce honey, which is useful for healthy nutrition.
In Bacon's follow-up paper, Redargutio Philosophiarum, he carries on his empiricist project by referring to the doctrine of twofold truth, while in De Principiis atque Originibus he rejects alchemical theories concerning the transformation of substances in favor of Greek atomism. But in the same text he sharply criticizes his contemporary Telesio for propagating a non-experimental halfway house empiricism. Though Telesio proves to be a moderate ‘modern’, he clings to the Aristotelian framework by continuing to believe in the quinta essentia and in the doctrine of the two worlds, which presupposes two modes of natural law (one mode for the sublunary and another for the superlunary sphere).
Bacon's doctrine of the idols not only represents a stage in the history of theories of error (Brandt 1979) but also functions as an important theoretical element within the rise of modern empiricism. According to Bacon, the human mind is not a tabula rasa. Instead of an ideal plane for receiving an image of the world in toto, it is a crooked mirror, on account of implicit distortions (Bacon IV , 428–34). He does not sketch a basic epistemology but underlines that the images in our mind right from the beginning do not render an objective picture of the true objects. Consequently, we have to improve our mind, i.e., free it from the idols, before we start any knowledge acquisition.
As early as Temporis partus masculus, Bacon warns the student of empirical science not to tackle the complexities of his subject without purging the mind of its idols:
On waxen tablets you cannot write anything new until you rub out the old. With the mind it is not so; there you cannot rub out the old till you have written in the new. (Farrington 1964, 72)
In Redargutio Philosophiarum Bacon reflects on his method, but he also criticizes prejudices and false opinions, especially the system of speculation established by theologians, as an obstacle to the progress of science (Farrington 1964, 107), together with any authoritarian stance in scholarly matters.
Bacon deals with the idols in the Second Book of The Advancement of Learning, where he discusses Arts intellectual (Invention, Judgment, Memory, Tradition). In his paragraph on judgment he refers to proofs and demonstrations, especially to induction and invention. When he comes to Aristotle's treatment of the syllogism, he reflects on the relation between sophistical fallacies (Aristotle, De Sophisticis Elenchis) and the idols (Bacon III , 392–6). Whereas induction, invention, and judgment presuppose “the same action of the mind”, this is not true for proof in the syllogism. Bacon, therefore, prefers his own interpretatio naturae, repudiating elenches as modes of sophistical ‘juggling’ in order to persuade others in redargutions (“degenerate and corrupt use … for caption and contradiction”). There is no finding without proof and no proof without finding. But this is not true for the syllogism, in which proof (syllogism: judgment of the consequent) and invention (of the ‘mean’ or middle term) are distinct. The caution he suggests in relation to the ambiguities in elenches is also recommended in face of the idols:
there is yet a much more important and profound kind of fallacies in the mind of man, which I find not observed or enquired at all, and think good to place here, as that which of all others appertaineth most to rectify judgment: the force whereof is such, as it doth not dazzle or snare the understanding in some particulars, but doth more generally and inwardly infect and corrupt the state thereof. For the mind of man is far from the nature of a clear and equal glass, wherein the beams of things should reflect according to their true incidence, nay, it is rather like an enchanted glass, full of superstition and imposture, if it be not delivered and reduced. For this purpose, let us consider the false appearances that are imposed upon us by the general nature of the mind …. (Bacon III , 394–5)
Bacon still presents a similar line of argument to his reader in 1623, namely in De Augmentis (Book V, Chap. 4; see Bacon IV , 428–34). Judgment by syllogism presupposes—in a mode agreeable to the human mind—mediated proof, which, unlike in induction, does not start from sense in primary objects. In order to control the workings of the mind, syllogistic judgment refers to a fixed frame of reference or principle of knowledge as the basis for “all the variety of disputations” (Bacon IV , 491). The reduction of propositions to principles leads to the middle term. Bacon deals here with the art of judgment in order to assign a systematic position to the idols. Within this art he distinguishes the ‘Analytic’ from the detection of fallacies (sophistical syllogisms). Analytic works with “true forms of consequences in argument” (Bacon IV , 429), which become faulty by variation and deflection. The complete doctrine of detection of fallacies, according to Bacon, contains three segments:
- Sophistical fallacies,
- Fallacies of interpretation, and
- False appearances or Idols.
Concerning (1) Bacon praises Aristotle for his excellent handling of the matter, but he also mentions Plato honorably. Fallacies of interpretation (2) refer to “Adventitious Conditions or Adjuncts of Essences”, similar to the predicaments, open to physical or logical inquiry. He focuses his attention on the logical handling when he relates the detection of fallacies of interpretation to the wrong use of common and general notions, which leads to sophisms. In the last section (3) Bacon finds a place for his idols, when he refers to the detection of false appearances as
the deepest fallacies of the human mind: For they do not deceive in particulars, as the others do, by clouding and snaring the judgment; but by a corrupt and ill-ordered predisposition of mind, which as it were perverts and infects all the anticipations of the intellect. (IV, 431)
Idols are productions of the human imagination (caused by the crooked mirror of the human mind) and thus are nothing more than “untested generalities” (Malherbe 1996, 80).
In his Preface to the Novum Organum Bacon promises the introduction of a new method, which will restore the senses to their former rank (Bacon IV , 17f.), begin the whole labor of the mind again, and open two sources and two distributions of learning, consisting of a method of cultivating the sciences and another of discovering them. This new beginning presupposes the discovery of the natural obstacles to efficient scientific analysis, namely seeing through the idols, so that the mind's function as the subject of knowledge acquisition comes into focus (Brandt 1979, 19).
According to Aphorism XXIII of the First Book, Bacon makes a distinction between the Idols of the human mind and the Ideas of the divine mind: whereas the former are for him nothing more than “certain empty dogmas”, the latter show “the true signatures and marks set upon the works of creation as they are found in nature” (Bacon IV , 51).
3.1.1 Idols of the Tribe
The Idols of the Tribe have their origin in the production of false concepts due to human nature, because the structure of human understanding is like a crooked mirror, which causes distorted reflections (of things in the external world).
3.1.2 Idols of the Cave
The Idols of the Cave consist of conceptions or doctrines which are dear to the individual who cherishes them, without possessing any evidence of their truth. These idols are due to the preconditioned system of every individual, comprising education, custom, or accidental or contingent experiences.
3.1.3 Idols of the Market Place
These idols are based on false conceptions which are derived from public human communication. They enter our minds quietly by a combination of words and names, so that it comes to pass that not only does reason govern words, but words react on our understanding.
3.1.4 Idols of the Theatre
According to the insight that the world is a stage, the Idols of the Theatre are prejudices stemming from received or traditional philosophical systems. These systems resemble plays in so far as they render fictional worlds, which were never exposed to an experimental check or to a test by experience. The idols of the theatre thus have their origin in dogmatic philosophy or in wrong laws of demonstration.
Bacon ends his presentation of the idols in Novum Organum, Book I, Aphorism LXVIII, with the remark that men should abjure and renounce the qualities of idols, “and the understanding [must be] thoroughly freed and cleansed” (Bacon IV , 69). He discusses the idols together with the problem of information gained through the senses, which must be corrected by the use of experiments (Bacon IV , 27).
Within the history of occidental philosophy and science, Bacon identifies only three revolutions or periods of learning: the heyday of the Greeks and that of the Romans and Western Europe in his own time (Bacon IV , 70ff.). This meager result stimulated his ambition to establish a new system of the sciences. This tendency can already be seen in his early manuscripts, but is also apparent in his first major book, The Advancement of Learning. In this work Bacon presents a systematic survey of the extant realms of knowledge, combined with meticulous descriptions of deficiencies, leading to his new classification of knowledge. In The Advancement (Bacon III , 282f.) a new function is given to philosophia prima, the necessity of which he had indicated in the Novum Organum, I, Aphorisms LXXIX–LXXX (Bacon IV , 78–9). In both texts this function is attributed to philosophia naturalis, the basis for his concept of the unity of the sciences and thus of materialism.
Natural science is divided by Bacon into physics and metaphysics. The former investigates variable and particular causes, the latter reflects on general and constant ones, for which the term form is used. Forms are more general than the four Aristotelian causes and that is why Bacon's discussion of the forms of substances as the most general properties of matter is the last step for the human mind when investigating nature. Metaphysics is distinct from philosophia prima. The latter marks the position in the system where general categories of a general theory of science are treated as (1) universal categories of thought, (2) relevant for all disciplines. Final causes are discredited, since they lead to difficulties in science and tempt us to amalgamate theological and teleological points of doctrine. At the summit of Bacon's pyramid of knowledge are the laws of nature (the most general principles). At its base the pyramid starts with observations, moves on to invariant relations and then to more inclusive correlations until it reaches the stage of forms. The process of generalization ascends from natural history via physics towards metaphysics, whereas accidental correlations and relations are eliminated by the method of exclusion. It must be emphasized that metaphysics has a special meaning for Bacon. This concept (1) excludes the infinity of individual experience by generalization with a teleological focus and (2) opens our mind to generate more possibilities for the efficient application of general laws.
According to Bacon, man would be able to explain all the processes in nature if he could acquire full insight into the hidden structure and the secret workings of matter (Pérez-Ramos 1988, 101). Bacon's conception of structures in nature, functioning according to its own working method, concentrates on the question of how natural order is produced, namely by the interplay of matter and motion. In De Principiis atque Originibus, his materialistic stance with regard to his conception of natural law becomes evident. The Summary Law of Nature is a virtus (matter-cum-motion) or power in accordance with matter theory, or
the force implanted by God in these first particles, form the multiplication thereof of all the variety of things proceeds and is made up. (Bacon V , 463)
Similarly, in De Sapientia Veterum he attributes to this force an
appetite or instinct of primal matter; or to speak more plainly, the natural motion of the atom; which is indeed the original and unique force that constitutes and fashions all things out of matter. (Bacon VI , 729)
Suffice it to say here that Bacon, who did not reject mathematics in science, was influenced by the early mathematical version of chemistry developed in the 16th century, so that the term ‘instinct’ must be seen as a keyword for his theory of nature. The natural philosopher is urged to inquire into the
appetites and inclination of things by which all that variety of effects and changes which we see in the works of nature and art is brought about. (Bacon III , 17–22; V , 422–6 and 510ff.: Descriptio Globi Intellectualis; cf. IV , 349)
Bacon's theory of active or even vivid force in matter accounts for what he calls Cupid in De Principiis atque Originibus (Bacon V , 463–5). Since his theory of matter aims at an explanation of the reality which is the substratum of appearances, he digs deeper than did the mechanistic physics of the 17th century (Gaukroger 2001, 132–7). Bacon's ideas concerning the quid facti of reality presuppose the distinction
between understanding how things are made up and of what they consist, … and by what force and in what manner they come together, and how they are transformed. (Gaukroger 2001, 137)
This is the point in his work where it becomes obvious that he tries to develop an explanatory pattern in which his theory of matter, and thus his atomism, are related to his cosmology, magic, and alchemy.
In De Augmentis, Bacon not only refers to Pan and his nymphs in order to illustrate the permanent atomic movement in matter but in addition revives the idea of magic in a ‘honourable meaning’ as
the knowledge of the universal consents of things …. I … understand [magic] as the science which applies the knowledge of hidden forms to the production of wonderful operations; and by uniting (as they say) actives with passives, displays the wonderful works of nature. (Bacon IV , 366–7: De Augmentis III.5)
Bacon's notion of form is made possible by integration into his matter theory, which (ideally) reduces the world of appearances to some minimal parts accessible and open to manipulation by the knower/maker. In contrast to Aristotle, Bacon's knowing-why type of definition points towards the formulation of an efficient knowing-how type (Pérez-Ramos 1988, 119). In this sense a convergence between the scope of definition and that of causation takes place according to a ‘constructivist epistemology’. The fundamental research of Graham Rees has shown that Bacon's special mode of cosmology is deeply influenced by magic and semi-Paracelsian doctrine. For Bacon, matter theory is the basic doctrine, not classical mechanics as it is with Galileo. Consequently, Bacon's purified and modified versions of chemistry, alchemy, and physiology remain primary disciplines for his explanation of the world.
According to Rees, the Instauratio Magna comprises two branches: (1) Bacon's famous scientific method, and (2) his semi-Paracelsian world system as “a vast, comprehensive system of speculative physics” (Rees 1986, 418). For (2) Bacon conjoins his specific version of Paracelsian cosmic chemistry to Islamic celestial kinematics (especially in Alpetragius [al-Bitruji]; see Zinner 1988, 71). The chemical world system is used to support Bacon's explanation of celestial motion in the face of contemporary astronomical problems (Rees 1975b, 161f.). There are thus two sections in Bacon's Instauratio, which imply the modes of their own explanation.
Bacon's speculative cosmology and matter theory had been planned to constitute Part 5 of Instauratio Magna. The theory put forward refers in an eclectic vein to atomism, criticizes Aristotelians and Copernicans, but also touches on Galileo, Paracelsus, William Gilbert, Telesio, and Arabic astronomy.
For Bacon, ‘magic’ is classified as applied science, while he generally subsumes under ‘science’ pure science and technology. It is never identified with black magic, since it represents the “ultimate legitimate power over nature” (Rees 2000, 66). Whereas magia was connected to crafts in the 16th and 17th centuries, Bacon's science remains the knowledge of forms in order to transform them into operations. Knowledge in this context, however, is no longer exclusively based on formal proof.
Bacon's cosmological system—a result of thought experiments and speculation, but not proven in accordance with the inductive method—presupposes a finite universe, a geocentric plenum, which means that the earth is passive and consists of tangible matter. The remaining universe is composed of active or pneumatic matter. Whereas the interior and tangible matter of the earth is covered by a crust which separates it from the pneumatic heaven, the zone between earth and the “middle region of the air” allows a mixture of pneumatic and tangible matter, which is the origin of organic and non-organic phenomena. Bacon speaks here of “attached spirit” (Rees 1986, 418–20), while otherwise he assumes four kinds of free spirit: air and terrestrial fire, which refer to the sublunary realm; ether and sidereal fire, which are relevant to the celestial realm. Ether is explained as the medium in which planets move around the central earth. Air and ether, as well as watery non-inflammable bodies, belong to Bacon's first group of substances or to the Mercury Quaternion.
Terrestrial fire is presented as the weak variant of sidereal fire; it joins with oily substances and sulphur, for all of which Bacon introduces the Sulphur Quaternion. These quaternions comprise antithetical qualities: air and ether versus fire and sidereal fire. The struggle between these qualities is determined by the distance from the earth as the absolute center of the world system. Air and ether become progressively weaker as the terrestrial and sidereal fire grow stronger. The quaternion theory functions in Bacon's thought as a constructive element for constituting his own theory of planetary movement and a general theory of physics. This theory differs from all other contemporary approaches, even though Bacon states that “many theories of the heavens may be supposed which agree well enough with the phenomena and yet differ with each other” (Bacon IV , 104). The diurnal motion of the world system (9th sphere) is driven by sympathy; it carries the heavens westward around the earth. The sidereal fire is powerful and, accordingly, sidereal motion is swift (the stars complete their revolution in 24 hours). Since the sidereal fire becomes weaker if it burns nearer to the earth, the lower planets move more slowly and unevenly than the higher ones (in this way Bacon, like Alpetragius, accounts for irregular planetary movement without reference to Ptolemy's epicycle theory). He applies his theory of consensual motion to physics generally (e.g., wind and tides) and thus comes into conflict with Gilbert's doctrine of the interstellar vacuum and Galileo's theory of the tides (for Bacon, the cycle of tides depends on the diurnal motion of the heavens but, for Galileo, on the earth's motion).
With quaternion theory we see that, in the final analysis, Bacon was not a mechanist philosopher. His theory of matter underwent an important transformation, moving in the direction of ‘forms’, which we would nowadays subsume under biology or the life sciences rather than under physics. Bacon distinguishes between non-spiritual matter and spiritual matter. The latter, also called ‘subtle matter’ or ‘spirit’, is more reminiscent of Leibniz' ‘monads’ than of mechanically defined and materially, as well as spatially, determined atoms. The spirits are seen as active agents of phenomena; they are endowed with ‘appetition’ and ‘perception’ (Bacon I , 320–21: Historia Vitae et Mortis; see also V, 63: Sylva Sylvarum, Century IX: “It is certain that all bodies whatsoever, though they have no sense, yet they have perception: for when one body is applied to another, there is a kind of election to embrace that which is agreeable, and to exclude or expel that which is ingrate”).
These spirits are never at rest. In the Novum Organum, then, Bacon rejected the “existence of eternal and immutable atoms and the reality of the void” (Kargon 1966, 47). His new conception of matter was therefore “close to that of the chemists” in the sense of Bacon's semi-Paracelsian cosmology (Rees 2000, 65–69). The careful natural philosopher tries to disclose the secrets of nature step by step; and therefore he says of his method: “I propose to establish progressive stages of certainty” (Bacon IV , 40: Novum Organum, Preface). This points towards his inductive procedure and his method of tables, which is a complicated mode of induction by exclusion. It is necessary because nature hides her secrets. In Aphorism XIX of Book I in his Novum Organum Bacon writes:
There are and can be only two ways of searching into and discovering truth. The one flies from the senses and particulars to the most general axioms, and from these principles, the truth of which it takes for settled and immoveable, proceeds to judgment and to the discovery of middle axioms. And this way is now in fashion. The other derives axioms from the senses and particulars, rising by gradual and unbroken ascent, so that it arrives at the most general axioms last of all. This is the true way, but as yet untried. (Bacon IV , 50)
The laws of nature, which Bacon intended to discover by means of his new method, were expressed in the ‘forms’, in which the ‘unbroken ascent’ culminates. Through these forms the natural philosopher understands the general causes of phenomena (Kargon 1966, 48). In his endeavor to learn more about the secret workings of nature, Bacon came to the conclusion that the atomist theory could not provide sufficient explanations for the “real particles, such as really exist” (Bacon IV , 126: Novum Organum, II.viii), because he thought that the immutability of matter and the void (both necessary assumptions for atomism) were untenable. His language turned from that of Greek physics to the usage of contemporary chemists. This is due to his insight that “subtlety of investigation” is needed, since our senses are too gross for the complexity and fineness of nature, so that method has to compensate for the shortcomings of our direct comprehension. Only method leads to the knowledge of nature: in Sylva Sylvarum, Century I.98 Bacon deals explicitly with the question of the asymmetrical relationship between man's natural instrument (i.e., the senses) and the intricacy of nature's structures and workings.
Bacon distinguishes ‘animate’ or vital spirits, which are continuous and composed of a substance similar to fire, from lifeless or inanimate spirits, which are cut off and resemble air: the spirits interact with gross matter through chemical processes (Bacon IV, 195–6 (Novum Organum, II.xl)). These spirits have two different desires: self-multiplication and attraction of like spirits. According to Kargon (1966, 51):
Bacon's later theory of matter is one of the interaction of gross, visible parts of matter and invisible material spirits, both of which are physically mixed.
Spirits interact with matter by means of concoction, colliquation and other non-mechanical chemical processes, so that Bacon's scientific paradigm differs from Descartes' mechanist theory of matter in his Principia Philosophiae (1644), which presupposes res extensa moving in space. Bacon's theory of matter is thus closely related to his speculative philosophy:
The distinction between tangible and pneumatic matter is the hinge on which the entire speculative system turns. (Rees 1996, 125; Paracelsus had already stated that knowledge inheres in the object: see Shell 2004, 32)
Bacon's theory of matter in its final version was more corpuscular than atomist (Clericuzio 2000, 78). Bacon's particles are semina rerum: they are endowed with powers, which make a variety of motions possible and allow the production of all possible forms. These spirits are constitutive for Bacon's theory of matter. As material, fine substances, composed of particles, combined from air and fire, they can, as we have seen, be either inanimate or animate. Bacon thus suggests a corpuscular and chemical chain of being:
|inanimate objects||→||inaugurate spirits|
|vegetables||→||inanimate + vital spirits|
Small wonder, then, that Bacon's spirits are indispensable for his conception of physiology:
the vital spirits regulate all vegetative functions of plants and animals. Organs responsible for these functions, for digestion, assimilation, etc., seem to act by perception, mere reaction to local stimuli, but these reactions are coordinated by the vital spirit. These functions flow from the spirit's airy-flamy constitution. The spirit has the softness of air to receive impressions and the vigour of fire to propagate its actions. (Rees in OFB VI, 202–3)
This physiological stratum of Bacon's natural philosophy was influenced by his semi-Paracelsian cosmology (on Paracelsus see Müller-Jahncke 1985, 67–88), which Graham Rees (Rees and Upton 1984, 20–1) has reconstructed from the extant parts of the Instauratio Magna. Detailed consideration therefore has to be given to Bacon's theory of the ‘quaternions’.
Bacon's speculative system is a hybrid based on different sources which provided him with seminal ideas: e.g., atomism, Aristotelianism, Arabic astronomy, Copernican theory, Galileo's discoveries, the works of Paracelsus, and Gilbert. In his theory he combines astronomy, referring to Alpetragius (see Dijksterhuis 1956, 237–43; Rees and Upton 1984, 26; Gaukroger, 2001, 172–5; and and see Grant 1994, 533–66, for discussion of the cosmology of Alpetragius), and chemistry (Rees 1975a, 84–5):
[i]t was partly designed to fit a kinematic skeleton and explain, in general terms, the irregularities of planetary motion as consequences of the chemical constitution of the universe. (Rees 1975b, 94)
Bacon had no explanation for the planetary retrogressions and saw the universe as a finite and geocentric plenum, in which the earth consists of the two forms of matter (tangible and pneumatic). The earth has a tangible inside and is in touch with the surrounding universe, but through an intermediate zone. This zone exists between the earth's crust and the pure pneumatic heavens; it reaches some miles into the crust and some miles into air. In this zone, pneumatic matter mixes with tangible matter, thus producing ‘attached spirits’, which must be distinguished from ‘free spirits’ outside tangible bodies. Bacon's four kinds of free spirits are relevant for his ‘quaternion theory’:
|– air||– ether|
|– terrestrial fire||– sidereal fire|
The planets move around the earth in the ether (a tenuous kind of air), which belongs to the ‘mercury quaternion’: it includes watery bodies and mercury. Terrestrial fire is a weakened form of sidereal fire. It is related to oily substances and sulphur, and constitutes the ‘sulphur quaternion’. The two quaternions oppose each other: air/ether vs. fire/sidereal fire. Air and ether loose power when terrestrial and sidereal fires grow more energetic—Bacon's sulphur and mercury are not principles in the sense of Paracelsus, but simply natural substances. The Paracelsian principle of salt is excluded by Bacon and the substance, which plays a role only in the sublunary realm, is for him a compound of natural sulphur and mercury (Rees and Upton 1984, 25).
Bacon used his quaternion theory for his cosmology, which differs greatly from other contemporary systems (Rees 2000, 68):
- the diurnal motion turns the heavens about the earth towards the west;
- under powerful sidereal fire (i.e., principle of celestial motion) the motion is swift: the revolution of the stars takes place in twenty-four hours;
- under weaker sidereal fire—nearer to the earth—planets move more slowly and more erratic.
Bacon, who tried to conceive of a unified physics, rejected different modes of motion in the superlunary and in the sublunary world (Bacon I , 329). He did not believe in the existence of the (crystalline) spheres nor in the macrocosm-microcosm analogy. He revised Paracelsian ideas thoroughly. He rejected the grounding of his theories in Scripture and paid no attention at all to Cabbalistic and Hermetic tendencies (Rees 1975b, 90–1). But he extended the explanatory powers of the quaternions to earthly phenomena such as wind and tides.
Bacon's two systems were closely connected:
- System 1: (The Two Quaternions)
- explained and comprised the cosmological aspect of his natural philosophy.
- System 2: (Theory of Matter)
- explained terrestrial nature, that is, it “dealt with the manifold changes in the animal, vegetable, and mineral kingdoms of the frontier zone between the celestial heavens and the Earth's interior” (Rees 1996, 130; the two tables are taken from Rees).
System 2 depends on System 1, since explanations for terrestrial things were subordinated to explanations of the cosmological level. The table of System 2 shows Bacon's matter theory. His quaternion theory is relevant for System 1. System 2 is explained in terms of ‘intermediates’, which combine the qualities of the items in one quaternion with their opposites in the other.
Bacon's system is built in a clear symmetrical way: each quaternion has four segments, together eight and there are four types of intermediates. Thus, the system distinguishes twelve segments in all. He wanted to explain all natural phenomena by means of this apparatus:
|Sulphur Quaternion||Mercury Quaternion|
|Tangible Substances (With Attached Spirits)||Sulphur (subterranean)||Mercury (subterranean)|
|Oil and oily inflammable substances (terrestrial)||Water and ‘crude’ non-inflammable substances (terrestrial)|
|Pneumatic Substances||Terrestrial fire (sublunary)||Air (sublunary)|
|Sidereal fire (planets)||Ether (medium of the planets)|
|Sulphur Quaternion||Intermediates||Mercury Quaternion|
|Tangible Substances (with attached spirits)||Sulphur (subterranean)||Salts (subterranean and in organic beings)||Mercury (subterranean)|
|Oil and oily inflammable substances (terrestrial)||Juices of animals and plants||Water and ‘crude’ non-inflammable substances (terrestrial)|
|Pneumatic substances||Terrestrial fire (sublunary)||Attached animate and inanimate spirits (in tangible bodies)||Air (sublunary)|
|Sidereal fire (planets)||Heaven of the fixed stars||Ether (medium of planets)|
There are two principal intermediates:
|The fire-air intermediates|
|‘attached’ animate spirits||inanimate spirits|
|only in living bodies||in all tangible bodies (including living bodies)|
Bacon's bi-quaternion theory necessarily refers to the sublunary as well as to the superlunary world. Although the quaternion theory is first mentioned in Thema Coeli (1612; see Bacon V , 547–59), he provides a summary in his Novum Organum (Bacon II , 50):
it has not been ill observed by the chemists in their triad of first principles, that sulphur and mercury run through the whole universe … in these two one of the most general consents in nature does seem to be observable. For there is consent between sulphur, oil and greasy exhalation, flame, and perhaps the body of a star. So is there between mercury, water and watery vapors, air, and perhaps the pure and intersiderial ether. Yet these two quaternions or great tribes of things (each within its own limits) differ immensely in quantity of matter and density, but agree very well in configuration. (Bacon IV , 242–3; see also V , 205–6; for tables of the two quaternions and Bacon's theory of matter see Rees 1996, 126, 137; Rees 2000, 68–9)
Bacon regarded his cosmological worldview as a system of anticipations, which was open to revision in light of further scientific results based on the inductive method (Rees 1975b, 171). It was primarily a qualitative system, standing aside from both mathematical astronomers and Paracelsian chemists. It thus emphasized the priority which he gave to physics over mathematics in his general system of the sciences.
Bacon's two quaternions and his matter theory provide a speculative framework for his thought, which was open to the future acquisition of knowledge and its technical application. His Nova Atlantis can be understood as a text which occupies an intermediate position between his theory of induction and his speculative philosophy (Klein 2003c; Price 2002).
It is important to bear in mind that Bacon's speculative system was his way out of a dilemma which had made it impossible for him to finish his Instauratio Magna. His turn towards speculation can only be interpreted as an intellectual anticipation during an intermediate phase of the history of science, when a gigantic amount of research work was still to be accomplished, so that empirical theories could neither be established nor sufficiently guaranteed. Speculation in Bacon's sense can therefore be seen as a preliminary means of explaining the secrets of nature until methodical research has caught up with our speculations. The speculative stance remains a relative and intermediate procedure for the ‘man of science’.
The Great Instauration, Bacon's main work, was published in 1620 under the title: Franciscus de Verulamio Summi Angliae Cancellaris Instauratio magna. This great work remained a fragment, since Bacon was only able to finish parts of the planned outline. The volume was introduced by a Prooemium, which gives a general statement of the purpose, followed by a Dedication to the King (James I) and a Preface, which is a summary of all “directions, motifs, and significance of his life-work” (Sessions 1996, 71). After that, Bacon printed the plan of the Instauratio, before he turned to the strategy of his research program, which is known as Novum Organum Scientiarum. Altogether the 1620 book constitutes the second part of Part II of the Instauratio, the first part of which is represented by De Augmentis and Book I of The Advancement of Learning. When Bacon organized his Instauratio, he divided it into six parts, which reminded contemporary readers of God's work of the six days (the creation), already used by writers like Guillaume Du Bartas (La Sepmaine, ou Création du Monde, 1579, transl. by Joshua Sylvester, Bartas His Devine Weekes & Workes, 1605) and Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (Heptaplus, 1489).
Bacon sees nature as a labyrinth, whose workings cannot be exclusively explained by reference to “excellence of wit” and “repetition of chance experiments”:
Our steps must be guided by a clue, and see what way from the first perception of the sense must be laid out upon a sure plan. (Bacon IV , 18)
Bacon's Plan of the Work runs as follows (Bacon IV , 22):
- The Divisions of the Sciences.
- The New Organon; or Directions concerning the Interpretation of Nature.
- The Phenomena of the Universe; or a Natural and Experimental History for the foundation of Philosophy.
- The Ladder of Intellect.
- The Forerunners; or Anticipations of the New Philosophy.
- The New Philosophy; or Active Science.
Part 1 contains the general description of the sciences including their divisions as they presented themselves in Bacon's time. Here he aimed at a distinction between what was already invented and known in contrast to “things omitted which ought be there” (Bacon IV , 23). This part could be taken from The Advancement of Learning (1605) and from the revised and enlarged version De Dignitate et Augmentis Scientiarum (1623).
Part 2 develops Bacon's new method for scientific investigation, the Novum Organum, equipping the intellect to pass beyond ancient arts and thus producing a radical revision of the methods of knowledge; but it also introduces a new epistemology and a new ontology. Bacon calls his new art Interpretatio Naturae, which is a logic of research going beyond ordinary logic, since his science aims at three inventions: of arts (not arguments), of principles (not of things in accordance to principles), and of designations and directions for works (not of probable reasons). The effect Bacon looks for is to command nature in action, not to overcome an opponent in argument. The Novum Organum is the only part of the Instauratio Magna which was brought near to completion.
Part 3 was going to contain natural and experimental history or the record of the phenomena of the universe. According to De Augmentis Scientarum (Bacon IV , 275), natural history is split up into narrative and inductive, the latter of which is supposed “to minister and be in order to the building up of Philosophy”. These functional histories support human memory and provide the material for research, or the factual knowledge of nature, which must be certain and reliable. Natural history starts from and emphasizes the subtlety of nature or her structural intricacy, but not the complexity of philosophical systems, since they have been produced by the human mind. Bacon sees this part of Instauratio Magna as a foundation for the reconstruction of the sciences in order to produce physical and metaphysical knowledge. Nature in this context is studied under experimental conditions, not only in the sense of the history of bodies, but also as a history of virtues or original passions, which refer to the desires of matter (Rees 1975a). This knowledge was regarded by Bacon as a preparation for Part 6, the Second Philosophy or Active Science, for which he gave only the one example of Historia Ventorum (1622); but—following his plan to compose six prototypical natural histories—he also wrote Historia vitae et mortis(1623) and the Historia densi, which was left in manuscript. The text, which develops the idea of Part 3, is called Parasceve ad Historiam Naturalem et Experimentalem.
Part 4, which Bacon called The Ladder of Intellect or Scala Intellectus, was intended to function as a link between the method of natural history and that of Second Philosophy/Active Science. It consists not only of the fragment Filum labyrinthi (Bacon III , 493–504), but also includes the Abecedarium nouum naturae (OFB XIII, xxi), which was planned as a preface to all of section 4 “[to] demonstrate the whole process of the mind” (OFB XIII, xxii). Filum labyrinthi is similar to, but not identical with, Cogitata et Visa. Speaking of himself in an authorial voice, Bacon reflects on the state of science and derives his construction of a research program from the gaps and deficiencies within the system of disciplines: sciences of the future should be examined and further ones should be discovered. Emphasis must be laid on new matter (not on controversies). It is necessary to repudiate superstition, zealous religion, and false authorities. Just as the Fall was not caused by knowledge of nature, but rather by moral knowledge of good and evil, so knowledge of natural philosophy is for Bacon a contribution to the magnifying of God's glory, and, in this way, his plea for the growth of scientific knowledge becomes evident.
Part 5 deals with the forerunners or anticipations of the new philosophy, and Bacon emphasizes that the ‘big machinery’ of the Instauratio Magna needs a good deal of time to be completed. Anticipations are ways to come to scientific inferences without recourse to the method presented in the Novum Organum. Meanwhile, he has worked on his speculative system, so that portions of his Second Philosophy are treated and finished: De Fluxu et Refluxu Maris and Thema Coeli. For this part of the Great Instauration, texts are planned that draw philosophical conclusions from collections of facts which are not yet sufficient for the use or application of Bacon's inductive method.
Part 6 was scheduled to contain Bacon's description of the new philosophy, as the last part of his Great Instauration; but nothing came of this plan, so that there is no extant text at all from this part of the project.
Already in his early text Cogitata et Visa (1607) Bacon dealt with his scientific method, which became famous under the name of induction. He repudiates the syllogistic method and defines his alternative procedure as one “which by slow and faithful toil gathers information from things and brings it into understanding” (Farrington 1964, 89). When later on he developed his method in detail, namely in his Novum Organum (1620), he still noted that
[of] induction the logicians seem hardly to have taken any serious thought, but they pass it by with a slight notice, and hasten to the formulae of disputation. I on the contrary reject demonstration by syllogism …. (Bacon IV , 24)
Bacon's method appears as his conceptual plot,
applied to all stages of knowledge, and at every phase the whole process has to be kept in mind. (Malherbe 1996, 76)
Induction implies ascending to axioms, as well as a descending to works, so that from axioms new particulars are gained and from these new axioms. The inductive method starts from sensible experience and moves via natural history (providing sense-data as guarantees) to lower axioms or propositions, which are derived from the tables of presentation or from the abstraction of notions. Bacon does not identify experience with everyday experience, but presupposes that method corrects and extends sense-data into facts, which go together with his setting up of tables (tables of presence and of absence and tables of comparison or of degrees, i.e., degrees of absence or presence). “Bacon's antipathy to simple enumeration as the universal method of science derived, first of all, from his preference for theories that deal with interior physical causes, which are not immediately observable” (Urbach 1987, 30; see: sect. 2). The last type can be supplemented by tables of counter-instances, which may suggest experiments:
To move from the sensible to the real requires the correction of the senses, the tables of natural history, the abstraction of propositions and the induction of notions. In other words, the full carrying out of the inductive method is needed. (Malherbe 1996, 85)
The sequence of methodical steps does not, however, end here, because Bacon assumes that from lower axioms more general ones can be derived (by induction). The complete process must be understood as the joining of the parts into a systematic chain. From the more general axioms Bacon strives to reach more fundamental laws of nature (knowledge of forms), which lead to practical deductions as new experiments or works (IV, 24–5). The decisive instruments in this process are the middle or ‘living axioms,’ which mediate between particulars and general axioms. For Bacon, induction can only be efficient if it is eliminative by exclusion, which goes beyond the remit of induction by simple enumeration. The inductive method helps the human mind to find a way to ascertain truthful knowledge.
Novum Organum, I, Aphorism CXV (Bacon IV , 103) ends the “pulling down” of “the signs and causes of the errors” within the sciences, achieved by means of three refutations, which constituted the condition for a rational introduction of method: refutation of ‘natural human reason’ (idols); refutation of ‘demonstrations’ (syllogisms) and refutation of ‘theories’ (traditional philosophical systems).
The Second Part of the Novum Organum deals with Bacon's rule for interpreting nature, even if he provides no complete or universal theory. He contributes to the new philosophy by introducing his tables of discovery (Inst. Magna, IV), by presenting an example of particulars (Inst. Magna, II), and by observations on history (Inst. Magna, III). It is well known that he worked hard in the last five years of his life to make progress on his natural history, knowing that he could not always come up to the standards of legitimate interpretation.
Bacon's method presupposes a double starting-point: empirical and rational. True knowledge is acquired if we want to proceed from a lower certainty to a higher liberty and from a lower liberty to a higher certainty. The rule of certainty and liberty in Bacon converges with his repudiation of the old logic of Aristotle, which determined true propositions by the criteria of generality, essentiality, and universality. Bacon rejects anticipatio naturae (“anticipation of nature”) in favor of interpretatio naturae (“interpretation of nature”), which starts with the collecting of facts and their methodical (inductive) investigation, shunning entanglement in pure taxonomy (as in Ramism), which establishes the order of things (Urbach 1987, 26; see also Foucault 1966 ), but does not produce knowledge. For Bacon, making is knowing and knowing is making (Bacon IV , 109–10). In accordance with the maxim “command nature … by obeying her” (Sessions 1996, 136; Gaukroger 2001, 139ff.), the exclusion of superstition, imposture, error, and confusion are obligatory. Bacon introduces variations into “the maker's knowledge tradition” as the discovery of the forms of a given nature lead him to develop his method for acquiring factual and proven knowledge.
Bacon argues against “anticipation of nature”, which he regards as a conservative method, leading to theories that recapitulate the data without producing new ones conducive to the growth of knowledge. Moreover, such theories are considered to be final, so that they are never replaced.
“Anticipation of nature” resembles “conventionalism” (Urbach 1987, 30–41), according to which theories refer to unobservable entities (e.g., atoms, epicycles). The theories are “computation rules” or “inference licences” within this given framework, which give explanations and predictions of particular kinds of observable events. The conventionalist acceptance of making predictions concerning future events cannot be separated from the question of probability. Bacon's procedure of knowledge acquisition goes against “conventionalism”, because “anticipation of nature” does not reject authoritative and final speculations concerning “unobservables” and because it permits “ad hoc adjustments”. Nowadays, however,
philosophers would not accept the idea that just because we can't observe something directly … it follows that there is no such thing. (Huggett 2010, 82. See also Von Weizsäcker and Juilfs 1958, pp.67–70; Rae 1986 , 1–27 and passim)
Conventionalist deep-level theories of the world are chosen from among alternative ways of observing phenomena. Although theories revealing the world structure are not directly provable or disprovable by means of observation or experiment, conventionalists might maintain their chosen theory even in the face of counter-evidence. They therefore avoid changes of theory. Any move to a new theory is not taken on the basis of new evidence, but because a new theory seems to be simpler, more applicable or more beautiful. Laws of nature are generally understood as being unrevisable (O'Hear 1995, 165). The famous debate, sparked by Thomas Kuhn, on paradigmatic and non-paradigmatic science and theory is relevant here. Bacon's position—open to scientific progress—is nearer to Kuhn than to Duhem or Poincaré). For Bacon, “anticipation of nature” (as a mode of “conventionalism”) produces obstacles to the progress of knowledge. Traditional methods shun speculation concerning things which are not immediately visible; Bacon's speculation, however, is an element of “interpretation of nature”. He presupposes hypothetical theories, but these do not go beyond the collected data. His acceptance of hypotheses is connected with his rejection of “anticipation of nature”. Thus, hypotheses are related to the axioms of “interpretation of nature”, which go beyond the original data. The amount of established facts is not identical with that of possible data (Gillies 1998, 307). Anticipation is rejected, only if it “flies from the senses and particulars to the most general axioms” (OFB XI, xxv). Because of the dangers of premature generalization, Bacon is careful about speculations and rigorously rejects any dogmatic defense of them and the tendency to declare them infallible.
…the philosophy that we now possess clutches to its breast certain tenets with which (if we look into it carefully) they want wholly to conceive men that nothing difficult, nothing with real power and influence over nature, should be expected from art or human effort; […] These things, if we examine them minutely, tend wholly towards a wicked circumscription of human power and an intentional and unnatural despair which not only confounds the presages of hope but breaks every nerve and spur of industry, and throws away the chances afforded by experience itself—while all they care about is that their art be considered perfect, expending their effort to achieve the most foolish and bankrupt glory of having it believed that whatever has not been found out or understood so far cannot be found out or understood in the future. (OFB XI, 141)
Bacon sees nature as an extremely subtle complexity, which affords all the energy of the natural philosopher to disclose her secrets.
For him, new axioms must be larger and wider than the material from which they are taken. At the same time, “interpretation of nature” must not leap to remote axioms. In terms of his method, he rejects general ideas as simple abstractions from very few sense perceptions. Such abstract words may function as conventions for organizing “new observations”, but only in the sense of means for taxonomical order. Such a sterile procedure is irrelevant for “interpretation of nature”, which is not final or infallible and is based on the insight that confirming hypotheses do not provide strict proofs. Bacon's method is therefore characterized by openness:
Nevertheless, I do not affirm that nothing can be added to what I prescribe; on the contrary, as one who observes the mind not only in its innate capacity but also insofar as it gets to grips with things, it is my conviction that the art of discovering will grow as the number of things discovered will grow. (OFB, XI, 197)
Peter Urbach's commentary exactly underlines Bacon's openness:
He believed that theories should be advanced to explain whatever data were available in a particular domain. These theories should preferably concern the underlying physical, causal mechanisms and ought, in any case, to go beyond the data which generated them. They are then tested by drawing out new predictions, which, if verified in experience, may confirm the theory and may eventually render it certain, at least in the sense that it becomes very difficult to deny. (Urbach 1987, 49)
Bacon was no seventeenth-century Popperian. Rather, on account of his theory of induction, he was:
the first great theorist of experimentalism”: “the function of experiment was both to test theories and to establish facts” (Rees, in OFB XI, xli).
Encyclopaedic repetition with an Aristotelian slant is being displaced by original compilation in which deference to authority plays no part whatever. Individual erudition is being dumped in favour of collective research. Conservation of traditional knowledge is being discarded in the interest of a new, functional realization of natural history, which demands that legenda—things worth reading—be supplanted by materials which will form the basis of a thoroughgoing attempt to improve the material conditions of the human race. (Rees, in OFB XI, xlii)
Form is for Bacon a structural constituent of a natural entity or a key to its truth and operation, so that it comes near to natural law, without being reducible to causality. This appears all the more important, since Bacon—who seeks out exclusively causes which are necessary and sufficient for their effects—rejects Aristotle's four causes (his four types of explanation for a complete understanding of a phenomenon) on the grounds that the distribution into material, formal, efficient, and final causes does not work well and that they fail to advance the sciences (especially the final, efficient, and material causes):
There are and can be only two ways of searching into and discovering truth. The one flies from the senses and particulars to the most general axioms, and from these principles, the truth of which it takes for settled and immovable, proceeds to judgment and to the discovery of middle axioms. And this way is now in fashion. The other derives axioms from the senses and particulars, rising by a gradual and unbroken ascent, so that it arrives at the most general axioms at last. This is the true way, but as yet untried. (Bacon IV , 50: Novum Organum, I, Aphorism XIX).
Since for Bacon the formal necessity of the syllogism does not suffice to set up first principles, his method comprises two basic tasks: (1) the discovery of forms, and (2) the transformation of concrete bodies. The discovery from every case of generation and motion refers to a latent process according to which efficient and material causes lead to forms; but there is also the discovery of latent configurations of bodies at rest and not in motion (Bacon IV , 119–20).
Bacon's new mode of using human understanding implies a parallelism between striving towards human power and constituting human knowledge. Technical know-how leads to successful operations, which converge with the discovery of forms (Pérez-Ramos 1988, 108; Bacon IV , 121). To understand the workings of nature presupposes an arrangement of facts which makes the investigative analysis of cause and effect possible, especially by means of new experiments. At this point the idea of scientia operativa comes in again, since the direction for a true and perfect rule of operation is parallel to the discovery of a true form. Bacon's specific non-Aristotelian Aristotelianism (Pérez-Ramos 1988, 113, 115) is one of the main features of his theory. Other indispensable influences on Bacon, apart from a modified version of Aristotle, are critically assessed Hermeticism, rhetoric (Vickers) and alchemy (Rees).
Two kinds of axioms correspond to the following division of philosophy and the sciences: the investigation of forms or metaphysics; and the investigation of efficient cause and matter, which leads to the latent process and configuration in physics. Physics itself is split up by Bacon into Mechanics, i.e., the practical, and Magic, i.e., the metaphysical.
Nowadays the view that Bacon “made little first-hand contribution to science” (Hesse 1964, 152) no longer coincides with the opinion that we have to assume an underestimation of the “place of hypothesis and mathematics” in his work (Urban 1987; Sessions 1999, 139; Rees 1986). But there were few doubts in the past that Bacon “encouraged detailed and methodical experimentation” (Hesse 1964, 152); and he did this on account of his new inductive method, which implied the need for negative instances and refuting experiments. Bacon saw that confirming instances could not suffice to analyze the structure of scientific laws, since this task presupposed a hypothetical-deductive system, which, according to Lisa Jardine, is closely connected to “the logical and linguistic backgrounds from which Bacon's New Logic proceeds …” (Sessions 1999, 140; Jardine 1974, 69ff.).
Bacon's interpretation of nature uses “Tables and Arrangements of Instances” concerning the natural phenomena under investigation, which function as a necessary condition for cracking the code of efficient causation. His prerogative instances are not examples or phenomena simply taken from nature but rather imply information with inductive potential which show priority conducive to knowledge or to methodological relevance when inserted into tables. The instances do not represent the order of sensible things, but instead express the order of qualities (natures). These qualities provide the working basis for the order of abstract natures. Bacon's tables have a double function: they are important for natural history, collecting the data on bodies and virtues in nature; and they are also indispensable for induction, which makes use of these data.
Already in Temporis Partus Masculus (1603) Bacon had displayed a “facility of shrewd observation” (Sessions 1999, 60) concerning his ideas on induction. In his Novum Organum the nature of all human science and knowledge was seen by him as proceeding most safely by negation and exclusion, as opposed to affirmation and inclusion. Even in his early tracts it was clear to Bacon that he had to seek a method of discovering the right forms, the most well known of which was heat (Novum Organum II, Aph. XI–XII) or “the famous trial investigation of the form of heat” (Rees 2000, 66; see Bacon IV , 154–5).
In his “[m]ethod of analysis by exclusion” (Sessions 1999, 141), negation proved to be “one of Bacon's strongest contributions to modern scientific method” (Wright 1951, 152). Most important were his tables of degrees and of exclusion. They were needed for the discovery of causes, especially for supreme causes, which were called forms. The method of induction works in two stages:
- Learned experience from the known to the unknown has to be acquired, and the tables (of presence, absence, degrees) have to be set up before their interpretation can take place according to the principle of exclusion. After the three tables of the first presentation have been judged and analyzed, Bacon declares the First Vintage or the first version of the interpretation of nature to be concluded.
- The second phase of the method concentrates on the process of exclusion. The aim of this procedure is the reduction of the empirical character of experience, so that the analysis converges with an anatomy of things. Here, too, tables of presence and of absence are set up. The research work proper consists of finding the relationship of the two natures of qualities. Here exclusion functions as the process of determination. Bacon's method starts from material determination in order to establish the formal determination of real causes, but does not stop there, because it aims at the progressive generalization of causes. Here, again, the central element of the inductive method is the procedure of exclusion.
Forms, as the final result of the methodical procedure, are:
nothing more than those laws and determinations of absolute actuality which govern and constitute any simple nature, as heat, light, weight, in every kind of matter and subject that is susceptible of them (Bacon IV , 145–6);
They are not identical with natural law, but with definitions of simple natures (elements) or ultimate ingredients of things from which the basic material structure has been built (Gaukroger 2001, 140). Forms are the structures constituted by the elements in nature (microphysics). This evokes a cross-reference to Bacon's atomism, which has been called the “constructivist component” (Pérez-Ramos 1988, 116) of his system, including an alchemical theory about basic kinds of matter. He aims at “understanding the basic structures of things … as a means to transforming nature for human purposes” (Gaukroger 2001, 140; Clericuzio 2000, 78ff.); and thus he “ends” the unfinished Novum Organum with a list of things which still have to be achieved or with a catalogue of phenomena which are important and indispensable for a future natural history.
Historians of science, with their predilection for mathematical physics, used to criticize Bacon's approach, stating that “the Baconian concept of science, as an inductive science, has nothing to do with and even contradicts today's form of science” (Malherbe 1996, 75). In reaching this verdict, however, they overlooked the fact that a natural philosophy based on a theory of matter cannot be assessed on the grounds of a natural philosophy or science based on mechanics as the fundamental discipline. One can account for this chronic mode of misunderstanding as a specimen of the paradigmatic fallacy (Gaukroger 2001, 134ff.; see Rees 1986).
Bacon came to the fundamental insight that facts cannot be collected from nature, but must be constituted by methodical procedures, which have to be put into practice by scientists in order to ascertain the empirical basis for inductive generalizations. His induction, founded on collection, comparison, and exclusion of factual qualities in things and their interior structure, proved to be a revolutionary achievement within natural philosophy, for which no example in classical antiquity existed. His scala intellectus has two contrary movements “upwards and downwards: from axiomata to experimenta and opera and back again” (Pérez-Ramos 1988, 236). Bacon's induction was construed and conceived as an instrument or method of discovery. Above all, his emphasis on negative instances for the procedure of induction itself can claim a high importance with regard to knowledge acquisition and has been acclaimed as an innovation by scholars of our time. Some have detected in Bacon a forerunner of Karl Popper in respect of the method of falsification. Finally, it cannot be denied that Bacon's methodological program of induction includes aspects of deduction and abstraction on the basis of negation and exclusion. Contemporary scholars have praised his inauguration of the theory of induction. This theory has been held in higher esteem since the 1970s than it was for a long period before (see the work of Rees, Gaukroger and Pérez-Ramos 1988, 201–85). Nevertheless, it is doubtful that Bacon's critics, who were associated with the traditions of positivism and analytical philosophy, acquired sufficient knowledge of his writings to produce solid warrants for their criticisms (Cohen 1970, 124–34; Cohen 1985, 58ff.; on the general problem of induction see, e.g., Hempel 1966; Swinburne (ed.) 1974; Lambert and Brittan 1979 ). In comparison to the neglect of Bacon in the twentieth century, a more recent and deeper assessment of his work has arisen in connection with the “Oxford Francis Bacon” project, which was launched in the late 1990s by Graham Rees, who directed it until his death in 2009; it is now under the general editorship of Brian Vickers.
In Bacon's thought we encounter a relation between science and social philosophy, since his ideas concerning a utopian transformation of society presuppose an integration into the social framework of his program concerning natural philosophy and technology as the two forms of the maker's knowledge. From his point of view, which was influenced by Puritan conceptions, early modern society has to make sure that losses caused by the Fall are compensated for, primarily by man's enlargement of knowledge, providing the preconditions for a new form of society which combines scientia nova and the millennium, according to the prophecy of Daniel 12:4 (Hill 1971, 85–130). Science as a social endeavor is seen as a collective project for the improvement of social structures. On the other hand, a strong collective spirit in society may function as a conditio sine qua non for reforming natural philosophy. Bacon's famous argument that it is wise not to confound the Book of Nature with the Book of God comes into focus, since the latter deals with God's will (inscrutable for man) and the former with God's work, the scientific explanation or appreciation of which is a form of Christian divine service. Successful operations in natural philosophy and technology help to improve the human lot in a way which makes the hardships of life after the Fall obsolete. It is important to note that Bacon's idea of a—to a certain extent—Christian society by no means conveys Christian pessimism in the vein of patristic thinkers but rather displays a clear optimism as the result of compounding the problem of truth with the scope of human freedom and sovereignty (Brandt 1979, 21).
With regard to Bacon's Two Books—the Book of God and the Book of Nature—one has to keep in mind that man, when given free access to the Book of Nature, should not content himself with merely reading it. He also has to find out the names by which things are called. If man does so, not only will he be restored to his status a noble and powerful being, but the Book of God will also lose importance, from a traditional point of view, in comparison to the Book of Nature. This is what Blumenberg referred to as the “asymmetry of readability” (Blumenberg 1981, 86–107). But the process of reading is an open-ended activity, so that new knowledge and the expansion of the system of disciplines can no longer be restricted by concepts such as the completeness and eternity of knowledge (Klein 2004a, 73).
According to Bacon, the Book of God refers to his will, the Book of Nature to his works. He never gives a hint in his works that he has concealed any message of unbelief for the sophisticated reader; but he emphasized: (1) that religion and science should be kept separate and, (2) that they were nevertheless complementary to each other. For Bacon, the attack of theologians on human curiosity cannot be founded on a rational basis. His statement that “all knowledge is to be limited by religion, and to be referred to use and action” (Bacon III , 218) does not express a general verdict on theoretical curiosity, but instead provides a normative framework for the tasks of science in a universal sense. Already in the dedicatory letter to James I in his Advancement of Learning, Bacon attacks “the zeal and jealousy of divines” (Bacon III, 264) and in his manuscript Filum Labyrinthi of 1607, he “thought … how great opposition and prejudice natural philosophy had received by superstition, and the immoderate and blind zeal of religion” (Bacon VI , 421). As Calvin had done long before him in the Institutes, Bacon stated that since God created the physical world, it was a legitimate object of man's knowledge, a conviction which he illustrated with the famous example of King Solomon in The Advancement of Learning (Zagorin 1999, 49–50; see also Kocher 1953, 27–8). Bacon praises Solomon's wisdom, which seems to be more like a game than an example of man's God-given thirst for knowledge:
The glory of God is to conceal a thing, but the glory of the king is to find it out; as if, according to the innocent play of children, the Divine Majesty took delight to hide his works, to the end to have them found out; and as if kings could not obtain a greater honour than to be God's playfellows in that game, considering the great commandment of wits and means, whereby nothing needeth to be hidden from them. (Bacon III , 299; Blumenberg, 1973, 196–200)
From this perspective, the punishment of mankind on account of the very first disobedience by Adam and Eve can be seen in a different light from that of theological interpretations. In Bacon's view, this disobedience and its consequences can be remedied in two ways: (1) by religion and moral imperatives, and (2) by advancement in the arts and sciences: “the purpose in advancing arts and sciences is the glory of God and the relief of man's estate” (Wormald 1993, 82).
The two remedies, which are interconnected with the moral dimension, refer to the advancement of learning and religion. All three together (the advancement of learning, religion, and morality) are combined in such a way that they promote each other mutually; consequently, limited outlooks on coping with life and knowledge are ruled out completely in these three fields.
The ethical dimension of Bacon's thought has been underrated by generations of scholars. Time and again a crude utilitarianism has been derived from Book I, Aphorism 1 of the Novum Organum; this cannot, however, withstand a closer analysis of his thought. Since Bacon's philosophy of science tries to answer the question of how man can overcome the deficiencies of earthly life resulting from the Fall, he enters the realm of ethical reflection. The improvement of mankind's lot by means of philosophy and science does not start from a narrow utilitarian point of view, involving sheer striving for profit and supporting the power or influence of select groups of men, but instead emphasizes the construction of a better world for mankind, which might come into existence through the ascertaining of truths about nature's workings (Bacon III , 242). Thus, the perspective of the universal in Bacon's ethical thought is given predominance. The range of science and technology in their ethical meaning transcends the realm of the application of tools and/or instruments, in so far as the aim is the transformation of whole systems. Since causality and finality can interact on the basis of human will and knowledge, a plurality of worlds becomes feasible (Bacon V , 506–7). Moral philosophy is closely connected to ethical reflections on the relationship between the nature of virtues—habitual or innate?—and their use in life, privately and collectively. Any application of the principles of virtue presupposes for Bacon the education of the mind, so that we learn what is good and what should be attained (Gaukroger 2006, 204–5 and passim):
The main and primitive division of moral knowledge seemeth to be into the Exemplar or Platform of Good, and the Regimen of Culture of the Mind; the one describing the nature of good, the other prescribing rules how to subdue, apply, and accommodate the will of man thereunto (Bacon III , 419).
So, already in his Advancement of Learning Bacon studied the nature of good and distinguished various kinds of good. He insisted on the individual's duty to the public. Private moral self-control and the concomitant obligations are relevant for behavior and action in society. One's ethical persona is connected to morality by reference to acceptable behaviour. Though what we can do may be limited, we have to muster our psychological powers and control our passions when dealing with ourselves and with others. We need to apply self-discipline and rational assessment, as well as restraining our passions, in order to lead an active moral life in society.
Thus, for Bacon, the acquisition of knowledge does not simply coincide with the possibility of exerting power. Scientific knowledge is a condition for the expansion and development of civilization. Therefore, knowledge and charity cannot be kept separate:
I humbly pray … that knowledge being now discharged of that venom which the serpent infused into it, and which makes the mind of man to swell, we may not be wise above measure and sobriety, but cultivate truth in charity…. Lastly, I would address one general admonition to all; that they consider what are the true ends of knowledge, and that they seek it not either for pleasure of the mind, or for contention, or for superiority to others, or for profit, or fame, or power, or any of these inferior things; but for the benefit and use of life; and that they perfect and govern it in charity. For it was from the lust of power that the angels fell, from lust of knowledge that man fell; but of charity there can be no excess, neither did angel or man ever come in danger by it (Bacon IV , 20f.: Instauratio Magna, Preface).
Finally, the view that Bacon's Nova Atlantis “concerns a utopian society that is carefully organized for the purposes of scientific research and virtuous living” (Urbach 1988, 10) holds true for his entire life's work. In Nova Atlantis, social, political, and scholarly life are all organized according to the maxim of efficiency; but the House of Solomon is a separate and highly esteemed institution for research, which nevertheless is closely connected to the overall system of Bensalem. In his utopian state, Bacon presents a thoroughgoing collective life in society and science, both of which are based on revealed religion. Religion—Christian in essence—is not dogmatic, but it instills into the people of Bensalem veneration for the wise and morally exemplary members of society, and—which is of the utmost importance—the strictest sense of discipline (Gaukroger 2001, 128–30). Discipline is indispensable for those involved in the religious life as well as for the researchers, since both must proceed methodically. The isomorphic structures of nature and science, on the one hand, society and religion, on the other, prescribe patterns of political procedure, social processes, and religious attitudes, which overcome any craving for individuality. If religion and scientific research are both shown as truthful in Bensalem, then, according to Bacon, the imagination functions as a means of illustrating scientific revelation: “Bacon's purpose is … to show that scientific research properly pursued is not inconsonant with religious propriety and social stability…” (Bierman 1963, 497). The scientists in Bensalem are sacred searchers for truth: ethics, religion, and science merge. Bacon's parabolic strategy, which we should not separate from the power of the idols, enables him to make much of his trick of introducing new ideas like a smuggler: his colored wares are smuggled into the minds of his readers by being visualized in terms of sacred and highly symbolic rituals (Peltonen 1996, 175). Science and religion are separated in Nova Atlantis, but they are also interrelated through the offices of the society of Bensalem. What Bacon obviously wants to make clear to his readers is that the example of Bensalem should free them from any fear that scientific progress will lead to chaos and upheaval. This crucial point has made by Jürgen Mittelstrass, who understands Bacon's Nova Atlantis as a utopia and regards utopias as
blueprints of practical reason, not of theoretical, that is: they set in exactly there, where the early modern idea of progress appears meagre with regards to the contents: within ethics and political theory. (Mittelstrass 1960, 369)
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- Francis Bacon, entry by David Simpson in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
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Some of the passages in this entry are borrowed from Klein 2008.